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Immediately after introducing the idea, Wittgenstein goes on to argue that there cannot be such a language. The importance of drawing philosophers' attention to a largely unheard-of notion and then arguing that it is unrealizable lies in the fact that an unformulated reliance on the possibility of a private language is arguably essential to mainstream epistemology, philosophy of mind and metaphysics from Descartes to versions of the representational theory of mind which have been prominent in late twentieth century cognitive science.
The argument is quickly summarized. The conclusion is that a language in principle unintelligible to anyone but its originating user is impossible. The reason for this is that such a so-called language would, necessarily, be unintelligible to its supposed originator too, for he would be unable to establish meanings for its putative signs.
Nevertheless, there has been fundamental and widespread disagreement over the details, the significance and even the intended conclusion of the argument, let alone over its soundness. Some of this disagreement has arisen because of the notorious difficulty and occasional elusiveness of Wittgenstein's own text (sometimes augmented by problems of translation). For example, some philosophers have questioned the very existence in the relevant passages of a unified structure properly identifiable as a sustained argument. But much derives from the tendency of philosophers to read into the text their own preconceptions without making them explicit and asking themselves whether its author shared them. Some commentators, for instance, supposing it obvious that sensations are private, have interpreted the argument as intended to show they cannot be talked about; some, supposing the argument to be an obvious but unsustainable attempt to wrest special advantage from scepticism about memory, have maintained it to be unsound because it self-defeatingly implies the impossibility of public discourse as well as private; some have assumed it to be a direct attack on the problem of other minds; some have claimed it to commit Wittgenstein to behaviourism; some have thought it to imply that language is, of necessity, not merely potentially but actually social.
The early history of the secondary literature is largely one of disputation over these matters. Yet what these earlier commentators have in common is significant enough to outweigh their differences and make it possible to speak of them as largely sharing an Orthodox understanding of the argument. Since the publication in 1982 of Saul Kripke's definitely unOrthodox book, however, in which he suggested that the argument poses a sceptical problem about the whole notion of meaning, public or private, disputation conducted by Orthodox rules of engagement has been largely displaced by a debate on the issues arising from Kripke's interpretation. Both debates, though, show a tendency to proceed with only the most cursory attention to the original argument which started them off.
This rush to judgment about what is at stake, compounded by a widespread willingness to discuss commentators' more accessible accounts of the text rather than confront its difficulties directly, has made it difficult to recover the original from the accretion of more or less tendentious interpretation which has grown up around it. Such a recovery is one of the tasks attempted in this article.
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Another, related, function is to oppose the idea that metaphysical absolutes are within our reach, that we can find at least part of the world as it really is in the sense that any other way of conceiving that part must be wrong (cf. Philosophical Investigations p. 230). Philosophers are especially tempted to suppose that numbers and sensations are examples of such absolutes, self-identifying objects which themselves force upon us the rules for the use of their names. Wittgenstein discusses numbers in earlier sections on rules (185-242). Some of his points have analogues in his discussion of sensations, for there is a common underlying confusion about how the act of meaning determines the future application of a formula or name. In the case of numbers, one temptation is to confuse the mathematical sense of determine in which, say, the formula y = 2x determines the numerical value of y for a given value of x (in contrast with y > 2x, which does not) with a causal sense in which a certain training in mathematics determines that normal people will always write the same value for y given both the first formula and a value for x -- in contrast with creatures for which such training might produce a variety of outcomes (cf. sec. 189). This confusion produces the illusion that the result of an actual properly conducted calculation is the inevitable outcome of the mathematical determining, as though the formula's meaning itself were shaping the course of events.
In the case of sensations, the parallel temptation is to suppose that they are self-intimating. Itching, for example, seems like this: one just feels what it is directly; if one then gives the sensation a name, the rules for that name's subsequent use are already determined by the sensation itself. Wittgenstein tries to show that this impression is illusory, that even itching derives its identity only from a sharable practice of expression, reaction and use of language. If itching were a metaphysical absolute, forcing its identity upon me in the way described, then the possibility of such a shared practice would be irrelevant to the concept of itching: the nature of itching would be revealed to me in a single mental act of naming it (the kind of mental act which Russell called acquaintance); all subsequent facts concerning the use of the name would be irrelevant to how that name was meant; and the name could be private. The private language argument is intended to show that such subsequent facts could not be irrelevant, that no names could be private, and that the notion of having the true identity of a sensation revealed in a single act of acquaintance is a confusion.
The suggestion that a language could be private in the way described appears most openly in the second of Bertrand Russell's published lectures The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, where Russell says:
In a logically perfect language, there will be one word and no more for every simple object, and everything that is not simple will be expressed by a combination of words, by a combination derived, of course, from the words for the simple things that enter in, one word for each simple component. A language of that sort will be completely analytic, and will show at a glance the logical structure of the facts asserted or denied. ... A logically perfect language, if it could be constructed, would not only be intolerably prolix, but, as regards its vocabulary, would be very largely private to one speaker. That is to say, all the names that it would use would be private to that speaker and could not enter into the language of another speaker.Although Wittgenstein does not explicitly say so, it is likely that this is the inspiration of his argument: his writing is marked in many places by criticism of Russell.
... A name, in the narrow logical sense of a word whose meaning is a particular, can only be applied to a particular with which the speaker is acquainted, because you cannot name anything you are not acquainted with.
... One can use this as a name to stand for a particular with which one is acquainted at the moment. We say This is white. ... But if you try to apprehend the proposition that I am expressing when I say This is white, you cannot do it. If you mean this piece of chalk as a physical object, then you are not using a proper name. It is only when you use this quite strictly, to stand for an actual object of sense [i.e. a sense-datum], that it is really a proper name. And in that it has a very odd property for a proper name, namely that it seldom means the same thing two moments running and does not mean the same thing to the speaker and to the hearer.
... [I]n order to understand a name for a particular, the only thing necessary is to be acquainted with that particular. When you are acquainted with that particular, you have a full, adequate and complete understanding of the name, and no further information is required.
But the idea of a private language is more usually hidden: the confusions supposed to belong to it allegedly underlie a range of articulated philosophical notions and theories, without themselves being so articulated. The argument is thus perhaps most profitably read, not as refuting any particular theory, but as removing the motivation for considering a range of apparently independent or even competing theories along with their associated tasks, problems and solutions.
For example, a still very common idea, often attributed to John Locke and openly embraced by Jerry Fodor in the nineteen seventies, is that interpersonal spoken communication works by speakers' translation of their internal mental vocabularies into sounds followed by hearers' re-translation into their own internal vocabularies. Again, Descartes considered himself able to talk to himself about his experiences while claiming to be justified in saying that he does not know (or not until he has produced a reassuring philosophical argument) anything at all about an external world conceived as something independent of them. And he and others have thought: while I may make mistakes about the external world, I can infallibly avoid error if I confine my judgments to my immediate sensations. (Compare The Principles of Philosophy, I, 9.) Again, many philosophers, including John Stuart Mill, have supposed there to be a problem of other minds, according to which I may reasonably doubt the legitimacy of applying, say, sensation-words to beings other than myself.
In each of these examples, the implication is that the internal vehicle of my musings could in principle be private: for these problems and theories even to make sense, sharability must be irrelevant to meaning and it must be at least conceivable that my knowledge, even my understanding, is necessarily confined to my own case. This is especially clear with Descartes: for his sceptical question to be raised without being immediately self-defeating, he must hold it possible to identify his experiences inwardly -- where inwardly means without relying on resources supplied by his essential embodiment in a world whose existence is independent of his own mind and accessible to others (e.g. such resources as the concepts acquired in a normal upbringing). The question which accordingly looms large in the private language argument is: How is this identification of one's experiences to be achieved?
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However, to investigate the possibility of the imagined diary case by exploring it from the inside (the only way, he thinks, really to expose the confusions involved) requires him to use certain words when it is just the right to use these words which is in question. Thus he is forced to mention in section 258 actions like ostensive definition, concentrating the attention, speaking, writing, remembering, believing and so on, in the very process of suggesting that none of these can really be done in the situation under consideration (section 261).
This difficulty has often gone unnoticed by commentators on the argument, with particularly unhappy results for the understanding of the discussion of the diary example. Fogelin, for instance, a paradigm representative of Orthodoxy, treats this as a case where he himself, a living embodied human being, keeps a diary and records the occurrences of a sensation which he finds it impossible to describe to anyone else. But we are not to assume that the description of the keeping of the diary is a description of a possible or even ultimately intelligible case. In particular, we are not to think of such a human being's keeping a real diary, but of something like the Cartesian internal equivalent. It is thus vital to the argument that the diary case is presented in the first person, without our pressing the question, Who is speaking? At this stage we are simply not to worry about whether the diary story ultimately makes sense or not. But the fact that it may not make sense must be remembered in reading what follows, which in strictness should constantly be disfigured with scare quotes. (I shall, as I have already, occasionally supply them as a reminder, reserving double quotes for this purpose.)
To summarize the argument's preliminary stage: In section 256 Wittgenstein asked of the "private language", How do I use words to stand for my sensations?, and reminded us in section 257 that we cannot answer As we ordinarily do. So this question, which is the same question as How do I obtain meaning for the expressions in a "private language"? is still open; and the answer must be independent of our actual connections between words and sensations. In the attempt to arrive at an answer, and explore the question in its full depth, he temporarily allows the use of the notions of sensation and diary-keeping (despite the objections of section 257), and imagines himself in the position of a private linguist recording his sensations in a diary. The aim is to show that even if this concession is made, meaning for a sensation-word still cannot be secured and maintained by such a linguist. The crucial central part of the argument begins here, at section 258.
This remark has usually been interpreted as a demand that, for the sign S to have been given a meaning, it must always figure thereafter (if used affirmatively and sincerely) as a true statement: that is, I must use the sign S affirmatively only when I really do have the sensation S. And it has usually been thought that the subsequent argument concerns the adequacy of memory to ensure that I do not later misidentify my sensations and call a different kind of sensation S in the future. This account of the argument and its history is summed up by Anthony Kenny as follows:
Many philosophers have taken I remember the connection right to mean I use "S" when and only when I really have S. They then take Wittgenstein's argument to be based on scepticism about memory: how can you be sure that you have remembered aright when next you call a sensation S? ...This interplay of criticism and defence characterizes the Orthodox interpretation of the argument. (See Fogelin, pp. 162-4, for a good example.) There seem to be at least two reasons why this interpretation should have become established. First, philosophers committed to the idea of a private language are generally looking for an arrangement in which mistakes of fact are impossible; that is, they are trying to overcome scepticism by finding absolute certainty. (Descartes is the example usually cited.) And this would make sceptical arguments appear to be natural weapons to use in reply to them. (See, e.g., Fogelin p. 153.) Secondly, it is plausible -- which is not the same as correct -- to suppose that one cannot be mistaken concerning the natures of one's present sensations, and a supposed proof that the idea of a private language entails that one is just as fallible on this subject as on any other could thus seem crippling to that idea.
Critics of Wittgenstein have found the argument, so interpreted, quite unconvincing. Surely, they say, the untrustworthiness of memory presents no more and no less a problem for the user of a private language than for the user of a public one. No, Wittgenstein's defenders have said, for memory-mistakes about public objects may be corrected, memory-mistakes about private sensations cannot; and where correction is impossible, talk of correctness is out of place. At this point critics of Wittgenstein have either denied that truth demands corrigibility, or have sought to show that checking is possible in the private case too. (Kenny, pp. 191-192)
But, as Kenny first showed, the question of factual infallibility in future uses of the sign S is not the issue. If we look closely at section 258, we see that I remember the connection right refers to remembering a meaning, namely, the meaning of the sign S, not to making sure that I infallibly apply S only to S's in the future. (Nor does the private language argument depend on taking the latter to be an effect of the former.)
... whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can't talk about right.The point is highly condensed. Here is a more explicit version. For there to be factual assertion, there must be the distinction between truth and falsehood, between saying what is the case and saying what is not. For there to be the distinction between truth and falsehood, there must be a further distinction between the source of the meaning, and the source of the truth, of what is said. Suppose that I confront some object and say of it This is S. If I must also appeal to this very object to explain the meaning of the sign S, I deprive my initial utterance of any claim to the status of factual assertion -- it becomes, at best, ostensive definition. (The at best is important here, for the same reason that the diary example is not to be assumed genuinely possible.)
What has gone wrong? The answer is that Kenny's and the Orthodox accounts share an unnoticed assumption: that even in the circumstances of the "private language" there is actually an application of a sign to a private sensation by a private linguist. The problem as Kenny then conceives it is one of later remembering this earlier application in order that S should have retained its meaning. The question then seems to be whether one's admittedly fallible memory is adequate for the maintenance of meaning. But why should this assumption be allowed? What entitles us to assume that a private linguist could even ostensively define his sign to himself in the first place? As we have seen, this is one of the matters in question; and sections 260 and 261 show that Wittgenstein was not prepared to let an argument in favour of private language proceed from this assumption. In these two sections Wittgenstein reminds us that his arguments in the earlier sections (e.g. 33-35) of Philosophical Investigations showed that ostensive definition was not achieved by any performance unless certain circumstantial conditions are fulfilled; and nothing about the diary case as so far described shows them to be fulfilled. It is only later (sections 270-271) that Wittgenstein imagines a partial fulfilment of them, and the result there is to render the language public.
One cause of the muddle is Wittgenstein's insistence that there must be a distinction between obeying a rule and merely thinking that one has. This does not result, as the Orthodox have supposed, in a demand for, and eventual rejection of, memory-infallibility in a private language: demand and rejection being based respectively on the grounds that without infallibility one could always be going wrong and would never know if one were, and with infallibility one would collapse the distinction between obeying a rule and merely thinking one was obeying it. Rather, the argument is this. The private linguist cannot legislate a meaning for a sign by "private ostensive definition" merely -- for this has to establish a technique of using the sign (section 260). The technique cannot function by means of repeated "ostensive definitions", as we saw in examining the first answer, since this collapses the distinction between meaning and truth and thus destroys the possibility of making factual judgments. So the so-called "definition" has on some other basis to establish a constancy in use of the sign.
But this is just what is in question. What would be constancy here? What would be using the sign in the same way as before? How was the sign used in the first place? As there cannot be assumed to be a way of using the sign which the linguist succeeds even in determining, let alone establishing, and which is the correct way, independent of the linguist's later impression of the correct way, then a defender of "private language" would have to show that there was. It might now seem as if one could show this by appealing to the private linguist's memory. He simply remembers how he used the sign before. And this looks straightforward enough, because one thinks: he certainly did something before, for he remembers it. And we do not require his memory to be infallible. But the memory does at least have to be a memory: that is, accurate or not, it has to be of something determinate which existed independently of the memory of it; and the "memory" alone cannot bring such a thing into existence.
This is the argument of section 265, which has often been mistakenly given an epistemological interpretation. Again we cannot assume that there has been an actual table (even a mental one) of meanings in the case of the private linguist, a table which is now recalled and about which the linguist must rely on recall since the original has gone. Rather, as sections 260-264 show, there may be nothing determinate other than this "remembering of the table". So when we think that a private linguist could remember the meaning of S by remembering a past correlation of the sign S with a sensation, we are supposing what needs to be itself established -- that there was indeed some independent correlation to be remembered. Fallibility of memory, even of memory of meaning, is neither here nor there: the point is not that there is doubt now about the trustworthiness of memory, but that there was doubt then about the status of what occurred. And this original, non-epistemological, doubt cannot later be removed by "recollections" of a status inherently dubious in the first place. That is, if there was no genuine original correlation in the first place, a "memory" will not create one. But if, alternatively, we do not suppose that there was something independent of the memory to be remembered, again what seems right is right; the "memory" of the "correlation" is being employed to confirm itself, for there is no independent access to the "remembered correlation". (Not even the independent access that we have as posers of the example, since the question is, can we pose such an example? The typical mistake commentators make here is to disguise the problem by thinking of S in terms of some concept, such as pain, which they bring to the example themselves.) This is why Wittgenstein says (section 265), As if someone were to buy several copies of the morning paper to assure himself that what it said was true.
The question as it concerns the first objection has already been answered. The supposed threat to public language arose entirely from the the claim that memory-scepticism could not be confined to the private case. But since scepticism concerning memory is no part of the argument, there is no reason to suppose that any question of such confinement arises, and thus there is no question of the argument's being self-defeating by excluding the possibility of something we know to be actual, i.e. the language we already have. Now showing the absence of any appeal to memory-scepticism involved transferring the burden of the argument from the question of whether or not an ostensive definition could be remembered or not to the question of whether there could be an ostensive definition in the first place.
This enables us to answer the question as it concerns the second objection. It is clear that an argument which has as its focus the question of ostensive definition is not committed to ruling out in advance all hypothetical cases of Robinson Crusoes. For there is no a priori barrier to imagining a form of life complex enough for us to be assured that a determinate ostensive definition had been accomplished by such a being. Such a Crusoe, unlike a private linguist, lives in a world independent of his impressions of it, and thus there could be definite occurrences in it which he could remember or forget; and some of those occurrences could be correlations of signs with objects. (There are, however, further complications here. See Canfield 1996.)
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Kripke's account resembles that given here in its rejection of Orthodoxy and in its emphasis on the logical priority of the discussion of rule-following to that of private language. It differs in the prominence it gives to the opening sentence of Philosophical Investigations section 201: This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule. Kripke says of this (p. 68), The impossibility of private language emerges as a corollary of [Wittgenstein's] sceptical solution of his own paradox. Wittgenstein himself immediately brushed this "paradox" aside in his very next paragraph: It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here ...; but Kripke takes the paradox to pose a genuine and profound sceptical problem about meaning.
The example Kripke chooses to illustrate the problem is that of addition. What is it to grasp the rule of addition? The application of the rule is potentially infinite, and bizarre interpretations of the rule, as well as the standard one, are compatible with any finite set of applications of the usual sort such as 7 + 14 = 21. So what is it which makes it true that when I say plus I mean the usual addition function and not some other? Kripke understands this question as containing a Humean problem to which, he claims, Wittgenstein gives a Humean, sceptical solution. Kripke formulates the problem in two different ways.
The first way is this: there is no fact about me that distinguishes my meaning a definite function by "plus" ... and my meaning nothing at all (p. 21). The absence of this fact, in Kripke's view, leads Wittgenstein to abandon the explanation of the meanings of statements like By "plus", I meant addition in terms of truth-conditions, and to replace it with explanation in terms of assertibility-conditions, which involve actual (not merely potential) community agreement. (Hence the claim that this is a sceptical solution: Wittgenstein is supposed to concede to the sceptic the absence of truth-conditions for such statements.) This agreement, on Kripke's account, legitimizes the assertion that I meant addition by plus despite there having been no fact of the matter.
This requirement of community agreement for meaning obviously rules out the possibility of private language immediately, thereby making the argument of Philosophical Investigations sections 256-271 superfluous. This superfluity makes for an odd reading of the text; and the oddness is highlighted by the observation that this first formulation of the sceptical problem relies on Kripke's assumption that we have some idea of what a fact is, independent of a statement's being true. For one of the themes of Philosophical Investigations is that there is no such idea, that the only route to the identification of facts is through the uses of the expressions in which those facts are stated, uses which give us the truth-conditions. These uses are often very different from what we would expect -- hence the impression that truth-conditions are lacking -- and it is a matter of some philosophical difficulty to see them clearly.
The other formulation of the problem is this (Kripke p. 62): Wittgenstein questions the nexus between past "intention" or "meanings" and present practice: for example, between my past "intentions" with regard to "plus" and my present computation ... . The idea is that my grasp of the rule governing the use of plus does not determine that I shall produce a unique answer for each of indefinitely many new additions in the future. The impression that something is missing here, though, is a result of just that kind of confusion about determination identified in the section headed The Significance of the Issue above.
Kripke's account of the private language argument is thus vitiated by his unargued reliance on ideas which Wittgenstein argued against. This of course does not show that he has not hit upon a new and more interesting notion of private language than that expounded here.
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First published: July 26, 1996
Content last modified: September 28, 1998