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It should not be supposed that Einstein's definition of a complete theory included the requirement that it be deterministic. Rather, he required certain conditions of separability and locality for composite systems consisting of separated component systems: each component system separately should be characterized by its own properties (even if these properties manifest themselves stochastically), and it should be impossible to alter the properties of a distant system instantaneously (or the probabilities of these properties) by acting on a local system. In later analyses -- notably in Bell's extension of the EPR argument -- it became apparent that these conditions, suitably formulated as probability constraints, are equivalent to the requirement that statistical correlations between separated systems should be reducible to a common cause in the sense of Reichenbach.
In the original EPR article, two particles are prepared from a source in a certain quantum state and then move apart. There are matching correlations between both the positions of the two particles and their momenta: a measurement of either position or momentum on a particular particle will allow the prediction, with certainty, of the outcome of a position measurement or momentum measurement, respectively, on the other particle. These measurements are mutually exclusive: either a position measurement can be performed, or a momentum measurement, but not both simultaneously. Either correlation can be observed, but the subsequent measurement of momentum, say, after establishing the position correlation, will no longer yield any correlation in the momenta of the two particles. It is as if the position measurement disturbs the correlation between the momentum values. The puzzle is that the quantum state of the particle pair is inconsistent with any assignment of precise position and momentum values to the particles separately. These values would be the common cause of the correlations, and would provide an explanation of the correlations in terms of the initial correlations between the properties of the two systems at the source. EPR concluded that the quantum state was incomplete.
Here is how Schrödinger put the puzzle in the first part of his two-part article (Schrödinger, p. 559):
Yet since I can predict either x1 or p1 without interfering with the system No. 1 and since system No. 1, like a scholar in an examination, cannot possibly know which of the two questions I am going to ask first: it so seems that our scholar is prepared to give the right answer to the first question he is asked, anyhow. Therefore he must know both answers; which is an amazing knowledge; quite irrespective of the fact that after having given his first answer our scholar is invariably so disconcerted or tired out, that all the following answers are wrong.
What Schrödinger showed was that if two particles are prepared in a quantum state such that there is a matching correlation between two canonically conjugate dynamical quantities -- quantities like position and momentum whose values suffice to specify all the properties of a classical system -- then there are infinitely many dynamical quantities of the two particles for which there exist similar matching correlations: every function of the canonically conjugate pair of the first particle matches with the same function of the canonically conjugate pair of the second particle. Thus (p. 559) system No. 1 does not only know these two answers but a vast number of others, and that with no mnemotechnical help whatsoever, at least with none that we know of.
Schrödinger coined the term entanglement to describe this peculiar connection between quantum systems (Schrödinger, p. 555):
When two systems, of which we know the states by their respective representatives, enter into temporary physical interaction due to known forces between them, and when after a time of mutual influence the systems separate again, then they can no longer be described in the same way as before, viz. by endowing each of them with a representative of its own. I would not call that one but rather the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought. By the interaction the two representatives [the quantum states] have become entangled.
He added (Schrödinger, p. 555):
Another way of expressing the peculiar situation is: the best possible knowledge of a whole does not necessarily include the best possible knowledge of all its parts, even though they may be entirely separate and therefore virtually capable of being best possibly known, i.e., of possessing, each of them, a representative of its own. The lack of knowledge is by no means due to the interaction being insufficiently known -- at least not in the way that it could possibly be known more completely -- it is due to the interaction itself.
Attention has recently been called to the obvious but very disconcerting fact that even though we restrict the disentangling measurements to one system, the representative obtained for the other system is by no means independent of the particular choice of observations which we select for that purpose and which by the way are entirely arbitrary. It is rather discomforting that the theory should allow a system to be steered or piloted into one or the other type of state at the experimenter's mercy in spite of his having no access to it.
In the second part of the paper, Schrödinger showed that, in general, a sophisticated experimenter can, by a suitable choice of operations carried out on one system, steer the second system into any mixture of quantum states he chooses, i.e., not steer the system into any one particular state, but constrain the state into which the system evolves to lie in a given set, and at the same time fix the probabilities with which the system evolves into the states from the given set. He found this conclusion sufficiently unsettling to suggest that the entanglement between two separating systems would persist only for distances small enough that the time taken by light to travel from one system to the other could be neglected, compared with the characteristic time periods associated with other changes in the composite system. He speculated that for longer distances each of the two systems might in fact be in a state associated with a certain mixture, determined by the precise form of the entangled state.
Most physicists dismissed the puzzling features of entangled quantum states as an artefact of Einstein's inappropriate detached observer view of physical theory, and regarded Bohr's reply to the EPR argument as vindicating the Copenhagen interpretation. This was unfortunate, because the study of entanglement was ignored for thirty years until John Bell's reconsideration and extension of the EPR argument. Bell looked at entanglement in simpler systems than the EPR case: matching correlations between two-valued dynamical quantities, such as polarization or spin, of two separated systems in an entangled state. What Bell showed was that the statistical correlations between the measurement outcomes of suitably chosen different quantities on the two systems are inconsistent with an inequality derivable from Einstein's separability and locality assumptions -- in effect from the assumption that the correlations have a common cause.
Bell's investigation generated an ongoing debate on the foundations of quantum mechanics. One important feature of this debate was confirmation that entanglement can persist over long distances(see Aspect et al.), thus falsifying Schrödinger's supposition of the spontaneous decay of entanglement as two entangled particles separate. But it was not until the 1980s that physicists, computer scientists, and cryptographers began to regard the non-local correlations of entangled quantum states as a new kind of non-classical resource that could be exploited, rather than an embarrassment to be explained away. (For further discussion of entanglement as a physical resource, including measuring entanglement, and the manipulation and purification of entanglement by local operations, see "The Joy of Entanglement" by Popescu and Rohrlich in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller, or Nielsen and Chuang.)
What is extraordinary about this phenomenon is that Alice and Bob have managed to use their shared entangled state as a quantum communication channel to destroy the state u of a photon in Alice's part of the universe and recreate it in Bob's part of the universe. Since the state of a photon requires specifying a direction in space (essentially the value of an angle that can vary continuously), without a shared entangled state Alice would have to convey an infinite amount of classical information to Bob for Bob to be able to reconstruct the state u precisely. To see why this is so, consider that the decimal expansion of an angle variable represented by a real number is represented by a potentially infinite sequence of digits between 0 and 9. The binary expansion is represented by a potentially infinite sequence of 0's and 1's. Ever since Shannon formalized the notion of classical information, the amount of classical information associated with a binary alternative (represented as 0 or 1), where each alternative has equal a priori probability, is measured as one binary digit or bit. So to specify the value of an arbitrary angle variable requires an infinite number of bits. To specify the outcome of Alice's operation, which has four possible outcomes, with equal a priori probabilities, requires two bits of classical information. Remarkably, Bob can reconstruct the state u on the basis of just two bits of classical information communicated by Alice, apparently by exploiting the entangled state as a quantum communication channel to transfer the remaining information. (For further discussion of quantum teleportation, see Nielsen and Chuang, or Richard Josza's article "Quantum Information and its Properties" in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller.)
Since information is always embodied in the state of a physical system, we can also think of the Shannon entropy as quantifying the physical resources required to store classical information. Suppose Alice wishes to communicate some classical information to Bob over a classical communication channel such as a telephone line, say an email message. A relevant question concerns the extent to which the message can be compressed without loss of information, so that Bob can reconstruct the original message accurately from the compressed version. According to Shannon's noiseless coding theorem (assuming a noiseless telephone line with no loss of information), the minimal physical resources required to represent the message (effectively, a lower bound on the possibility of compression) are given by the Shannon entropy of the source.
What happens if we use the quantum states of physical systems to store information, rather than classical states? It turns out that quantum information is radically different from classical information. The unit of quantum information is the qubit, representing the amount of information that can be stored in the state of the simplest quantum system, for example, the polarization state of a photon. (The term is due to Schumacher, who proved a quantum analogue of Shannon's noiseless coding theorem.) As we have seen, an arbitrarily large amount of classical information can be encoded in a qubit. This information can be processed and communicated but, because of the peculiarities of quantum measurement, at most one bit can be accessed! According to a theorem by Holevo, the accessible information in a probability distribution over a set of alternative qubits is limited by the von Neumann entropy, which is equal to the Shannon entropy only when the qubits are orthogonal in the space of quantum states, and is otherwise less than the Shannon entropy.
While classical information can be copied or cloned, the quantum no cloning theorem (see Dieks, and Wootters and Zurek) asserts the impossibility of cloning an unknown quantum state. To see why, consider how we might construct a classical copying device. A NOT gate is a device that takes a bit as input and produces as output either a 1 if the input is 0, or a 0 if the input is 1. In other words, a NOT gate is a 1-bit gate that flips the input bit. A controlled-NOT gate, or CNOT gate, takes two bits as inputs, a control bit and a target bit, and flips the target bit if and only if the control bit is 1, while reproducing the control bit. (So there are two inputs, the control and target, and two outputs: the control, and either the target or the flipped target, depending on the value of the control.) A CNOT gate functions as a copying device for the control bit if the target bit is set to 0, because the output of the target bit is then a copy of the control bit (i.e., the input 00 produces output 00, and the input 10 produces output 11). Insofar as we can think of a measurement as simply a copying operation, a CNOT gate is the paradigm of a classical measuring device. (Imagine Alice equipped with such a device, with input and output control and target wires, measuring the properties of an unknown classical world. The input control wire is a probe for the presence of absence of a property, represented by a 1 or a 0. The target wire functions as the pointer, which is initially set to 0. The output of the target is a 1 or a 0, depending on the presence or absence of the property.)
Suppose we attempt to use our CNOT gate to copy an unknown qubit. Since the CNOT gate is now understood as a device for processing quantum states, the evolution from input states to output states must be effected by a physical quantum transformation. Now quantum transformations are linear on the linear state space of qubits. Linearity of the state space means that for any two qubit states (call them 0 and 1) that are orthogonal in the space of qubit states, there is a qubit state that is represented by a linear superposition or sum of these orthogonal states, say 0+1 (which will be non-orthogonal to either of these states). Linearity of the transformation means that any transformation must take a qubit state represented by the sum of two orthogonal qubits to a new qubit state that is the sum of the transformed orthogonal qubits. If the CNOT gate succeeds in copying two orthogonal qubits, it cannot succeed in copying a linear superposition of these qubits. Since the gate functions linearly, it must instead produce a state that is a linear superposition of the outputs obtained for the two orthogonal qubits. That is to say, the output of the gate will be represented by a quantum state that is a sum of two terms, where the first term represents the output of the control and target for the first orthogonal qubit, and the second term represents the output of the control and target for the second orthogonal qubit. This could be written as 00+11. This is an entangled state and not the output that would be required by a successful copying operation, where the control and target each outputs the superposed qubit (which could be written as (0+1)(0+1)).
While the difference between classical and quantum information can be exploited to achieve successful key distribution, there are other cryptographic protocols that are thwarted by quantum entanglement. Bit commitment is a key cryptographic protocol that can be used as a subroutine in a variety of important cryptographic tasks. In a bit commitment protocol, Alice supplies an encoded bit to Bob. The information available in the encoding should be insufficient for Bob to ascertain the value of the bit, but sufficient, together with further information supplied by Alice at a subsequent stage when she is supposed to reveal the value of the bit, for Bob to be convinced that the protocol does not allow Alice to cheat by encoding the bit in a way that leaves her free to reveal either 0 or 1 at will.
To illustrate the idea, suppose Alice claims the ability to predict advances or declines in the stock market on a daily basis. To substantiate her claim without revealing valuable information (perhaps to a potential employer, Bob) she suggests the following demonstration: She proposes to record her prediction, before the market opens, by writing a 0 (for decline) or a 1 (for advance) on a piece of paper, which she will lock in a safe. The safe will be handed to Bob, but Alice will keep the key. At the end of the day's trading, she will announce the bit she chose and prove that she in fact made the commitment at the earlier time by handing Bob the key. Of course, the key-and-safe protocol is not provably secure from cheating by Bob, because there is no principle of classical physics that that prevents Bob (if he is an ideal safe-cracker) from opening the safe and closing it again without leaving any traces. The question is whether there exists a quantum analogue of this procedure that is unconditionally secure: provably secure by the laws of physics against cheating by either Alice or Bob. Bob can cheat if he can obtain some information about Alice's commitment before she reveals it (which would give him an advantage in repetitions of the protocol with Alice). Alice can cheat if she can delay actually making a commitment until the final stage when she is required to reveal her commitment, or if she can change her commitment at the final stage with a very low probability of detection.
It turns out that unconditionally secure two-party bit commitment, based solely on the principles of quantum or classical mechanics (without exploiting special relativistic signalling constraints, or principles of general relativity or thermodynamics) is impossible. (See Mayers, Lo and Chau, and Lo's article "Quantum Cryptology" in Lo, Popescu, an Spiller for further discussion. Note that Kent has shown that one can implement a secure classical bit commitment protocol by exploiting relativistic signalling constraints in a timed sequence of communications between verifiably separated sites for both Alice and Bob.) Roughly, the impossibility arises because at any step in the protocol where either Alice or Bob is required to make a determinate choice (perform a measurement on a particle in the quantum channel, choose randomly and perhaps conditionally between a set of alternative actions to be implemented on the particle in the quantum channel, etc.), the choice can delayed by entangling one or more ancilla (helper) particles with the channel particle in an appropriate way. By suitable operations on the ancillas, the channel particle can be steered so that this cheating strategy is undetectable. In effect, if Bob can obtain no information about the bit in the safe, then entanglement will allow Alice to steer the bit to either 0 or 1 at will.
Consider again the quantum CNOT gate, with two orthogonal qubits 0 and 1 as possible inputs for the control, and 0 as the input for the target. Once can think of the input control and output target qubits, respectively, as the argument and associated value of a function. This CNOT function associates the value 0 with the argument 0 and the value 1 with the argument 1. For a linear superposition of the orthogonal qubits, say 0+1, as inut to the control, and the qubit representing 0 as the input to the target, the output is the entangled state 00+11, a linear superposition in which the first term represents the argument 0 and associated value (0) of the CNOT function, and the second term represents the argument 1 and associated value (1) of the CNOT function. The entangled state represents all possible arguments and corresponding values of the function as a linear superposition, but this information is not accessible. What can be shown to be accessible, by a suitable choice of quantum gates, is information about whether or not the function has certain global properties. This information is obtainable without reading out the evaluation of any individual arguments and values. (Indeed, accessing information in the entangled state about a global property of the function will typically require losing access to all information about individual arguments and values.)
The situation is analogous for Deutsch's function f. Here the output of f can be represented as either 00 + 10 or 01 + 11 (in the constant case), or 00 + 11 or 01 + 10 (in the balanced case). The two entangled states in the constant case are orthogonal in the 4-dimensional two-qubit state space and span a plane. Call this the constant plane. Similarly, the two entangled states in the balanced case span a plane, the balanced plane. These planes are orthogonal in the 4-dimensional state space, except for an overlap: a line, representing a (non-entangled) two-qubit state. It is therefore possible to design a measurement to distinguish the two global properties of f, constant or balanced, with a certain probability (actually, 1/2) of failure, when the measurement yields an outcome corresponding to the overlap state, which is common to the two cases. Nevertheless, only one query of the function is required when the measurement succeeds in identifying the global property. With a judicious choice of quantum gates, it is even possible to design a quantum circuit that always succeeds in distinguishing the two cases.
Deutsch's example shows how quantum information, and quantum entanglement, can be exploited to compute a global property of a function in one step that would take two steps classically. In general, though, the potential speed-up in quantum computation relative to classical computation is exponential. Essentially, this is again due to the phenomenon of entanglement. Indeed, the amount of information required to describe a general entangled state of n qubits grows exponentially with n. The state space (Hilbert space) has 2n dimensions, so a general entangled state is a superposition of 2n n-qubit states. In classical mechanics there are no entangled states: a general n-bit composite system can be described with just n times the amount of information required to describe a single bit system. So the classical simulation of a quantum process would involve an exponential increase in the classical informational resource required to represent the quantum state, as the number of qubits that become entangled in the evolution grows linearly, and there would be a corresponding exponential slowdown in calculating the evolution, compared to the actual quantum computation performed naturally by the system.
While Deutsch's problem is in a sense trivial and has no interesting application, there now exist several quantum algorithms for non-trivial problems, notably Shor's factorization algorithm for factoring large composite integers in polynomial time (with direct application to public key cryptography, a widely used classical cryptographic scheme) and Grover's database search algorithm. (See Nielsen and Chuang, or Barenco's article "Quantum Computation: An Introduction" in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller for details.)
An alternative view, not much discussed in the literature in this connection, is the quantum logical interpretation, which emphasizes the non-Boolean structure of properties of quantum systems. (The properties of a classical system form a Boolean algebra, essentially the abstract characterization of a set-theoretic structure. This is reflected in the Boolean character of classical logic, and the Boolen gates in a classical computer.) A crucial difference between quantum and classical information is the possibility of computing the truth value of an exclusive disjunction -- for example, the constant disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is either 0 or 1, or the balanced disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is either the same as the argument or different from the argument -- without computing the truth values of the disjuncts. Classically, an exclusive disjunction is true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true. In effect, Deutsch's quantum circuit achieves its speed-up by exploiting the non-Boolean structure of quantum properties to compute the value of a disjunctive property, without computing the value of the disjuncts (representing the association of individual arguments with corresponding function values).
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First published: August 13, 2001
Content last modified: August 13, 2001