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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Quantum Logic and Quantum Probability

The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations

What follows is the briefest possible summary of the order-theoretic notions used in the main text. For a good introduction to this material, see Davey & Priestley [1990]. More advanced treatments can be found in Gratzer [1998] and Birkhoff [1967].

1. Ordered Sets

A partial ordering -- henceforth, just an ordering -- on a set P is a reflexive, anti-symmetric, and transitive binary relation on P. Thus, for all p, q, r P, we have

  1. pp
  2. pq and qp only if p = q.
  3. if pq and qr then pr

If pq, we speak of p as being less than, or below q, and of q as being greater than, or above p, in the ordering.

A partially ordered set, or poset, is a pair (P,) where P is a set and is a specified ordering on P. It is usual to let P denote both the set and the structure, leaving tacit wherever possible. Any collection of subsets of some fixed set X, ordered by set-inclusion, is a poset; in particular, the full power set (X) is a poset under set inclusion.

Let P be a poset. The meet, or greatest lower bound, of p, q P, denoted by pq, is the greatest element of P -- if there is one -- lying below both p and q. The join, or least upper bound, of p and q, denoted by pq, is the least element of P -- if there is one -- lying above both p and q. Thus, for any elements p, q, r of P, we have

  1. if r pq, then rp and rq
  2. if pq r, then pr and qr

Note that pp = pp = p for all p in P. Note also that pq iff pq = p iff pq = q.

Note that if the set P = (X), ordered by set-inclusion, then pq = pq and pq = pq. However, if P is an arbitrary collection of subsets of X ordered by inclusion, this need not be true. For instance, consider the collection P of all subsets of X = {1,2,...,n} having even cardinality. Then, for instance, {1,2}{2,3} does not exist in P, since there is no smallest set of 4 elements of X containing {1,2,3}. For a different sort of example, let X be a vector space and let P be the set of subspaces of X. For subspaces M and N, we have

MN = MN, but MN = span(MN).

The concepts of meet and join extend to infinite subsets of a poset P. Thus, if AP, the meet of A is the largest element (if any) below A, while the join of A is the least element (if any) above A. We denote the meet of A by A or by aA a. Similarly, the join of A is denoted by A or by aA a.

2. Lattices

A lattice is a poset (L,) in which every pair of elements has both a meet and a join. A complete lattice is one in which every subset of L has a meet and a join. Note that (X) is a complete lattice with respect to set inclusion, as is the set of all subspaces of a vector space. The set of finite subsets of an infinite set X is a lattice, but not a complete lattice. The set of subsets of a finite set having an even number of elements is an example of a poset that is not a lattice.

A lattice (L,) is distributive iff meets distribute over joins and vice versa:

p (qr) = (pq) (pr), and

p (qr) = (pq) (pr).

The power set lattice (X), for instance, is distributive (as is any lattice of sets in which meet and join are given by set-theoretic intersection and union). On the other hand, the lattice of subspaces of a vector space is not distributive, for reasons that will become clear in a moment.

A lattice L is said to be bounded iff it contains a smallest element 0 and a largest element 1. Note that any complete lattice is automatically bounded. For the balance of this appendix, all lattices are assumed to be bounded, absent any indication to the contrary.

A complement for an element p of a (bounded) lattice L is another element q such that p q = 0 and p q = 1.

In the lattice (X), every element has exactly one complement, namely, its usual set-theoretic complement. On the other hand, in the lattice of subspaces of a vector space, an element will typically have infinitely many complements. For instance, if L is the lattice of subspaces of 3-dimensional Euclidean space, then a complement for a given plane through the origin is provided by any line through the origin not lying in that plane.

If L is distributive, an element of L can have at most one complement.

Suppose that q and r both serve as complements for p. Then, since L is distributive, we have

q = q1
  = q (pr)
  = (qp) (qr)
  = 0 (qr)
  = qr

Hence, qr. Symmetrically, we have rq; thus, q = r.

Thus, no lattice in which elements have multiple complements is distributive. In particular, the subspace lattice of a vector space (of dimension greater than 1) is not distributive.

If a lattice is distributive, it may be that some of its elements have a complement, while others lack a complement. A distributive lattice in which every element has a complement is called a Boolean lattice or a Boolean algebra. The basic example, of course, is the power set (X) of a set X. More generally, any collection of subsets of X closed under unions, intersections and complements is a Boolean algebra; a theorem of Stone and Birkhoff tells us that, up to isomorphism, every Boolean algebra arises in this way.

3. Ortholattices

In some non-uniquely complemented (hence, non-distributive) lattices, it is possible to pick out, for each element p, a preferred complement p in such a way that

  1. if pq then q p
  2. p = p
When these conditions are satisfied, one calls the mapping pp an orthocomplementation on L, and the structure (L,,) an orthocomplemented lattice, or an ortholattice for short.

Note again that if a distributive lattice can be orthocomplemented at all, it is a Boolean algebra, and hence can be orthocomplemented in only one way. In the case of L(H) the orthocomplementation one has in mind is M M where M is defined as in Section 1 of the main text. More generally, if V is any inner product space (complete or not), let L(V) denote the set of subspaces M of V such that M = M (such a subspace is said to be algebraically closed). This again is a complete lattice, orthocomplemented by the mapping M M.

4. Orthomodularity

There is a striking order-theoretic characterization of the lattice of closed subspaces of a Hilbert space among lattices L(V) of closed subspaces of more general inner product spaces. An ortholattice L is said to be orthomodular iff, for any pair p, q in L with pq,

(OMI)       (qp)p = q.

Note that this is a weakening of the distributive law. Hence, a Boolean lattice is orthomodular. It is not difficult to show that if H is a Hilbert space, then L(H) is orthomodular. The striking converse of this fact is due to Amemiya and Araki [1965]:

Let V be an inner product space (over R, C or the quaternions) such that L(V) is orthomodular. Then V is complete, i.e., a Hilbert space.

5. Closure Operators, Interior Operators and Adjunctions

Let P and Q be posets. A mapping f : P Q is order preserving iff for all p,q P, if pq then f(p)f(q).

A closure operator on a poset P is an order-preserving map cl : P  P such that for all p P,

Dually, an interior operator on P is an order-preserving mapping int : P  P on P such that for all p P,

Elements in the range of cl are said to be closed; those in the range of int are said to be open. If P is a (complete) lattice, then the set of closed, respectively open, subsets of P under a closure or interior mapping is again a (complete) lattice.

By way of illustration, suppose that and are collections of subsets of a set X with closed under arbitrary unions and under arbitrary intersections. For any set A X, let

cl(A) = {C | A C}, and

int(A) = {O | O A}

Then cl and int are interior operators on (X), for which the closed and open sets are precisely and , respectively. The most familiar example, of course, is that in which , are the open and closed subsets, respectively, of a topological space. Another important special case is that in which is the set of linear subspaces of a vector space V; in this case, the mapping span : (V) (V) sending each subset of V to its span is a corresponding closure.

An adjunction between two posets P and Q is an ordered pair (f, g) of mappings f : P  Q and g : Q  P connected by the condition that, for all p P, q Q

f(p) q if and only if p g(q).

In this case, we call f a left adjoint for g, and call g a right adjoint for f. Two basic facts about adjunctions, both easily proved, are the following:

Let f : L M be an order-preserving map between complete lattices L and M. Then
  1. f preserves arbitrary joins if and only if it has a right adjoint.
  2. f preserves arbitrary meets if and only if it has a left adjoint.

Let (f, g) be an adjunction between complete lattices L and M. Then

  1. g f : L L is a closure operator.
  2. f g : M M is an interior operator.

Copyright © 2002 by
Alexander Wilce

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First published: February 4, 2002
Content last modified: February 4, 2002