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Supplement to Propositional Attitude Reports

The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

There is an important distinction in belief attributions, and, according to some, in the beliefs we attribute. W. V. Quine's example (Quine 1956) brings this out nicely through the recognition of an ambiguity in
[1] Ortcutt believes that someone is a spy.
This could mean just that
[2] Ortcutt believes that there are spies
or that Ortcutt has more interesting information:
[3] Someone is an x such that Ortcutt believes that x is a spy.
The distinction here can be seen as a distinction of scope for the existential quantifier. In [2], the existential quantifier is interpreted as having small scope, within the propositional clause of the belief attribution.
[2*] Ortcutt believes: x, x is a spy.
In [3], however, the existential quantifier has large scope, selecting an individual and then ascribing a belief that relates Ortcutt to that particular individual.
[3*] x, Ortcutt believes that x is a spy.
The ambiguity in [1] and the simple way of distinguishing the two interpretations in [2*] and [3*] suggest that we are on to something. Russell's theory of definite descriptions employs just such a distinction in answering Frege's puzzles about belief. (See Definite descriptions.)

We just identified the distinction between [2*] and [3*] as a distinction in the scope of the quantifier. But [3*] also introduces something that needs a further account. On the standard semantics for quantification, the interpretation of [3*] requires that we be able to say when an individual x satisfies the open sentence ‘ Ortcutt believes that x is a spy’. Looked at another way, we no longer have a complete statement of a proposition in the propositional clause position in the sentence, since ‘that x is a spy’ does not express a proposition with a definite truth-value. Considerations like these have motivated the identification of a distinction between de dicto belief attributions like [2] and [2*] and de re belief attributions like [3] and [3*]. The purely de dicto attribution relates Ortcutt to a dictum, a complete propositional content. The de re attribution relates him to a res, an individual that his belief is about. To say that an individual satisfies ‘Ortcutt believes that x is a spy’ is to say that Ortcutt has a de re belief about that individual. (For more on de re belief, see Quine 1956, Burge 1977.)

Although it may be tempting to think of these as an ambiguity in the verb ‘believe’, the section Ambiguity theories explains why this is not possible.

Copyright © 2000 by
Thomas McKay

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First published: February 16, 2000
Content last modified: February 16, 2000