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There are numerous variations and reinterpretations of the original Everett proposal, most of which are briefly discussed in the entry on Everett's relative state formulation of quantum mechanics. Here, a particular approach to the MWI (which differs from the popular "actual splitting worlds" approach in De Witt 1970) will be presented in detail, followed by a discussion relevant for many variants of the MWI.
The MWI consists of two parts:
A world is the totality of (macroscopic) objects: stars, cities, people, grains of sand, etc. in a definite classically described state.
This definition is based on the common attitude to the concept of world shared by human beings.
Another concept (considered in some approaches as the basic one, e.g., in Saunders 1995) is a relative, or perspectival, world defined for every physical system and every one of its states (provided it is a state of non-zero probability): I will call it a centered world. This concept is useful when a world is centered on a perceptual state of a sentient being. In this world, all objects which the sentient being perceives have definite states, but objects that are not under her observation might be in a superposition of different (classical) states. The advantage of a centered world is that it does not split due to a quantum phenomenon in a distant galaxy, while the advantage of our definition is that we can consider a world without specifying a center, and in particular our usual language is just as useful for describing worlds at times when there were no sentient beings.
The concept of "world" in the MWI belongs to part (ii) of the theory, i.e., it is not a rigorously defined mathematical entity, but a term defined by us (sentient beings) in describing our experience. When we refer to the "definite classically described state" of, say, a cat, it means that the position and the state (alive, dead, smiling, etc.) of the cat is maximally specified according to our ability to distinguish between the alternatives and that this specification corresponds to a classical picture, e.g., no superpositions of dead and alive cats are allowed in a single world.
The concept of a world in the MWI is based on the layman's conception of a world; however, several features are different:
Obviously, the definition of the world as everything that exists does not hold in the MWI. "Everything that exists" is the Universe, and there is only one Universe. The Universe incorporates many worlds similar to the one the layman is familiar with.
Nowadays, the layman knows that objects are made of elementary microscopic particles, and he believes that, consequently, a more precise definition of the world is the totality of all these particles. In the MWI this naive step is incorrect. Microscopic particles might be in a superposition, while objects within a world (as defined in the MWI) cannot be in a superposition. The connection between macroscopic objects defined according to our experience, and microscopic objects defined in a physical theory that aims to explain our experience, is more subtle, and will be discussed further below. The definition of a world in the MWI involves only concepts related to our experience.
A layman believes that our present world has a unique past and future. According to the MWI, a world defined at some moment of time corresponds to a unique world at a time in the past, but to a multitude of worlds at a time in the future.
In our construction OBJECT is the quantum state of an object in a definite state and position. According to the definition of a world we have adopted, in each world the cat is in a definite state: either alive or dead. Schrödinger's experiment with the cat leads to a splitting of worlds even before opening the box. Only in the alternative approach is Schrödinger's cat, which is in a superposition of being alive and dead, a member of the (single) centered world of the observer before she opened the sealed box with the cat (the observer perceives directly the facts related to the preparation of the experiment and she deduces that the cat is in a superposition).
WORLD = OBJECT 1 OBJECT 2 ... OBJECT N (1)
The quantum states corresponding to centered worlds of sentient beings have exactly the same form. The only difference is that in the product there are only states of the objects perceived directly, while most of the universe is, in general, entangled; it is described by .
UNIVERSE = i WORLD i (2)
Different worlds correspond to different classically described states of at least one object. Different classically described states correspond to orthogonal quantum states. Therefore, different worlds correspond to orthogonal states: all states WORLD i are mutually orthogonal and consequently, i 2 = 1.
The reason that I am only able to propose an approximate prescription for correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experience, is essentially the same that led Bell 1990 to claim that "ordinary quantum mechanics is just fine FAPP". The concepts we use: "object", "measurement", etc. are not rigorously defined. Bell was, and many others are looking (until now in vain) for a "precise quantum mechanics". Since it is not enough for a physical theory to be just fine FAPP, a quantum mechanics needs rigorous foundations. However, in the MWI just fine FAPP is enough. Indeed, the MWI has rigorous foundations for (i), the "physics part" of the theory; only part (ii), the correspondence with our experience, is approximate (just fine FAPP). But "just fine FAPP" means that the theory explains our experience for any possible experiment, and this is the goal of (ii). See Butterfield 2001 and Wallace 2001b for more arguments why a FAPP definition of a world ("branch" in their language) is enough.
Given the decomposition (2), the measure of existence of the world i is µi = i 2. It also can be expressed as the expectation value of Pi, the projection operator on the space of quantum states corresponding to the actual values of all physical variables describing the world i:
i UNIVERSEPiUNIVERSE (3)
"I" also have a measure of existence. It is the sum of measures of existence of all different worlds in which I exist; equally, it can be defined as the measure of existence of my perception world. Note that I do not experience directly the measure of my existence. I feel the same weight, see the same brightness, etc. irrespectively of how tiny my measure of existence might be.
To solve this difficulty, Albert and Loewer 1988 proposed the Many Minds interpretation (in which the different worlds are only in the minds of sentient beings). In addition to the quantum wave of the Universe, Albert and Loewer postulate that every sentient being has a continuum of minds. Whenever the quantum wave of the Universe develops into a superposition containing states of a sentient being corresponding to different perceptions, the minds of this sentient being evolve randomly and independently to mental states corresponding to these different states of perception (with probabilities equal to the quantum probabilities for these states). In particular, whenever a measurement is performed by an observer, the observer's minds develop mental states that correspond to perceptions of the different outcomes, i.e. corresponding to the worlds A or B in our example. Since there is a continuum of minds, there will always be an infinity of minds in any sentient being and the procedure can continue indefinitely. This resolves the difficulty: each "I" corresponds to one mind and it ends up in a state corresponding to a world with a particular outcome. However, this solution comes at the price of introducing additional structure into the theory, including a genuinely random process.
Vaidman1998 (p. 254) resolves the problem by constructing an ignorance probability in the framework of the MWI. It seems senseless to ask: "What is the probability that Lev in the world A will observe A?" This probability is trivially equal to 1. The task is to define the probability in such a way that we could reconstruct the prediction of the standard approach: probability 1/3 for A. It is indeed senseless for you to ask what is the probability that Lev in the world A will observe A, but this might be a meaningful question for Lev in the world of the outcome A. Under normal circumstances, the world A is created (i.e. measuring devices and objects which interact with measuring devices will become localized according to the outcome A) before Lev will be aware of the result A. Then, it is sensible to ask this Lev about his probability to be in world A. There is a matter of fact about which outcome this Lev will see, but he is ignorant about this fact at the time of the question. In order to make this point vivid, Vaidman proposed an experiment in which the experimenter is given a sleeping pill before the experiment. Then, while asleep, he is moved to room A or to room B depending on the results of the experiment. When the experimenter has woken up (in one of the rooms), but before he has opened his eyes, he is asked "In which room are you?" Certainly, there is a matter of fact about which room he is in (he can learn about it by opening his eyes), but he is ignorant about this fact at the time of the question. This construction provides the ignorance interpretation of probability, but the value of the probability has to be postulated (see Section 6.3 below for attempts to derive it):
The probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment is proportional to the total measure of existence of all worlds with that outcome.
The question of the probability of obtaining A also makes sense for the Lev in world B before he becomes aware of the outcome. Both "Lev"s have the same information on the basis of which they should give their answer. According to the probability postulate they will give the same answer: 1/3 (the relative measure of existence of the world A). Since Lev before the measurement is associated with two "Lev"s after the measurement who have identical ignorance probability concepts for the outcome of the experiment, I can define the probability of the outcome of the experiment to be performed as the ignorance probability of the successors of Lev for being in a world with a particular outcome.
The "sleeping pill" argument does not reduce the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment to a familiar concept of probability in the classical context. The quantum situation is genuinely different. Since all outcomes of a quantum experiment are actualized, there is no probability in the usual sense. The argument explains the Behavior Principle (see below) for an experimenter according to which he should behave as if there were certain probabilities for different outcomes. The justification is particularly clear in the approach to probability as the value of a rational bet on a particular result. The results of the betting of the experimenter are relevant for his successors emerging after performing the experiment in different worlds. Since the experimenter is related to all of his successors and they all have identical rational strategies for betting, then, this should also be the strategy of the experimenter before the experiment.
Several authors justify the probability postulate without relying on the sleeping pill argument. Tappenden 2000 (p. 111) adopts a different semantics according to which "I" live in all branches and have "distinct experiences" in different "superslices", and uses "weight of a superslice" instead of measure of existence. He argues that it is intelligible to associate probabilities according to the probability postulate: "Faced with an array of weighted superslices as part of myself ... what choice do I have but to assign an array of attitudes, degrees of belief, towards the experiences associated with those superslices?". Saunders 1998, exploiting a variety of ideas in decoherence theory, the relational theory of tense and theories of identity over time, also argues for "identification of probability with the Hilbert Space norm" (which equals the measure of existence). Page 2002 promotes an approach which he has recently named Mindless Sensationalism. The basic concept in this approach is a conscious experience. He assigns weights to different experiences depending on the quantum state of the universe, as the expectation values of presently-unknown positive operators corresponding to the experiences (similar to the measures of existence of the corresponding worlds (3)). Page writes "... experiences with greater weights exist in some sense more ..." In all of these approaches, the postulate is justified by appeal to an analogy with treatments of time, e.g., the measure of existence of a world is analogous to the duration of a time interval. In a more ambitious work, Deutsch 1999 has claimed to derive the probability postulate from the quantum formalism and the classical decision theory, but it is far from clear that he achieves this (see Barnum et al.).
The collapse leads to effects that are, in principle, observable; these effects do not exist if the MWI is the correct theory. To observe the collapse we would need a super technology, which allows "undoing" a quantum experiment, including a reversal of the detection process by macroscopic devices. See Lockwood 1989 (p. 223), Vaidman 1998 (p. 257), and other proposals in Deutsch 1986. These proposals are all for gedanken experiments that cannot be performed with current or any foreseen future technology. Indeed, in these experiments an interference of different worlds has to be observed. Worlds are different when at least one macroscopic object is in macroscopically distinguishable states. Thus, what is needed is an interference experiment with a macroscopic body. Today there are interference experiments with larger and larger objects (e.g., fullerene molecules C60), but these objects are still not large enough to be considered "macroscopic". Such experiments can only refine the constraints on the boundary where the collapse might take place. A decisive experiment should involve the interference of states which differ in a macroscopic number of degrees of freedom: an impossible task for today's technology.
The collapse mechanism seems to be in contradiction with basic physical principles such as relativistic covariance, but nevertheless, some ingenious concrete proposals have been made (see Pearle 1986 and the entry on collapse theories). These proposals (and Weissman's 1999 non-linear MW idea) have additional observable effects, such as a tiny energy non-conservation, that were tested in several experiments. The effects were not found and some (but not all!) of these models have been ruled out.
In most no-collapse interpretations, the evolution of the quantum state of the Universe is the same. Still, one might imagine that there is an experiment distinguishing the MWI from another no-collapse interepretation based on the difference in the correspondence between the formalism and the experience (the results of experiments).
An apparent candidate for such an experiment is a setup proposed in Englert et al. 1992 in which a Bohmian world is different from the worlds of the MWI (see also Aharonov and Vaidman 1996). In this example, the Bohmian trajectory of a particle in the past is contrary to the records of seemingly good measuring devices (such trajectories were named surrealistic). However, at present, there are no memory records that can determine unambiguously (without deduction from a particular theory) the particle trajectory in the past. Thus, this difference does not lead to an experimental way of distinguishing between the MWI and Bohmian mechanics. I believe that no other experiment can distinguish between the MWI and other no-collapse theories either, except for some perhaps exotic modifications, e.g., Bohmian mechanics with initial particle position distribution deviating from the quantum distribution.
There are other opinions about the possibility of testing the MWI. It has frequently been claimed, e.g. by De Witt 1970, that the MWI is in principle indistinguishable from the ideal collapse theory. On the other hand, Plaga 1997 claims to have a realistic proposal for testing the MWI, and Page 2000 argues that certain cosmological observations might support the MWI.
One might consider also a possible philosophical advantage of the plurality of worlds in the MWI, similar to that claimed by realists about possible worlds, such as Lewis 1986 (see the discussion of the analogy between the MWI and Lewis's theory by Skyrms 1976). However, the analogy is not complete: Lewis' theory considers all logically possible worlds, many more than all worlds incorporated in the quantum state of the Universe.
Indeed, the mathematical structure of the theory (i) does not yield a particular basis. The basis for decomposition into worlds follows from the common concept of a world according to which it consists of objects in definite positions and states ("definite" on the scale of our ability to distinguish them). In the alternative approach, the basis of a centered world is defined directly by an observer. Therefore, given the nature of the observer and given her concepts for describing the world, the particular choice of the decomposition (2) follows (up to a precision which is good FAPP, as required). If we do not ask why we are what we are, and why the world we perceive is what it is, but only how to explain relations between the events we observe in our world, then the problem of the preferred basis does not arise: we and the concepts of our world define the preferred basis.
But a stronger response can be made to this criticism. Looking at the details of the physical world, the structure of the Hamiltonian, the value of the Planck constant, etc., one can argue why the sentient beings we know are of a particular type and why they have the particular concepts they do for describing their worlds. The main argument is that the locality of interactions yields stability of worlds in which objects are well localized. The small value of the Planck constant allows macroscopic objects to be well localized for a considerable period of time. Thus, such worlds (corresponding to quantum states i) can maintain their macroscopic description long enough to be perceived by sentient beings. By constrast, a "world" with macroscopic objects being in a superposition of macroscopically distinguishable states (corresponding to a quantum state 1/2(1+2) evolves during an extremely small time, much smaller than the perception time of any feasible sentient being, into a mixture with the other "world" 1/2(1-2) (see Zurek 1998).
This is a good argument why sentient beings perceive localized objects and not superpositions, but one cannot rely on the decoherence argument alone in order to single out the proper basis. (See some technical difficulties in Barvinsky and Kamenshchik 1995.) The fact that we can perceive only well localized objects in definite macroscopic states might not be just a physics issue: chemistry, biology, and even psychology might be needed to account for our evolution. See various attempts to construct a theory of evolution of sentient beings based on the MWI or its variants in Albert 1992, Chalmers 1996, Deutsch 1996, Donald 1990, Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990, Lehner 1997, Lockwood 1989, Page 2002, Penrose 1994, Saunders 1994, and Zeh 1981.
Another idea for obtaining a probability law out of the formalism is to state, by analogy to the frequency interpretation of classical probability, that the probability of an outcome is proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. This proposal immediately yields predictions that are different from what we observe in experiments. Some authors, arguing that counting is the only sensible way to introduce probability, consider this to be a fatal difficulty for the MWI, e.g., Ballentine 1975. Graham 1973 suggested that the counting of worlds does yield correct probabilities if one takes into account detailed splitting of the worlds in realistic experiments, but other authors have criticized the MWI because of the failure of Graham's claim. Weissman 1999 has proposed a modification of quantum theory with additional non-linear decoherence (and hence even more worlds than standard MWI), which can lead asymptotically to worlds of equal mean measure for different outcomes. Although this avoids random processes, like other MWI's, the price in the complication of the mathematical theory seems to be too high for the simplification in explaining probability. I believe that assigning equal probability to every world is unjustified. The formalism of quantum theory includes different amplitudes for quantum states corresponding to different worlds. It is a positive feature of the theory that the differences in the mathematical descriptions of worlds (different absolute values of amplitudes) are manifest in our experience. See Saunders 1998 for a detailed analysis of this issue.
From the weak probability postulate (the probability is a function of the measure of existence) follows that in case all the worlds in which a particular experiment took place have equal measures of existence, the probability of an outcome is proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. If the measures of existence of these worlds are not equal, the experimenters in all the worlds can perform additional auxiliary measurements of some variables such that all the new worlds will have equal measures of existence. The experimenters should be completely indifferent to the results of these auxiliary measurements: their only purpose is to split the worlds into "equal-weight" worlds. This procedure reconstructs the standard quantum probability rule from the counting worlds approach; see Deutsch 1999 for details.
Another claim, recently discussed by Lewis 2000, is related to the strategy of a believer in the MWI who is offered to play a quantum Russian roulette game. The argument is that I, who would not accept an offer to play a classical Russian roulette, should agree to play the roulette any number of times if the triggering occurs according to the outcome of a quantum experiment. Indeed, at the end, there will be one world in which Lev is a multi-millionaire and all other worlds in which there will be no Lev Vaidman alive. Thus, in the future, Lev will be rich and presumably a happy man.
However, adopting the Probability Postulate leads all believers in the MWI to behave according to the following principle:
We care about all our successive worlds in proportion to their measures of existence.
With this principle our behavior will be similar to the behavior of a believer in the collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds according to the probability of their occurrence. I should not agree to play quantum Russian roulette because the measure of existence of worlds with Lev dead will be much larger than the measure of existence of the worlds with rich Lev alive.
The MWI exhibits some kind of nonlocality: "world" is a nonlocal concept, but it avoids action at a distance and, therefore, it is not in conflict with the relativistic quantum mechanics; see discussions of nonlocality in Vaidman 1994, Tipler 2000, Bacciagaluppi 2002, and Hemmo and Pitowsky 2001. Although the issues of (non)locality are most transparent in the Schrödinger representation, an additional insight can be gained through recent analysis in the framework of the Heisenberg representation, see Deutsch and Hayden 2000, Rubin 2001, and Deutsch 2001. The most celebrated example of nonlocality was given by Bell 1964 in the context of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument. However, in the framework of the MWI, Bell's argument cannot get off the ground because it requires a predetermined single outcome of a quantum experiment.
Another example of a kind of an action at a distance in a quantum theory with collapse is the interaction-free measurement of Elitzur and Vaidman 1993. Consider a super-sensitive bomb which explodes when any single particle arrives at its location. It seems that it is impossible to see this bomb, because any photon that arrives at the location of the bomb will cause an explosion. Nevertheless, using the Elitzur and Vaidman method, it is possible, at least sometimes, to find the location of the bomb without exploding it. In the case of success, a paradoxical situation arises: we obtain information about some region of space without any particle being there. Indeed, we know that no particle was in the region of the bomb because there was no explosion. The paradox disappears in the framework of the MWI. The situation is paradoxical because it contradicts physical intuition: the bomb causes an observable change in a remote region without sending or reflecting any particle. Physics is the theory of the Universe and therefore the paradox is real if this story is correct in the whole physical Universe. But it is not. There was no photon in the region of the bomb in a particular world, but there are other worlds in which a photon reaches the bomb and causes it to explode. Since the Universe incorporates all the worlds, it is not true that in the Universe no photon arrived at the location of the bomb. It is not surprising that our physical intuition leads to a paradox when we limit ourselves to a particular world: physical laws are applicable when applied to the physical universe that incorporates all of the worlds.
The MWI is not the most accepted interpretation of quantum theory among physicists, but it is becoming increasingly popular (see Tegmark 1998). The strongest proponents of the MWI can be found in the communities of quantum cosmology and quantum computing. In quantum cosmology it makes it possible to discuss the whole Universe avoiding the difficulty of the standard interpretation which requires an external observer. In quantum computing, the key issue is the parallel processing performed on the same computer; this is very similar to the basic picture of the MWI.
Many physicists and philosophers believe that the most serious weakness of the MWI (and especially of its version presented here) is that it "gives up trying to explain things". In the words of Steane 1999, "It is no use to say that the [Schrödinger] cat is really both alive and dead when every experimental test yields unambiguously the result that the cat is either alive or dead." (Steane dismisses the interference experiment which can reveal the presence of the superposition as unfeasible.) Indeed, if there is nothing in physics except the wave-function of the Universe, evolving according to the Schrödinger equation, then there are questions answering which requires help by other sciences. However, the advantage of the MWI is that it allows us to view quantum mechanics as a complete and consistent physical theory which agrees with all experimental results obtained to date.
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First published: March 24, 2002
Content last modified: March 24, 2002