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- Sense and Reference
- Reasons for Singular Propositions
- A Modal Argument against Singular Propositions
- Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions
- Bibliography
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- Related Entries

Russell, on the other hand, rejected senses and attempted to solve the problems that senses were introduced to solve by logical analysis and scope distinctions. The result was that propositions expressed by sentences such as "The inventor of bifocals was bald" did not have senses as constituents. However, they did not have objects as constituents either. Roughly speaking, Russell had propositional functions--functions from objects to propositions-- in place of senses. Yet at the bottom level such a view seems to require singular propositions. These are the basic or atomic propositions upon which the complex propositions are built. Frege's atomic propositions are composed of senses while Russell's require individuals.

Recently, David Kaplan has argued that essential difference between Frege's and Russell's theories of language is nothing more nor less than the acceptance of singular propositions. If we were to add singular propositions to Frege's theory then with some modifications we could reduce Frege's view to Russell's view. Hence, if Kaplan is correct and there are singular propositions as well, then we need not introduce the complexities of a Fregean theory of sense and we can focus our semantical attention on the simpler Russellian theories.

Let us assume without argument that there are propositions. We make
this assumption knowing that many philosophers have serious doubts
about the existence of propositions. However, our current purpose is
to ask whether there are any positive reasons that can be given in
favor of *singular* propositions even granting that there are
propositions. We will use an argument that was originally presented
by David Kaplan to show that demonstratives are directly referential
expressions (and hence are used to express singular
propositions). Suppose David is standing at a table with two men;
Charles on his left and Paul on his right. Paul lives in New Jersey
and Charles lives in Illinois. David points to the person on his
right and says (at time *t*)

(1) He lives in New Jersey.David has expressed a proposition that we can label

(2) The person on David's right (atwhich we can labelt) lives in New Jersey ,

It is important here to be clear about what we are supposing. We are
asking what the truth value of the propositions *p* and
*p** *would be* in the described counterfactual
circumstance. We are *not* asking what proposition would David
express by uttering (1) in the counterfactual circumstance. It is
true that the proposition expressed by (1) will differ in different
circumstances of utterance or different *contexts*. Paul can
utter (1) pointing to Charles or Charles can utter (1) pointing to
David. In these different contexts different propositions will be
expressed.

Nonetheless since *p* and *p** differ in truth value
in the described counterfactual circumstance, *p** cannot be
*p*. (It is an axiom of propositional theory that if
*p* = *p** then *p* and *p** have the
same truth value in all counterfactual circumstances.) A similar
argument can be presented for any proposition that is in fact about
Paul, but could be about someone else in a different counterfactual
circumstance. So, for example, if we replaced (2) with

(3) The person David is pointing to lives in New Jersey,we will run into the same problem.

One might suppose that one can avoid singular propositions by
claiming, along lines similar to what David Lewis has argued, that it
is a mistake to place any philosophical importance on the question of
what is true in a counterfactual circumstance
*simplicter*. Counterfactual circumstances are merely one
parameter among many that are necessary to determine truth. What we
should say is that (1) is true relative to a complex or structure
that contains a *context* and a *counterfactual (or
factual) circumstance *among other parameters. Viewed in this
light it appears that (1) and (3) have the same truth value given the
same parameters. One result with this way of looking at things is
that either propositions are identified with sentences (types) or
sets of items containing all the necessary parameters (such as sets
of possible worlds). David Lewis accepts the latter and in so doing
accepts that there are singular propositions. So Lewis's way of
looking at things does not avoid commitment to singular
propositions. If one accepts that propositions are sentences then one
must give up the view that they can be about particulars. For on such
a view the proposition David expresses when he says

(4) I am bored.is the same proposition that Paul, Charles, or anyone else would express were they to utter (4). So it would be a mistake to say that (4) as uttered by David is about David. But then

Still, given what we have said thus far, it is possible that Paul is
not a constituent of *p *but the singleton set of Paul or the
property of being Paul is a constituent of *p*. The reason in
favor of Paul over his singleton as a constituent of *p*
concerns issues of reference in the philosophy of language. Can we
*directly* refer to an individual or property? Can we directly
refer to the singleton of Paul? If the answer is yes, then we could
run into a problem if we claimed that *p* has Paul's
singleton as a constituent. Let a be an
expression that directly refers to Paul's singleton. Sets, of
course, do not live in states so the proposition expressed by the
following is false

(5) a lives in New Jersey.Yet, the proposition expressed by (5) appears to have the same constituents as

(6)While (6) is false, it might have been true (here the number designates the proposition (if there is one) as opposed to the sentence). That is, it is possibly true. If (6) had been true, then (6) would have existed. After all, (6) cannot have the property of being true without existing, so had (6) been true then Socrates would not have existed, but (6) would have existed. But if Socrates is a constituent of (6), then (6) cannot exist without Socrates's existing. Therefore, Socrates is not a constituent of (6).Socrates did not exist.

Basically, Plantinga argues that ordinary objects such as persons cannot be constituents of propositions because the propositions can exist without the individual's existing. There are different replies to Plantinga's argument one can make depending on the metaphysical position one takes with respect to modality. If one is a possibilist then one makes a distinction between something's being actual and something's existing (or subsisting or having being of some sort). So Socrates can be a constituent of a proposition even in circumstances where Socrates is not an actual object. On the other hand, if one is an actualist (and accepts singular propositions) then one must deny Plantinga's claim that (6) can exist without Socrates's existing. Here one must argue that (6)'s being possibly true does not imply that (6) can be true without Socrates's existing. As an analogy consider John's assertion "It is possible I do not exist." John can describe or represent a circumstance or world where John does not exist. So, too, (6) can represent a circumstance or world where (6) does not exist. For (6) to be possibly true is for (6) to represent a circumstance or world that could obtain. It is not required that (6) be a part of the world or circumstance that (6) represents any more than it is required that John be a part of the world that he describes with his assertions.

(7)Does (7) exist? Socrates is long gone; he no longer exists. But if (7) does not exist how can it be false? Moreover, if (7) does exist then exactly what age is the constituent of (7)? 21? 37? It seems a bit absurd to say that the age of a constituent of a proposition is thus and so, yet if Socrates himself is a constituent of (7), then he must be a certain age. No human person exists without being a certain age.Socrates exists.

Again the reply that one makes to the temporal modal objection is like the reply that one makes to the alethic modal objection in that it depends on one's metaphysical views concerning time and individuals. If, for example, one accepts the 4D view of objects then as far as age (and other issues involving change of existing objects) goes there is no problem. The object that is a constituent of a proposition is a complete object in that all the temporal stages or parts of the object in question are involved. So part of Socrates is 21 and part is 37.

On the other hand, if one holds to a 3D view where the object is
wholly present at each time that it exists, then matters become a bit
more complex. There are different ways to go. For example, one could
hold that at each time, *t*, at which Socrates existed there
is a singular proposition involving Socrates and *t* (and
perhaps the property of existence if it is a property). On one such
view there is no such proposition as (7). So the question of the age
(and other features of changing existing objects) will depend on the
time involved in the proposition under consideration. On another view
(7) expresses the conjunction of all such propositions, hence the
question of age does not arise.

When we ask (on either view) how can an object that no longer exists be a constituent of a proposition, we need to consider the various metaphysical views concerning ordinary individuals. If we can think of (or refer to) Socrates even though Socrates does not exist, then Socrates can be a constituent of a proposition though Socrates does not exist. What then shall we say of the proposition that Socrates exists? Does it exist or not? If it does not exist, then that does not prevent us from thinking of it (as with Socrates). On the other hand if we are prevented from thinking of Socrates because he no longer exists, then there are no singular propositions about Socrates. But that does not prevent there from being singular propositions about currently existing objects. One must simply give up the view that propositions are eternal.

The question of whether there are singular propositions, like the general question of whether there are propositions at all, has not been settled. Different philosophers take different positions on this issue. However, there remains a major advantage for accepting some form of singular propositions, namely, on such a view is clear how propositions represent or describe the world.

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*First published: July 19, 1997*

*Content last modified: May 13, 2002*