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The man wearing a beret is bald.is to be understood as equivalent to the following:
Some man is wearing a beret, and at most one man is wearing a beret, and every man wearing a beret is bald.This facilitates a response to versions of the Fregean puzzle involving definite descriptions. More complex sentences with definite descriptions will be ambiguous. Applying the account of definite descriptions to belief sentences, we get these results:
George IV believed that the person who wrote Waverly was famous.If George IV was in doubt about the identity of the author of Waverly, wondering whether it was Sir Walter Scott or someone else, then the A version would be true, but the B version could be false. George IV would be engaged in a general belief, without specific knowledge of any person's writing of Waverly, and that is captured by the A version.
A version: George IV believed that some person wrote Waverly, at most one person wrote Waverly, and every person who wrote Waverly is famous.
B version: Some person wrote Waverly, at most one person wrote Waverly, and every person who wrote Waverly is an x such that George IV believed that x was famous.
Retaining the definite description, we could distinguish the two readings of the sentence as follows:
A version: George believed that this was true: the author of Waverly was famous.This is a distinction in the scope of the definite description. In the A version, the definite description has small scope, within the propositional object clause of the belief ascription. In the B version, the definite description has large scope, in effect "picking out" an individual and then ascribing to George IV a belief about that individual. The A version can also be identified as a de dicto ascription of belief (relating him to a dictum, a complete proposition), whereas the B version is a de re ascription of belief (relating him to an individual, a res, that his belief is about). (See the discussion of the de re/de dicto distinction.)
B version: The author of Waverly was an individual x such that George IV believed that x was famous.
Frege's puzzle concerns questions like the following:
How could this be true: Albert believes that the Venus rises in the morning, though this is not true: Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning?Since Venus is the evening star, why does substitution of one name for the other affect the correctness of the ascription? The russellian answer lies in recognizing the ambiguity in the second sentence, which involves a definite description.
Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning.The falsity of the A version does not conflict with Albert's belief about Venus, that it rises in the morning, since the A version ascribes a belief in a complete dictum and does not relate Albert to an individual. The difference in truth-value between Albert believes that the Venus rises in the morning and Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning is no longer puzzling. The B version captures what is right: that Albert has a belief about a particular individual (that we are now identifying as the evening star, even though Albert wouldn't so identify it in this context), a belief that it rises in the morning.
A version: Albert believes that this is true: the evening star rises in the morning.
B version: The evening star is an individual x such that Albert believes that x rises in the morning.
This solution requires that we make sense of quantification into
belief contexts (the B version), so that we have a real
distinction. (See the discussion of
the de re/de dicto distinction.) The
solution is also limited, because it applies only to versions of the
puzzle that involve definite descriptions.
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First published: February 16, 2000
Content last modified: February 16, 2000