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In its essentials, this thesis was first advocated in the late 17th century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in much greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement initiated in the 1820s, mathematicians such as Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass had succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematical theories of their day. By the late 1800s, William Hamilton had also introduced ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers, and Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work by H.G. Grassmann and Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had also gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. Thus, by Frege's day it was generally recognized that a large portion of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.

Even so, it was not until 1879, when Frege developed the necessary logical apparatus, that the project of logicism could be said to have become technically viable. Following another five years' work, Frege arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic. During the 1890s he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would be required if logicism were to succeed.

By 1903, both Whitehead and Russell had come to the same conclusion.
By this time, both men were also in the initial stages of preparing
second volumes to earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898
*A Treatise on Universal Algebra* and Russell's 1903 *The
Principles of Mathematics.* Since their research overlapped
considerably, they began collaboration on what was eventually to become
*Principia Mathematica.*

Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part
of both men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing *
Principia* would result in an estimated loss of approximately 600
pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the
Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, that still left a
100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors
able to see their work through to publication.

Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.

Despite these criticisms, *Principia Mathematica* proved to
be remarkably influential in at least three other ways. First, it
popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its
authors. By using a notation superior in many ways to that of Frege,
Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power
of modern logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to
achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the
new logic, Whitehead and Russell were also able to show how powerful
the modern idea of a formal system could be. Third, *Principia
Mathematica* reaffirmed clear and interesting connections between
logicism and two main branches of traditional philosophy, namely
metaphysics and epistemology, thus initiating new and interesting work
in both these and other areas.

Thus, not only did *Principia* introduce a wide range of
philosophically rich notions (such as propositional function, logical
construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery
of classical metatheoretic results (such as those of Kurt Gödel
and others) and initiated a tradition of common technical work in
fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics, economics
and computer science.

Volume 2 begins with a "Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions". It then continues with Part III, entitled "Cardinal Arithmetic", which itself contains sections on "Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers", "Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation", and "Finite and Infinite"; Part IV, entitled Relation-Arithmetic", which contains sections on "Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers", "Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations", "The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations", and "Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers"; and the first half of Part V, entitled "Series", which contains sections on "General Theory of Series", "On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives", and "On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions".

Volume 3 continues Part V with sections on "Well-Ordered Series", "Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals", and "Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series". It also contains Part VI, entitled "Quantity", which itself contains sections on "Generalization of Number", "Vector-Families", "Measurement", and "Cyclic Families".

A fourth volume, on geometry, was planned but never completed. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.

- Frege, Gottlob (1893, 1903)
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik,*Band I (1893), Band II (1903), Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle. Ed. and trans. in part by M. Furth as*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic,*Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964. - Russell, Bertrand (1903)
*Principles of Mathematics,*Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Russell, Bertrand (1919)
*Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy,*London: George Allen & Unwin. - Russell, Bertrand (1948) "Whitehead and
*Principia Mathematica*",*Mind*, 57, 137-138. - Russell, Bertrand (1955) My Philosophical Development, London and New York: Routledge
- Whitehead, Alfred North (1898)
*A Treatise on Universal Algebra,*Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Whitehead, Alfred North (1906)
*On Mathematical Concepts of the Material World,*London: Dulau. - Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell (1910, 1912, 1913)
*Principia Mathematica*, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Second edition, 1925 (Vol. 1), 1927 (Vols 2, 3). Abridged as*Principia Mathematica to *56,*Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962.

*First published: May 21, 1996*

*Content last modified: July 20, 2000*