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At its core, quantum mechanics can be regarded as a non-classical
probability calculus resting upon a non-classical propositional
logic. More specifically, in quantum mechanics each
probability-bearing proposition of the form "the value of
physical quantity *A* lies in the range *B*" is
represented by a projection operator on a Hilbert space
**H**. These form a non-Boolean -- in particular,
non-distributive -- orthocomplemented lattice. Quantum-mechanical
states correspond exactly to probability measures (suitably defined)
on this lattice.

What are we to make of this? Some have argued that the empirical
success of quantum mechanics calls for a revolution in logic
itself. This view is associated with the demand for a realistic
interpretation of quantum mechanics, i.e., one not grounded in any
primitive notion of measurement. Against this, there is a long
tradition of interpreting quantum mechanics operationally, that is, as
being precisely a theory of measurement. On this latter view, it is
not surprising that a "logic" of measurement-outcomes, in a
setting where not all measurements are compatible, should prove not
to be Boolean. Rather, the mystery is why it should have the
*particular* non-Boolean structure that it does in quantum
mechanics. A substantial literature has grown up around the programme
of giving some independent motivation for this structure -- ideally,
by deriving it from more primitive and plausible axioms governing a
generalized probability theory.

- 1. Quantum Mechanics as a Probability Calculus
- Supplement 1: The Basic Theory of Hilbert Spaces [Not yet available]
- Supplement 2: The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations

- 2. Interpretations of Quantum Logic
- 3. Generalized Probability Theory
- 4. Logics Associated to Probabilistic Models
- 5. Piron's Theorem
- 6. Classical Representations
- 7. Composite Systems
- 8. Recent Developments [Not yet available]
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

It is uncontroversial (though remarkable) that the formal apparatus
of quantum mechanics reduces neatly to a generalization of classical
probability in which the role played by a Boolean algebra of events
in the latter is taken over by the "quantum logic" of
projection operators on a Hilbert
space.^{[1]}
Moreover, the usual statistical interpretation of quantum mechanics
asks us to take this generalized quantum probability theory quite
literally -- that is, not as merely a formal analogue of its
classical counterpart, but as a genuine doctrine of chances. In this
section, I survey this quantum probability theory and its supporting
quantum
logic.^{[2]}

[For further background on Hilbert spaces, see Supplement 1: The Basic Theory of Hilbert Spaces. For further background on ordered sets and lattices, see Supplement 2: The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations. Concepts and results explained these supplements will be used freely in what follows.]

… the relation between the properties of a physical system on the one hand, and the projections on the other, makes possible a sort of logical calculus with these. However, in contrast to the concepts of ordinary logic, this system is extended by the concept of "simultaneous decidability" which is characteristic for quantum mechanics [1932, p. 253].

Let's examine this "logical calculus" of projections. Ordered by
set-inclusion, the closed subspaces of **H** form a
complete lattice, in which the meet (greatest lower bound) of a set
of subspaces is their intersection, while their join (least upper
bound) is the closed span of their union. Since a typical closed
subspace has infinitely many complementary closed subspaces, this
lattice is not distributive; however, it is orthocomplemented by the
mapping

In view of the above-mentioned one-one correspondence between closed subspaces and projections, we may impose upon the setMM^{}= {vH|uM(<v,u> = 0)}.

1.1 Lemma:

LetPandQbe projection operators on the Hilbert spaceH. The following are equivalent:

PQ=QP- The sublattice of
L(H) generated byP,Q,PandQis BooleanP,Qlie in a common Boolean sub-ortholattice ofL(H).

Adhering to the idea that commuting observables -- in particular,
projections -- are simultaneously measurable, we conclude that the
members of a Boolean "block" (that is, a Boolean sub-ortholattice) of
*L*(**H**) are simultaneously testable. This
suggests that we can maintain a classical logical interpretation of
the meet, join and orthocomplement as applied to commuting
projections.

1.2 Definition:

A (countably additive)probability measureonL(H) is a mapping :L[0,1] such that (1) = 1 and, for any sequence of pair-wise orthogonal projectionsP_{i},i= 1,2,...(_{i}P_{i}) =_{i}(P_{i})

Here is one way in which we can manufacture a probability measure on
*L*(**H**). Let *u* be a unit vector of
**H**, and set
_{u}(*P*) =
<*Pu*,*u*>. This gives the usual
quantum-mechanical recipe for the probability that *P* will
have value 1 in the state *u*. Note that we can also express
_{u} as
_{u}(P) =
*Tr*(*P** P*_{u}), where
*P*_{u} is the one-dimensional projection
associated with the unit vector *u*.

More generally, if
_{i}, *i*=1,2,…, are
probability measures on *L*(**H**), then so is any
"mixture", or convex combination
=
_{i}
*t*_{i}_{i}
where
0*t*_{i}1
and
_{i} *t*_{i} =
1. Given any sequence *u*_{1},
*u*_{2},…, of unit vectors, let
_{i} =
_{ui} and let
*P*_{i} =
*P*_{ui}. Forming the
operator

one sees thatW=t_{1}P_{1}+t_{2}P_{2}+ … ,

(P) =t_{1}Tr(PP_{1}) +t_{2}Tr(PP_{2}) + ... =Tr(WP)

An operator expressible in this way as a convex combination of
one-dimensional projections in is called a *density operator*.
Thus, every density operator *W* gives rise to a countably
additive probability measure on *L*(**H**). The
following striking converse, due to A. Gleason [1957], shows that the
theory of probability measures on *L*(**H**) is
co-extensive with the theory of (mixed) quantum mechanical states on
**H**:

1.3 Gleason's Theorem:

LetHhave dimension > 2. Then every countably additive probability measure onL(H) has the form (P) =Tr(WP), for a density operatorWonH.

An important consequence of Gleason's Theorem is that
*L*(**H**) does not admit any probability
measures having only the values 0 and 1. To see this, note that for
any density operator *W*, the mapping *u*
<*Wu*,*u*> is continuous
on the unit sphere of **H**. But since the latter is
connected, no continuous function on it can take only the two values
0 and 1. This result is often taken to rule out the possibility of
‘hidden variables’ -- an issue taken up in more detail in
section 6.

The reduction of QM to probability theory based on
*L*(**H**) is mathematically compelling, but what
does it tell us about QM --- or, assuming QM to be a correct and
complete physical theory, about the world? How, in other words, are we
to interpret the quantum logic *L*(**H**)? The
answer will turn on how we unpack the phrase, freely used above,

(*) The value of the observableAlies in the rangeB.

One possible reading of (*) is *operational*: "measurement of
the observable *A* would yield (or will yield, or has yielded)
a value in the set *B* ". On this view, projections represent
statements about the possible results of measurements. This sits badly
with realists of a certain stripe, who, shunning reference to
‘measurement’, prefer to understand (*) as a *property
ascription*: "the system has a certain categorical property, which
corresponds to the observable *A* having, independently of any
measurement, a value in the set *B*". (One must be careful in how one
understands this last phrase, however: construed incautiously, it seems to posit a hidden-variables interpretation of quantum mechanics of just the sort ruled out by Gleason's Theorem. I will have more to say about this below.)

Whereas logicians have usually assumed that properties … of negation were the ones least able to withstand a critical analysis, the study of mechanics points to the distributive identities … as the weakest link in the algebra of logic. [1937, p. 839]

In the 1960s and early 1970s, this thesis was advanced rather more
aggressively by a number of authors, including especially David
Finkelstein and Hilary Putnam, who argued that quantum mechanics
requires a revolution in our understanding of logic *per
se*. According to Putnam [1968], “Logic is as empirical as
geometry. … We live in a world with a non-classical logic.”

For Putnam, the elements of *L*(**H**) represent
categorical properties that an object possesses, or does not,
independently of whether or not we look. Inasmuch as this picture of
physical properties is confirmed by the empirical success of quantum
mechanics, we must, on this view, accept that the way in which
physical properties actually hang together is not Boolean. Since logic
is, for Putnam, very much the study of how physical properties
actually hang together, he concludes that classical logic is simply
mistaken: the distributive law is not universally valid.

Classically, if *S* is the set of states of a physical system,
then *every* subset of *S* corresponds to a categorical
property of the system, and vice versa. In quantum mechanics, the
state space is the (projective) unit sphere *S* =
*S*(**H**) of a Hilbert space. However, not all
subsets of *S* correspond to quantum-mechanical properties of
the system. The latter correspond only to subsets of the special form
*S* **M**, for
**M** a closed linear subspace of **H**. In
particular, only subsets of this form are assigned probabilities. This
leaves us with two options. One is to take only these special
properties as ‘real’ (or ‘physical’, or
‘meaningful’), regarding more general subsets of *S*
as corresponding to no real categorical properties at all. The other
is to regard the ‘quantum’ properties as a small subset of
the set of all physically (or at any rate, metaphysically) reasonable,
but not necessarily *observable*, properties of the system. On
this latter view, the set of *all* properties of a physical
system is entirely classical in its logical structure, but we decline
to assign probabilities to the non-observable
properties.^{[3]}

This second position, while certainly not inconsistent with realism
*per se*, turns upon a distinction involving a notion of
"observation", "measurement", "test", or
something of this sort -- a notion that realists are often at pains to
avoid in connection with fundamental physical theory. Of course, any
realist account of a statistical physical theory such as quantum
mechanics will ultimately have to render up some explanation of how
measurements are supposed to take place. That is, it will have to give
an account of which physical interactions between "object"
and "probe" systems count as measurements, and of how these
interactions cause the probe system to evolve into final
‘outcome-states’ that correspond to -- and have the same
probabilities as -- the outcomes predicted by the theory. This is
notorious * measurement problem *.

In fact, Putnam advanced his version of quantum-logical realism as offering a (radical) dissolution of the measurement problem: According to Putnam, the measurement problem (and
indeed every other quantum-mechanical "paradox")
arises through an improper application of the distributive law, and hence * disappears * once this is recognized. This proposal, however, is widely regarded as mistaken.

As mentioned above, realist interpretations of quantum mechanics must
be careful in how they construe the phrase "the observable *A*
has a value in the set *B*". The simplest and most
traditional proposal -- often dubbed the "eigenstate-eigenvalue link"
(Find 1973) -- is that (*) holds if and only if a measurement of
*A* yields a value in the set *B* with certainty, i.e.,
with (quantum-mechanical!) probability 1. While this certainly gives
a realist interpretation of
(*)^{[4]},
it does not provide a solution to the measurement problem. Indeed,
we can use it to give a sharp formulation of that problem: even
though *A* is certain to yield a value in *B* when
measured, unless the quantum state is an eigenstate of the measured
observable *A*, the system does not possess any categorical
property corresponding to *A*'s having a specific value in the
set *B*. Putnam seems to assume that a realist interpretation
of (*) should consist in assigning to *A* some unknown value
within *B*, for which quantum mechanics yields a non-trivial
probability. However, an attempt to make such assignments
simultaneously for all observables runs afoul of Gleason's
Theorem.^{[5]}

This is hardly the last word, however. Having accepted all of the
above, there still remains the question of *why* the logic of
measurement outcomes should have the very special form
*L*(**H**), and never anything more
general.^{[6]}
This question entertains the idea that the formal structure of
quantum mechanics may be *uniquely determined* by a small
number of reasonable assumptions, together perhaps with certain
manifest regularities in the observed phenomena. This possibility is
already contemplated in von Neumann's *Grundlagen* (and
also his later work in continuous geometry), but first becomes
explicit -- and programmatic -- in the work of George Mackey [1957,
1963]. Mackey presents a sequence of six axioms, framing a very
conservative generalized probability theory, that underwrite the
construction of a ‘logic’ of experimental propositions, or,
in his terminology, ‘questions’, having the structure of a
sigma-orthomodular poset. The outstanding problem, for Mackey, was to
explain why this poset *ought to* be isomorphic to
*L*(**H**):

Almost all modern quantum mechanics is based implicitly or explicitly on the following assumption, which we shall state as an axiom:Axiom VII: The partially ordered set of all questions in quantum mechanics is isomorphic to the partially ordered set of all closed subspaces of a separable, infinite dimensional Hilbert space.This axiom has rather a different character from Axioms I through VI. These all had some degree of physical naturalness and plausibility. Axiom VII seems entirely ad hoc. Why do we make it? Can we justify making it? … Ideally, one would like to have a list of physically plausible assumptions from which one could deduce Axiom VII. Short of this one would like a list from which one could deduce a set of possibilities for the structure … all but one of which could be shown to be inconsistent with suitably planned experiments. [19, pp. 71-72]

Since Mackey's writing there has grown up an extensive technical literature exploring variations on his axiomatic framework in an effort to supply the missing assumptions. The remainder of this article presents a brief survey of the current state of this project.

Notice that the set
(*E*)
of all probability weights on *E* is *convex*, in that,
given any sequence
_{1},_{2},…
of probability weights and any sequence
*t*_{1},*t*_{2},…
of non-negative real numbers summing to one, the convex sum or
‘mixture’
*t*_{1}_{1} +
*t*_{2}_{2} +
… (taken pointwise on *E*) is again a probability weight. The
extreme points of this convex set are exactly the "point-masses"
(*x*) associated with the
outcomes *x*
*E*:

(x)(y) = 1 ifx=y, and 0 otherwise.

Thus,
(*E*) is a *simplex*: each point
(*E*)
is representable in a unique way as a convex combination of extreme
points, namely:

= (x)(x)

We need also to recall the concept of a *random variable*. If
*E* is an outcome set and *V*, some set of
‘values’ (real numbers, pointer-readings, or what not), a
*V*-*valued random variable* is simply a mapping
*f* : *E*
*V*.
The heuristic (but it need only be taken as that) is that one
‘measures’ the random variable *f* by
‘performing’ the experiment represented by *E* and,
upon obtaining the outcome *x*
*E*, recording *f*(*x*) as the measured
value. Note that if *V* is a set of real numbers, or, more
generally, a subset of a vector space, we may define the *expected
value* of *f* in a state
(*E*) by:

E(f,) =_{xE}f(x)(x).

If is a
test space with outcome-space
*X*, a *state* on
is a mapping : *X*
[0,1]
such that
_{xE}
(*x*)
= 1 for every test *E*
.
Thus, a state is a consistent assignment of a probability weight to
each test -- consistent in that, where two distinct tests share a
common outcome, the state assigns that outcome the same probability
whether it is secured as a result of one test or the other. (This may
be regarded as a normative requirement on the outcome-identifications
implicit in the structure of
:
if outcomes of two tests are not equiprobable in all states, they
ought not to be identified.) The set of all states on
is denoted by
().
This is a convex set, but in contrast to the situation in discrete
classical probability theory, it is generally not a simplex.

The concept of a random variable admits several generalizations to the
setting of test spaces. Let us agree that a *simple (real-valued) random
variable* on a test space
is a mapping
*f* : *E*
**R**
where *E* is a test in
.
We define the *expected value* of
*f* in a state
()
in the obvious way, namely, as the expected value of
*f* with respect to the probability
weight obtained by restricting
to *E* (provided, of course, that this expected value
exists). One can go on to define more general classes of random
variables by taking suitable limits (for details, see [Younce,
1987]).

In classical probability theory (and especially in classical
statistics) one usually focuses, not on the set of all possible
probability weights, but on some designated subset of these (e.g.,
those belonging to a given family of distributions).
Accordingly, by a *probabilistic model*, I mean pair
(,)
consisting of a test space
and a designated set of states
() on
.
I'll refer to
as the *test space* and to
as the *state space* of the model.

I'll now indicate how this framework can accommodate both the usual measure-theoretic formalism of full-blown classical probability theory and the Hilbert-space formalism of quantum probability theory.

_{xE}|<u,x>|^{2}= ||u||^{2}= 1

Thus, each unit vector of **H** determines a probability
weight on
.
Quantum mechanics asks us to take this literally: any
‘maximal’ discrete quantum-mechanical observable is modeled
by an orthonormal basis, and any pure quantum mechanical state, by a
unit vector in exactly this way. Conversely, every orthonormal basis
and every unit vector are understood to correspond to such a
measurement and such a state.

Gleason's theorem can now be invoked to identify the states on
with the density operators on **H**: to each state
in
(_{H})
there corresponds a unique density operator *W* such that,
for every unit vector *x* of **H**,
(*x*) = <*Wx*,*x*> =
*Tr*(*WP*_{x}),
*P*_{x} being the one-dimensional projection
associated with *x*. Conversely, of course, every such density
operator defines a unique state by the formula above. We can
also represent simple real-valued random variables
operator-theoretically. Each bounded simple random variable
*f* gives rise to a bounded self-adjoint operator
*A* =
_{xE}
*f*(*x*)*P*_{x}. The spectral
theorem tells us that every self-adjoint operator on
**H** can be obtained by taking suitable limits of
operators of this form.

4.1 Definition:

A test space is said to bealgebraicif for all eventsA,B,Cof ,A~BandBCimpliesAC.

While it is possible to construct perfectly plausible examples of test spaces that are not algebraic, most test spaces that one encounters ‘in nature’ -- including the Borel and quantum test spaces described in the preceding section -- do seem to enjoy this property. The more important point is that, as an axiom, algebraicity is relatively benign, in the sense that many test spaces can be ‘completed’ to become algebraic. In particular, if every outcome has probability greater than .5 in at least one state, then is contained in an algebraic test space having the same outcomes and the same states as . (See [Gudder, 1985] for details).

Suppose now that
is algebraic. It is easy to see that the relation **~**
of perspectivity is then an equivalence relation on the set of
-events.
More than this, if
is algebraic, then **~** is a *congruence* for
the partial binary operation of forming unions of orthogonal events:
in other words,
*A*~*B* and
*B**C* imply that
*A**C* ~
*B**C* for all
-events *A*,
*B*, and *C*.

Let ()
be the set of equivalence classes of
-events under perspectivity,
and denote the equivalence class of an event
*A* by *p*(*A*); we then have a natural partial
binary operation on
()
defined by
*p*(*A*)*p*(*B*)
= *p*(*A**B*) for orthogonal
events *A* and *B*. Setting
0 := *p*(Ø) and 1 := *p*(*E*), *E*
any member of
, we
obtain a partial-algebraic structure
((),,0,1),
called the *logic* of
. This
satisfies the following conditions:

- is associative and
commutative:
- If
*a*(*b**c*) is defined, so is (*a**b*)*c*, and the two are equal - If
*a**b*is defined, so is*b**a*, and the two are equal.

- If
- 0
*a*=*a*, for every*a***L** - For every
*a***L**, there exists a unique*a***L**with*a**a*= 1 *a**a*exists only if*a*= 0

4.2 Definition:

A structure (L,,0,1) satisfying conditions (a)-(d) above is called anorthoalgebra.

Thus, the logic of an algebraic test space is an orthoalgebra. One can show that, conversely, every orthoalgebra arises as the logic () of an algebraic test space (Golfin [1988]). Note that non-isomorphic test spaces can have isomorphic logics.

4.3 Lemma:

For an orthoalgebra (L,,0,1), the following are equivalent:

ab=ab, for alla,binL- If
ab,bc, andcaall exist, then so doesabc- The orthoposet (
L,,) isorthomodular, i.e., for alla,bL, ifabthen (ba)aexists and equalsb.

An orthoalgebra satisfying condition (b) is said to be
*orthocoherent*. In other words: an orthoalgebra is
ortho-coherent if and only if finite pair-wise summable subsets of
**L** are jointly summable. The lemma tells us that every
orthocoherent orthoalgebra is, *inter alia*, an orthomodular
poset. Conversely, an orthocomplemented poset is orthomodular iff
*a**b* =
*a**b* is defined for all pairs with
*a**b* and the
resulting partial binary operation is associative -- in which case the
resulting structure
(**L**,,0,1)
is an orthocoherent orthoalgebra, the canonical ordering on which
agrees with the given ordering on **L**. Thus,
orthomodular posets (the framework for Mackey's version of
quantum logic) are equivalent to orthocoherent orthoalgebras.

Some version of orthocoherence was taken by Mackey and many of his successors as an axiom. (It appears, in an infinitary form, as Mackey's axiom V; a related but stronger condition appears in the definition of a partial Boolean algebra in the work of Kochen and Specker [1965].) However, it is quite easy to construct simple model test spaces, having perfectly straightforward -- even classical -- interpretations, the logics of which are not orthocoherent. As far as I know, there has never been given any entirely compelling reason for regarding orthocoherence as an essential feature of all reasonable physical models. Moreover, certain apparently quite well-motivated constructions that one wants to perform with test spaces tend to destroy orthocoherence (see Section 7).

One way to frame this distinction is as follows. The *support*
of a set of states
is the set

S() = {xX| ((x) > 0) }

of outcomes that are possible when the property
obtains. There is a sense in which two properties are empirically indistinguishable if they have the same support: we cannot distinguish between them
by means of a single execution of a single test. We might therefore wish to identify physical properties with classes of physically indistinguishable classical properties, or, equivalently, with their associated supports. However, if we wish to adhere to the
programme of representing physical properties as subsets (rather than as equivalence-classes of subsets) of the state-space, we can do so, as follows. Define a mapping
*F* :
(*X*)
()
by *F*(*J*) =
{ |
*S*() *J* }.
The mapping
*F*(*S*())
is then a * closure operator * on (),
and the collection of closed sets (that is, the range of *F*) is a complete
lattice of sets, closed under arbitrary intersection.^{[11]} Evidently, classical properties -- subsets of
-- have the same support iff they have the same
closure, so we may identify physical properties with closed subsets of
the state-space:

4.4 Definition:

Theproperty latticeof the model (,) is the complete latticeL=L(,) of all subsets of of the formF(J),Jany set of outcomes.^{[12]}

We now have two different ‘logics’ associated with an entity
(,)
with
algebraic: a ‘logic’
()
of experimental propositions that is an orthoalgebra, but generally
not a lattice, and a ‘logic’
**L**(,)
of properties that is a complete lattice, but rarely
orthocomplemented in any natural way (Randall and Foulis, 1983). The
two are connected by a natural mapping
[ ] : **L**,
given by *p*
[*p*] =
*F*(*J*_{p})
where for each *p*,
*J*_{p}
=
{*x* *X* |
*p*(*x*) *p* }.
That is,
*J*_{p} is the set of outcomes that are consistent
with *p*, and [*p*] is the largest (i.e., weakest)
physical property making *p* certain to be confirmed if
tested.

The mapping *p*
[*p*]
is order preserving. For both the classical and quantum-mechanical
models considered above, it is in fact an order-isomorphism. Note that
whenever this is the case,
will inherit from
**L**
the structure of a complete lattice, which will then automatically be
orthomodular by Lemma 4.3. In other words, in such cases we have only
*one* logic, which is a complete orthomodular lattice. While it
is surely too much to expect that every *conceivable* physical
system should enjoy this property -- indeed, we can easily construct
toy examples to the contrary -- the condition is at least reasonably
transparent in its
meaning.

The answer is: without additional assumptions, not very. The lattice
*L*(**H**) has several quite special
order-theoretic features. First it is *atomic* -- every element
is the join of minimal non-zero elements (i.e., one-dimensional
subspaces). Second, it is *irreducible* -- it can not be
expressed as a non-trivial direct product of simpler
OMLs.^{[13]}
Finally, and most significantly,
it satisfies the so-called *atomic covering law*: if
*p* *L*(**H**) is an atom and
*p* *q*, then
*p* *q*
*covers* *q* (no element of
*L*(**H**) lies strictly between
*p* *q* and
*q*).

These properties do not quite suffice to capture
*L*(**H**), but they do get us into
the right ballpark. Let **V** be any inner product space
over an involutive division ring
*D*. A subspace **M** of **V** is
said to be -*closed* iff
**M** =
**M**^{},
where **M**^{} =
{*v***V** |
*m***M**(
<*v*,*m*> = 0)}. Ordered by set-inclusion, the
collection *L*(**V**)
of all -closed subspaces of
**V** forms a complete atomic lattice, orthocomplemented by the mapping
**M**
**M**^{}. A theorem of
Amemiya and Araki [1965] shows that a real, complex or quaternionic
inner product space **V** with
*L*(**V**) orthomodular, is necessarily
complete. For this reason, an inner product space **V**
over an involutive division ring is called a *generalized Hilbert
space* if its lattice of closed subspaces
*L*(**V**) is orthomodular. The following
representation theorem is due to C. Piron [1964]:

5.1 Theorem:

LetLbe a complete, atomic, irreducible orthomodular lattice satisfying the atomic covering law. IfLcontains at least 4 orthogonal atoms, then there exists an involutive division ringDand an inner-product spaceVoverDsuch thatLis isomorphic toL(V).

It should be noted that generalized Hilbert spaces have been
constructed over fairly exotic division
rings.^{[14]}
Thus, while it brings us tantalizingly close, Piron's theorem
does not quite bring us all the way back to orthodox quantum
mechanics.

The covering law presents a more delicate problem. While it is
probably safe to say that no simple and entirely compelling argument
has been given for assuming its general validity, Piron [1964, 1976]
and others (e.g., Beltrametti and Cassinelli [1981] and Guz [1980])
have derived the covering law from assumptions about the way in which
measurement results warrant inference from an initial state to a final
state. Here is a brief sketch of how this argument goes. Suppose that
there is some reasonable way to define, for an initial state
*q* of the system, represented by an atom of the logic/property
lattice *L*, a final state
_{}_{p}(*q*)
-- either another atom, or perhaps 0 -- conditional on the
proposition *p* having been confirmed. Various arguments can be
adduced suggesting that the only reasonable candidate for such a
mapping is the *Sasaki projection*
_{}_{p} : *L*
*L*, defined by
_{}_{p}(*q*) =
(*q* *p*)
*p*.^{[15]}
It can be shown that an atomic OML satisfies the atomic covering law
just in case Sasaki projections take atoms again to atoms, or to 0.
Another interesting view of the covering law is developed by Cohen and
Svetlichny [1987].

The minimal candidate for *S* is the set of *all*
dispersion-free states on . Setting
*x** =
{*s**S* |
*s*(*x*) = 1}
gives us a classical interpretation as above, which I'll call
the *classical image* of
. Any other classical interpretation
factors through this one. Notice, however, that the mapping *x*
*x** is injective only if there are sufficiently many
dispersion-free states to separate distinct outcomes of
. If
has *no* dispersion-free states at all, then its classical
image is *empty*. Gleason's theorem tells us that this is
the case for quantum-mechanical models. Thus, this particular kind of
classical explanation is not available for quantum mechanical models.

= {{a,x,b}, {b,y,c}, {c,z,a}}

and the state
(*a*) =
(*b*)
=
(*c*) = ½,
(*x*) =
(*y*) =
(*z*) = 0.
It is a simple exercise to show that
cannot be expressed as a weighted average of {0,1}-valued states on
. For further examples and discussion of this point, see Wright
[1980].]

6.1 Lemma:

Let be semi-classical. Then has a separating set of dispersion-free states, and every extreme state on is dispersion-free.

As long as
is locally countable (i.e., no test *E* in
is uncountable), every state can be represented as a convex
combination, in a suitable sense, of extreme states [Wilce,
1992]. Thus, every state of a locally countable semi-classical test
space has a classical interpretation.

Even though neither Borel test spaces nor quantum test spaces are semi-classical, one might argue that in any real laboratory situation, semi-classicality is the rule. Ordinarily, when one writes down in one's laboratory notebook that one has performed a given test and obtained a given outcome, one always has a record of which test was performed. Indeed, given any test space , we may always form a semi-classical test space simply by forming the co-product (disjoint union) of the tests in . More formally:

6.2 Definition:

For each testEin , letE^{~}= { (x,E) |xE}. Thesemi-classical coverof is the test space= {

E^{~}|E}.

We can regard
as arising from
by deletion of the record of which test was performed to secure a
given outcome. Note that every state on
defines a state
on
by
(*x*,*E*)
= (*x*).
The mapping
is plainly injective; thus, we may identify the state-space of
with a subset of the state-space of
.
Notice that there will typically be many states on
that *do not* descend to states on
.
We might wish to think of these as "non-physical", since they do not
respect the (presumably, physically motivated) outcome-identifications
whereby
is defined.

Since it is semi-classical,
admits a classical interpretation, as per Lemma 7.1. Let's
examine this. An element of
*S*()
amounts to a mapping *f* :
*X*, assigning to each test
*E*
, an outcome
*f*(*E*)
*E*. This is a (rather brutal) example of what is meant by a
*contextual (dispersion-free) hidden variable*. The
construction above tells us that such contextual hidden variables will
be available for statistical models quite generally. For other results
to the same effect, see Kochen and Specker [1967], Gudder [1970],
Holevo [1982], and, in a different direction, Pitowsky
[1989].^{[16]}

Note that the simple random variables on
correspond exactly to the
simple random variables on
,
and that these, in turn, correspond to *some* of the simple
random variables (in the usual sense) on the measurable space
*S*().
Thus, we have the following picture: The model
(,)
can always be obtained from a classical model simply by omitting some random variables, and identifying outcomes that can no longer be distinguished by those that remain.

All of this might suggest that our generalized probability theory presents no significant conceptual departure from classical probability theory. On the other hand, models constructed along the foregoing lines have a distinctly ad hoc character. In particular, the set of "physical" states in one of the classical (or semi-classical) models constructed above is determined not by any independent physical principle, but only by consistency with the original, non-semiclassical model. Another objection is that the contextual hidden variables introduced in this section are badly non-local. It is by now widely recognized that this non-locality is the principal locus of non-classicality in quantum (and more general) probability models. (For more on this, see the entry on the Bell inequalities.)

{{a,x,b}, {b,y,c}, {c,z,d}, {d,w,e}, {e,v,s}}

consisting of five three-outcome tests pasted together in a loop. This
test space is by no means pathological; it is both ortho-coherent and
algebraic. Moreover, it admits a separating set of dispersion-free
states and hence, a classical interpretation. Now consider how we
might model a compound system consisting of two separated sub-systems
each modeled by
_{5}.
We would need to construct a test space
and a mapping
: *X* × *X*
*Y* = satisfying, minimally, the following;

- For all outcomes
*x*,*y*,*z**X*, if*x**y*, then*x**z**y**z*and*z**x**z**y*, - For each pair of states
,
(
_{5}), there exists at least one state on such that (*x**y*) = (*x*)(*y*), for all outcomes*x*,*y**X*.

Foulis and Randall show that no such embedding exists for which is orthocoherent.

The thrust of these no-go results is that straightforward
constructions of plausible models for composite systems destroy
regularity conditions (ortho-coherence in the case of the
Foulis-Randall result, orthomodularity and the covering law in that of
Aerts' result) that have widely been used to underwrite
reconstructions of the usual quantum-mechanical formalism. This puts
in doubt whether any of these conditions can be regarded as having the
universality that the most optimistic version of Mackey's
programme asks for. Of course, this does not rule out the possibility
that these conditions may yet be motivated in the case of especially
* simple * physical systems.

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Alexander Wilce

*First published: February 4, 2002*

*Content last modified: February 4, 2002*