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Difficulties for N-relation Accounts of Natural Laws

N-relation theories of natural laws face difficulties in accounting for some of the very things they were introduced to explain. These difficulties may not be insuperable, but they are serious enough to be worth noting here.

Modality It isn't clear that N-relation theorists are any better off than regularity theorists when it comes to explaining the modal features of laws. If it is a contingent matter, as most aver, which first-order properties stand in the N-relation, then this relation doesn't link those properties because of what those properties are like; it just happens to link some properties in the actual world, and it could link completely different properties in other possible circumstances. On this account light could have had the phenomenal properties of molasses, photons the mass of the solar system, and two quite different kinds of elementary particles could retain their identities while swapping all their quantum numbers.

The reason why modality is a problem for such N-relation theorists is that you cannot infer a genuine nomological must from an is (although you may be able to contrive some sort of ersatz must). If we want genuine modal force to fall out at the end, we have to build it in at the beginning, and on N-relation accounts there is no place to put it except in the N-relation itself. We might do this by holding that the N- relation links the same properties in every nomologically possible world, but without an independent characterization of nomological possibility this doesn't illuminate the nature of laws. So it can be tempting, as a sort of last resort, to conclude that the necessity involved is a very strong, metaphysical necessity. If we do build such a strong necessity into the N relation, so that if it actually relates two properties, it necessarily does so, we can explain the modal force of laws. But in accordance with the fundamental ontological tradeoff, investing the N-relation with this strong modal force raises the epistemic cost.

Confirmation If laws involve a metaphysical relation holding among properties, it may be more difficult to determine when an observed regularity is actually backed by a law. N-relation theorists may urge that we do this using whatever methods actual scientists employ. But argument is required to show that such methods actually give us reasons to believe that there are laws with the strong features that N-relation theorists suppose, rather than merely supplying reasons to draw the weaker sorts of conclusions proposed by regularity theorists.

A Nice Sharp Line It is far from clear that there is a sharp line between laws non-laws. Indeed, we often talk as though some laws (e.g., various conservation laws) are very fundamental and robust, while other laws (e.g., Kepler's laws) are less so.

Explanation We often (indeed very often, outside fundamental physics) explain things by citing the causal mechanisms and processes they involve rather than by subsuming them under general laws. For example, we do not explain why all crows are black by saying (in some more idiomatic way) that the N-relation holds between the properties being a crow and being black. We explain it by finding causal (in this case genetic) mechanisms that link the two properties. In other cases we appeal to a deeper theory, e.g., we explain why Kepler's laws hold (to the extent that they do) by deriving (approximations of) them from Newton's laws.

Copyright © 1999 by
Chris Swoyer
cswoyer@ou.edu

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First published: December 15, 2000
Content last modified: December 15, 2000