This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Properties


1. Let I be an interpretation function with respect to a model, so that I(a) is the individual I assigns to the individual constant ‘a’, I(Fn) is the n-place relation that I assigns to n-place predicate Fn. Then for all n-place predicates ‘Fn’ and individuals constants ‘c1’, ..., ‘cn’, the sentence ‘’ is true in the interpretation just in case < I(c1), ..., I(cn)> ext(I(Fn)). We would relativize this clause to variable assignments in the usual way to define satisfaction conditions for atomic sentences.

2. More generally, if is a formula with free occurrences of exactly the variables v1, ..., vn, then ‘[v1,..., vn ]’ is an n-place complex predicate (normal quotation marks are used here as stand-ins for quasi-quotation). In more complicated applications we could allow to contain no free variables (in which case ‘[ ]’ denotes the proposition that-) or more free variables than are bound by the -operator (to allow expressions like ‘[x Fxyz]’, which we could quantify into, as with ‘y([x Fxyz])’.

3. A standard sort of comprehension schema holds that for each open formula , Xnx1...xn(Xnx1...xn if and only if ).

Copyright © 1999 by
Chris Swoyer

First published: September 23, 1999
Content last modified: September 23, 1999