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Holism and Nonseparability in Physics

It has sometimes been suggested that quantum phenomena exhibit a characteristic holism or nonseparability, and that this distinguishes quantum from classical physics. One puzzling quantum phenomenon arises when one performs measurements of spin or polarization on certain separated quantum systems. The results of these measurements exhibit patterns of statistical correlation that resist traditional causal explanation. Some have held that it is possible to understand these patterns as instances or consequences of quantum holism or nonseparability. Just what holism and nonseparability are supposed to be has not always been made clear, though, and each of these notions has been understood in different ways. Moreover, while some have taken holism and nonseparability to come to the same thing, others have thought it important to distinguish the two. Any evaluation of the significance of quantum holism and/or nonseparability must rest on a careful analysis of these notions.


Holism has often been taken as the thesis that the whole is more than the sum of its parts. Several different interpretations of this epigram prove relevant to physics, as we shall see. Here is a correspondingly vague initial statement of nonseparability: The state of the whole is not constituted by states of its parts. It is already apparent both that holism and nonseparability are related notions and that their exact relation needs to be clarified.

In one interpretation, holism is a methodological thesis, to the effect that the best way to study the behavior of a complex system is to treat it as a whole, and not merely to analyze the structure and behavior of its component parts. Alternatively, holism may be taken as a metaphysical thesis: There are some wholes whose natures are simply not determined by the nature of their parts. Methodological holism stands opposed to methodological reductionism, in physics as well as in other sciences. But it is a certain variety of metaphysical holism that is more closely related to nonseparability. What is at issue here is the extent to which the properties of the whole are determined by the properties of its parts: property holism denies such determination, and thereby comes very close to a thesis of nonseparability.

By and large, a system in classical physics can be analyzed into parts, whose states and properties determine those of the whole they compose. But the state of a system in quantum mechanics resists such analysis. The quantum state of a system gives a specification of it's probabilistic dispositions to display various properties on measurement. Quantum theory's most complete such specification is given by what is called a pure state. Even when a compound system has a pure state, some of its subsystems may not have their own pure states. Emphasizing this characteristic of quantum mechanics, Schrödinger described such component subsystems as "entangled". Superficially, such entanglement of systems already demonstrates nonseparability. At a deeper level, it has been maintained that the puzzling statistics that arise from measurements on entangled quantum systems either demonstrate, or are explicable in terms of, holism or nonseparability rather than any problematic action at a distance.

The Aharonov-Bohm effect also appears to exhibit action at a distance, as the behavior of electrons is modified by a magnetic field they never experience. But this effect may be understood instead as a result of the local action of nonseparable electromagnetism.

Puzzling correlations arise between distant simultaneous measurements even in the vacuum, according to quantum field theory. Perhaps these, too, are not a result of direct causal connections, but rather a manifestation of some kind of holism or nonseparability?

String theory is an ambitious research program in the framework of quantum field theory. According to string theory, all fundamental particles can be considered to be excitations of underlying non-pointlike entities in a multi-dimensional space. The particles' intrinsic charge, mass and spin may then arise as nonseparable features of the world at the deepest level.

Methodological Holism

Methodologically, holism stands opposed to reductionism, somewhat as follows.
Methodological Holism: An understanding of a certain kind of complex system is best sought at the level of principles governing the behavior of the whole system, and not at the level of the structure and behavior of its component parts.

Methodological Reductionism: An understanding of a complex system is best sought at the level of the structure and behavior of its component parts.

This seems to capture much of what is at stake in debates about holism in social and biological science. In social science, societies are the complex systems, composed of individuals; while in biology, the complex systems are organisms, composed of cells, and ultimately of proteins, DNA and other molecules. A methodological individualist maintains that the right way to approach the study of a society is to investigate the behavior of the individual people that compose it. A methodological holist, on the other hand, believes that such an investigation will fail to shed much light on the nature and development of society as a whole. There is a corresponding debate within physics. Methodological reductionists favor an approach to (say) condensed matter physics which seeks to understand the behavior of a solid or liquid by applying quantum mechanics (say) to its component molecules, atoms, ions or electrons. Methodological holists think this approach is misguided: As one condensed matter physicist put it "the most important advances in this area come about by the emergence of qualitatively new concepts at the intermediate or macroscopic levels--concepts which, one hopes, will be compatible with one's information about the microscopic constituents, but which are in no sense logically dependent on it." [Leggett (1987), p.113.]

It is surprisingly difficult to find methodological reductionists among physicists. The elementary particle physicist Steven Weinberg, for example, is an avowed reductionist. He believes that by asking any sequence of deeper and deeper why-questions one will arrive ultimately at the same fundamental laws of physics. But this explanatory reductionism is metaphysical in so far as he takes explanation to be an ontic rather than a pragmatic category. On this view, it is not physicists but the fundamental laws themselves that explain why "higher level" scientific principles are the way they are. Weinberg (1992) explicitly distinguishes his view from methodological reductionism by saying that there is no reason to suppose that the convergence of scientific explanations must lead to a convergence of scientific methods.

Metaphysical Holism

The metaphysical holist believes that the nature of some wholes is not determined by that of their parts. One may distinguish three varieties of metaphysical holism: ontological, nomological and property holism.
Ontological Holism: Some objects are not wholly composed of basic physical parts.

Property Holism: Some objects have properties that are not determined by physical properties of their basic physical parts.

Nomological Holism: Some objects obey laws that are not determined by fundamental physical laws governing the structure and behavior of their basic physical parts.

All three theses require an adequate clarification of the notion of a basic physical part. One way to do this would be to consider objects as basic, relative to a given class of objects subjected only to a certain kind of process, just in case every object in that class continues to be wholly composed of a fixed set of these (basic) objects. Thus, atoms would count as basic parts of hydrogen if it is burnt to form water, but not if it is converted into helium by a thermonuclear reaction.

Weinberg's (1992) reductionism is opposed to nomological holism in science. He claims, in particular, that thermodynamics has been explained in terms of particles and forces, which could hardly be the case if thermodynamic laws were autonomous. In fact thermodynamics presents a fascinating but complex test case for the theses both of property holism and of nomological holism. One source of complexity is the variety of distinct concepts of both temperature and entropy that figure in both classical thermodynamics and statistical mechanics. Another is the large number of quite differently constituted systems to which thermodynamics can be applied, including not just gases and electromagnetic radiation but also magnets, chemical reactions, star clusters and black holes. Both sources of complexity require a careful examination of the extent to which thermodynamic properties are determined by the physical properties of the basic parts of thermodynamic systems. A third difficulty stems from the problematic status of the probability assumptions that are required in addition to the basic mechanical laws in order to recover thermodynamic principles within statistical mechanics. (An important example is the assumption that the micro-canonical ensemble is to be assigned the standard, invariant, probability distribution.) Since the basic laws of mechanics do not determine the principles of thermodynamics without some such assumptions (however weak), there may well be at least one interesting sense in which thermodynamics establishes nomological holism.

Property/Relational Holism

While some form of ontological holism has occasionally been considered, the variety of metaphysical holism most clearly at issue in quantum mechanics is property holism. But to see just what the issue is we need a more careful formulation of that thesis.

First the thesis should be contextualized to physical properties of composite physical objects. We are interested here in how far a physical object's properties are fixed by those of its parts, not in some more general determinationist physicalism. Next, to arrive at an interesting formulation of property holism we must accept that this thesis is not only concerned with properties, and not concerned with all properties. The properties of a whole will typically depend upon relations among its proper parts as well as on properties of the individual parts. But if we are permitted to consider all properties and relations among the parts, then these trivially determine the properties of the whole they compose. For one relation among the parts is what we might call the complete composition relation--that relation among the parts which holds just in case they compose this very whole with all its properties.

Let us call a canonical set of properties and relations of the parts which may or may not determine the properties and relations of the whole the supervenience basis. To avoid trivializing the theses we are trying to formulate, only certain properties and relations can be allowed in the supervenience basis. The intuition as to which these are is simple--the supervenience basis is to include just the qualitative intrinsic properties and relations of the parts, i.e. the properties and relations which these bear in and of themselves, without regard to any other objects, and irrespective of any further consequences of their bearing these properties for the properties of any wholes they might compose. Unfortunately, this simple intuition resists precise formulation. It is notoriously difficult to say precisely what is meant either by an intrinsic property or relation, or by a purely qualitative property or relation. And the other notions appealed to in expressing the simple intuition are hardly less problematic. But, imprecise as it is, this statement serves already to exclude certain unwanted properties and relations, including the complete composition relation, from the supervenience basis.

Finally, we arrive at the following opposing theses:

Physical Property Determination: Every qualitative intrinsic physical property and relation of a set of physical objects from any domain D subject only to type P processes supervenes on qualitative intrinsic physical properties and relations in the supervenience basis of their basic physical parts (relative to D and P).

Physical Property Holism: There is some set of physical objects from a domain D subject only to type P processes, not all of whose qualitative intrinsic physical properties and relations supervene on qualitative intrinsic physical properties and relations in the supervenience basis of their basic physical parts (relative to D and P).

There is some residual unclarity in the notion of supervenience that figures in these theses. The idea is familiar enough--that there can be no relevant difference in objects in D without a relevant difference in their basic physical parts. I take it that the modality involved here is not logical but broadly physical. One might try to explicate the notion of supervenience here in terms of models of a true, descriptively complete, physical theory. At issue is whether such a physical theory has two models which agree on the qualitative intrinsic physical properties and relations of the basic parts of one or more objects in D but disagree on some qualitative intrinsic property or relation of these objects.

Teller (1989) has introduced the related idea of what he calls relational holism.

Relational Holism: There are non-supervening relations--that is, relations that do not supervene on the nonrelational properties of the relata. (p. 214)
Within physics, this specializes to a close relative of physical property holism, namely:
Physical Relational Holism: There are qualitative intrinsic physical relations between some physical objects that do not supervene on their qualitative intrinsic physical properties.
Physical property holism entails physical relational holism, but not vice versa. Indeed, physical relational holism seems at first sight too weak to capture any distinctive feature of quantum phenomena: even in classical physics the spatiotemporal relations between physical objects seem not to supervene on their qualitative intrinsic physical properties. But when he introduced relational holism Teller(1987) maintained a view of spacetime as a quantity: On this view spatiotemporal relations do in fact supervene on qualitative intrinsic physical properties of ordinary physical objects, since these include their spatiotemporal properties.

State Nonseparability

Physics treats systems by assigning them states. The thermodynamic state of a gas specifies its pressure, volume and temperature. The state of a system of classical particles is represented in a phase space coordinatized by their positions and momenta, either as a point in that space, or in statistical mechanics by a probability distribution over the space. One expects that if a physical system is composed of physical subsystems, then both the composite system and its subsystems will be assigned states by the relevant physical theory. One further expects that the state of the whole will not be independent of those of its parts, and specifically that if a system is composed of two subsystems, A and B, then it will satisfy a principle formulated by Einstein (1935). Howard (1985, p.180) gives the following translation of this principle, which I will call the
Real State Separability Principle: The real state of the pair AB consists precisely of the real state of A and the real state of B, which states have nothing to do with one another.
But the assignment of states to systems in quantum mechanics seems not to conform to these expectations. Recall that the quantum state of a system gives a specification of its probabilistic dispositions to display various properties on measurement. The mathematical representative of this state is an object defined in a Hilbert space--a kind of vector space. This is somewhat analogous to the representation of the state of a system of particles in classical mechanics in a phase space. Let us formulate a principle of
State Separability: The state assigned to a compound physical system at any time is supervenient on the states then assigned to its component subsystems.
This principle could fail in one of two ways: the subsystems may simply not be assigned any states of their own, or else the states they are assigned may fail to determine the state of the system they compose. Interestingly, state assignments in quantum mechanics have been taken to violate state separability in both ways.

The quantum state of a system may be either pure or mixed. A pure state is represented by a vector in the system's Hilbert space. On one common understanding, any entangled quantum systems violate state separability in so far as the vector representing the state of the system they compose does not factorize into a vector in the Hilbert space of each individual subsystem that could be taken to represent its pure state. Now in such a case each subsystem 1, 2, ... , n may be uniquely assigned a what is called a mixed state (represented in its Hilbert space not by a vector but by a so-called von Neumann density operator). But then state separability fails for a different reason: the subsystem mixed states do not uniquely determine the compound system's state. A failure of state separability may not occasion much surprise if states are thought of merely in their role of specifying probabilistic dispositions. But it becomes more puzzling if a system's quantum state also has a role in specifying certain of its categorical properties. For that role may connect a failure of state nonseparability to metaphysical holism and nonseparability.

Spatial and Spatiotemporal Nonseparability

The idea is familiar (particularly to Lego enthusiasts!) that if one constructs a physical object by assembling its physical parts, then the physical properties of that object are wholly determined by the properties of the parts and the way it is put together from them. A principle of spatial separability tries to capture that idea.
Spatial Separability: The qualitative intrinsic physical properties of a compound system are supervenient on those of its spatially separated component systems together with the spatial relations among these component systems.
If we identify the real state of a system with its qualitative intrinsic physical properties, then spatial separability is related to a separability principle stated by Howard (1985, p. 173) to the effect that any two spatially separated systems possess their own separate real states. It is even more closely related to Einstein's (1935) real state separability principle. Indeed, Einstein formulated this principle in the context of a pair A,B of spatially separated systems.

Spatial nonseparability -- the denial of spatial separability -- is closely related to physical property holism (the denial of physical property determination). For spatial relations are the only clear examples of qualitative intrinsic physical relations required in the supervenience basis of the relata in physical property determination: other intrinsic physical relations seem to supervene on them.

If we take a spacetime perspective, then spatial separability naturally generalizes to

Spatiotemporal Separability: Any physical process occupying spacetime region R supervenes upon an assignment of qualitative intrinsic physical properties at spacetime points in R.
Spatiotemporal separability is a natural restriction to physics of David Lewis's (1986, p. x) principle of Humean supervenience. It is also closely related to another principle formulated by Einstein (1948) in the following words: "An essential aspect of [the] arrangement of things in physics is that they lay claim, at a certain time, to an existence independent of one another, provided these objects ‘are situated in different parts of space’" (the context of the quote suggests that the "space" Einstein had in mind here was actually spacetime).

As Healey (1991, p. 411) shows, spatiotemporal separability entails spatial separability, and so spatial nonseparability entails spatiotemporal nonseparability. Because it is both more general and more consonant with a geometric spacetime viewpoint, it seems reasonable to consider spatiotemporal separability to be the primary notion, so that nonseparability is understood as its denial.

Nonseparability: Some physical process occupying a region R of spacetime is not supervenient upon an assignment of qualitative intrinsic physical properties at spacetime points in R.
It is important to note that nonseparability entails neither physical property holism nor spatial nonseparability: a process may be nonseparable even though it involves objects without proper parts.

Holism and Nonseparability in Classical Physics

Classical physics presents no clear examples of either physical property holism or nonseparability. Since any example of physical property holism would give rise to nonseparability, it suffices to consider only the latter possibility. But the assumption that all physical processes are separable forms part of the metaphysical background to classical physics. In Newtonian spacetime, the kinematical behavior of a system of point particles under the action of finite forces would constitute a separable physical process, since it is supervenient upon ascriptions of particular values of position and momentum to the particles along their trajectories during the collision. This separability extends also to their dynamics if the forces arise from fields defined at each spacetime point.

The boiling of a kettle of water is an example of a more complex separable physical process. It consists in the increased kinetic energy of its constituent molecules permitting each to overcome the short range attractive forces which otherwise hold it in the liquid. It thus supervenes on the assignment, at each spacetime point on the trajectory of each molecule, of intrinsic physical properties to that molecule (such as its kinetic energy), together with intrinsic physical properties representing the magnitude and direction of the fields that give rise to the attractive force acting on that molecule at that point.

As an example of a separable process in Minkowski spacetime [the spacetime framework for Einstein's special theory of relativity], consider the propagation of an electromagnetic wave through empty space. This is supervenient upon an ascription of electric and magnetic field vectors at each point in the spacetime.

Any physical process described fully by a local spacetime theory will be separable. For such a theory proceeds by assigning geometric objects (such as vectors or tensors) to each point in spacetime to represent physical fields, and then requiring that these satisfy certain field equations. But processes described fully by theories of other forms will also be separable. This is true not only of pure field theories, but also of many theories which assign properties to particles at each point on their trajectories. Of familiar classical theories, it is only theories involving direct action between spatially separated particles which involve nonseparability in their description of the dynamical histories of individual particles. But such processes are spatiotemporally separable within spacetime regions that are large enough to include all sources of forces acting on these particles, so that the appearance of nonseparability may be attributed to a mistakenly narrow understanding of the spacetime region these processes actually occupy.

The propagation of gravitational energy according to general relativity apparently involves nonseparable processes, since gravitational energy cannot be localized (it does not contribute to the stress-energy tensor defined at each point of spacetime as do other forms of energy). But even a non-locally-defined gravitational energy will still be supervenient upon the metric tensor defined at each point of the spacetime, and so therefore will be the process of its propagation.

The Quantum Physics of Entangled Systems

A set of entangled quantum systems compose a system whose quantum state is represented quantum mechanically by a tensor-product state-vector which does not factorize into a vector in the Hilbert space of each individual system.
The quantum states of entangled quantum systems violate state separability. This is not surprising if a system's state merely specifies its probabilistic dispositions for the display of various possible properties on measurement. But it has metaphysical significance if a system's quantum state plays a role in specifying it's categorical properties--it's real state, so that the real state separability principle is threatened. His commitment to this principle is one reason why Einstein denied that a quantum system's real state is given by its quantum state (though it's not clear what he thought its real state consisted in).

Modal interpretations of quantum mechanics endorse Einstein's denial. But what a modal interpretation takes to be the real state of an entangled system may still be closely enough related to quantum states that entangled systems' violation of quantum state separability implies some kind of holism or nonseparability. Van Fraassen (1991, p. 294), for example, sees his modal interpretation as committed to "a strange holism" because it entails that a compound system may fail to have a property corresponding to a tensor product projection operator P×I even though its first component has a property corresponding to P. In fact, a clearer case of holism would arise in a modal interpretation that implied that the component lacked P while the compound had P×I: ceteris paribus, that would provide an instance of physical property holism. Other instances of physical property holism arise in the modal interpretation of Healey (1989), whose rules for property attributions permit a compound quantum system to possess holistic properties--dynamical properties that do not supervene on those of their component quantum systems.

Some have located a kind of holism or nonseparability in the probabilities for results of measurements performed on spatially separated entangled systems. Quantum mechanics predicts the probability distributions for combinations of joint and single measurements of variables including spin and polarization on each of a pair of entangled systems, and many of these distributions have been experimentally verified. The joint probability distributions do not factorize into the product of two independent single distributions. If one thinks that quantum mechanics treats each dynamical variable by replacing a precise real value assignment by a probability distribution for the results of measurements of that dynamical variable, then one might see this already as a violation of the real state separability principle. But if one entertains a theory that supplements the quantum state by values of additional "hidden" variables, then the quantum mechanical probabilities would be taken to arise from averaging over many distinct hidden states. In that case, it would rather be the probability distribution conditional on a complete specification of the values of the hidden variables that should be taken to constitute irreducible dispositions of the system concerned. The real state would then include all these conditional probability distributions.

Such reasoning led Howard (1989,1992) to take outcome independence--the probabilistic independence of the outcomes of a given pair of measurements, one on each of a pair of entangled systems, conditional on definite values for any assumed hidden variables on the joint system--as a separability condition. Outcome independence is closely related to parameter independence--the condition that, given a definite hidden variable assignment, the outcome of a measurement on one of a pair of entangled systems is probabilistically independent of what measurement, if any, is made on the other system. Together with parameter independence, outcome independence implies so-called Bell inequalities. These inequalities constrain the patterns of statistical correlations to be expected between the results of measurements of variables including spin and polarization on a pair of entangled systems in any quantum state. They are often said to constrain the predictions of any local hidden variable theory: this is true to the extent that parameter and outcome independence succeed in expressing locality conditions. Quantum mechanics predicts, and experiment confirms, that such Bell inequalities do not always hold. Howard (1989), as well as Teller (1989), suggested that we understand this as stemming from a failure not of parameter independence but of outcome independence, and that this failure is consequently associated with holism or nonseparability. Howard (1989) blames the violation of Bell inequalities on the violation of his separability condition: Teller (1989) takes it to be a manifestation of relational holism. They both acquit parameter independence of blame because they believe that (at least when the measurement events on the entangled systems are spacelike separated) parameter independence (unlike outcome independence) is a consequence of relativity theory.

Others have questioned this line of reasoning, including the conclusion that its appeal to holism or nonseparability helps one to understand how these correlations involving entangled systems come about without any action at a distance that violates either relativity theory or the

Principle of Local Action: If A and B are spatially distant things, then an external influence on A has no immediate effect on B.
Howard's (1989,1992) identification of outcome independence with a separability condition has proved controversial, as has Teller's (1989) claim that violations of Bell inequalities are no longer puzzling if one embraces (physical) relational holism [Laudisa (1995), Berkowitz (1998)]. And the view that violations of outcome independence are perfectly consistent with relativity theory, while violations of parameter independence are not, has also been criticized [Jones and Clifton (1993), Maudlin (1994)].

Healey (1989,1994) has offered a modal interpretation and used it to present a model account of the puzzling correlations which portrays them as resulting from the operation of a process that violates both spatial and spatiotemporal separability. He argues that, on this interpretation, the nonseparability of the process is a consequence of a violation of physical property holism; and that the resulting account yields genuine understanding of how the correlations come about without any violation of relativity theory or the principle of local action. But subsequent work by Clifton and Dickson (1998) has cast doubt on whether the account can be squared with relativity theory's requirement of Lorentz invariance.

Ontological Holism in Quantum Mechanics?

As applied to physics, ontological holism is the thesis that there are physical objects that are not wholly composed of basic physical parts. Views of Bohr, Bohm and others may be interpreted as endorsing some version of this thesis. In no case is it claimed that any physical object has nonphysical parts. The idea is rather that some physical entities that we take to be wholly composed of a particular set of basic physical parts are in fact not so composed.

It was Bohr's (1934) view that one can meaningfully ascribe properties such as position or momentum to a quantum system only in the context of some well-defined experimental arrangement suitable for measuring the corresponding property. He used the expression ‘quantum phenomenon’ to describe what happens in such an arrangement. In his view, then, although a quantum phenomenon is purely physical, it is not composed of distinct happenings involving independently characterizable physical objects--the quantum system on the one hand, and the classical apparatus on the other. And even if the quantum system may be taken to exist outside the context of a quantum phenomenon, little or nothing can then be meaningfully said about its properties. It would therefore be a mistake to consider a quantum object to be an independently existing component part of the apparatus-object whole.

Bohm's (1980,1993) reflections on quantum mechanics lead him to adopt a more general holism. He believed that not just quantum object and apparatus, but any collection of quantum objects by themselves, constitute an indivisible whole. This may be made precise in the context of Bohm's (1952) interpretation of quantum mechanics by noting that a complete specification of the state of the "undivided universe" requires not only a listing of all its constituent particles and their positions, but also of a field associated with the wave-function that guides their trajectories. If one assumes that the basic physical parts of the universe are just the particles it contains, then this establishes ontological holism in the context of Bohm's interpretation.

Some [Howard (1989), Dickson (1998)] have connected the failure of a principle of separability to ontological holism in the context of violations of Bell inequalities. Howard (1989) states the following separability principle (pp. 225-6)

The contents of any two regions of space-time separated by a nonvanishing spatiotemporal interval constitute separable physical systems, in the sense that (1) each possesses its own, distinct physical state, and (2) the joint state of the two systems is wholly determined by these separate states.
He takes Einstein to defend this as a principle of individuation of physical systems, without which physical thought "in the sense familiar to us" would not be possible. Howard himself contemplates the possible failure of this principle for entangled quantum systems, with the consequence that these could no longer be taken to be wholly composed of what are typically regarded as their subsystems. Dickson (1998), on the other hand, argues that such holism is not "a tenable scientific doctrine, much less an explanatory one" (p. 156).

One may try to avoid the conclusion that experimental violations of Bell inequalities manifest a failure of Local Action by invoking ontological holism for events. The idea would be to deny that these experiments involve distinct, spatiotemporally separate, measurement events, and to maintain instead that what we usually describe as separate measurements involving an entangled system in fact constitute one indivisible, spatiotemporally disconnected, event with no spatiotemporal parts. But such ontological holism conflicts with the criteria of individuation of events inherent in both quantum theory and experimental practice.

The Aharonov-Bohm Effect

Aharonov and Bohm (1959) drew attention to the quantum mechanical prediction that an interference pattern due to a beam of charged particles could be produced or altered by the presence of a constant magnetic field in a region from which the particles were excluded. This effect has since been experimentally demonstrated. At first sight, the Aharonov-Bohm effect seems to involve action at a distance. It seems clear that the (electro-)magnetic field acts on the particles since it affects the interference pattern they produce; and this must be action at a distance since the particles pass through a region from which that field is absent. But alternative accounts of the phenomenon are possible which portray it rather as a manifestation of nonseparability [Healey (1997)]. There need be no action at a distance if the behavior both of the charged particles and of electromagnetism are nonseparable processes. While such a treatment of electromagnetism (and other gauge theories) is increasingly common in physics, to treat the motion of the charged particles as a nonseparable process is to endorse a particular position on how quantum mechanics is to be interpreted.

An interpretation of quantum mechanics that ascribes a nonlocalized position to a charged particle on its way through the apparatus is committed to a violation of spatiotemporal separability in the Aharonov-Bohm effect, since the particle's passage constitutes a nonseparable process. To see why the electromagnetism that acts on the particles during their passage may also be taken to be nonseparable it is necessary to consider contemporary representations of electromagnetism in terms of neither fields nor potentials.

Following Wu and Yang's (1975) analysis of the Aharonov-Bohm effect, it has become common to consider electromagnetism to be completely and nonredundantly described neither by the electromagnetic field, nor by its generating potential, but rather by the so-called Dirac phase factor:

where Aµ is the electromagnetic potential at spacetime point xµ, e is the particles' charge, and the integral is taken over each closed loop C in spacetime. Applied to the Aharonov-Bohm case, this means that the constant magnetic field is accompanied by an association of a phase factor S(C) with all closed curves C in space, where S(C) is defined by
This approach has the advantage that since S(C) is gauge-invariant, it may readily be considered a physically real quantity. Moreover, the effects of electromagnetism in the field-free region may be attributed to the fact that S(C) is nonvanishing for certain closed curves C within that region. But it is significant that, unlike the magnetic field and its potential, S(C) is not defined at each point of space at each moment of time.

Can S(C) at some time be taken to represent an intrinsic property of a region of space corresponding to the curve C? There are two difficulties with this suggestion. The first is that the presence of the quantity e in the definition of S(C) appears to indicate that S(C) rather codes the effect of electromagnetism on objects with that specific charge. If in fact all charges are multiples of some minimal value e, then this would no longer be a problem: the fact that S(C) at some time represents an intrinsic property of a region of space corresponding to the curve C would be a natural reflection of this fact. If not, one could rather take

to be an intrinsic property of C. The second difficulty is that closed curves do not correspond uniquely to regions of space: e.g. circling the region in which there is a magnetic field twice on the same circle will produce a different curve from circling it once. But this does not prevent one from taking S(C) at some time to represent an intrinsic property of the region of space occupied by a nonself-intersecting closed curve C.

Once these difficulties have been handled, it is indeed possible to consider electromagnetism in the Aharonov-Bohm effect as faithfully represented at a time by a set of intrinsic properties of regions of space occupied by nonself-intersecting closed curves. But if one does so, then electromagnetism itself manifests nonseparability. For these intrinsic properties do not supervene on any assignment of qualitative intrinsic physical properties at spacetime points in the region concerned. Whether the magnetic field remains constant or changes, the associated electromagnetism constitutes a nonseparable process, and so the Aharonov-Bohm effect violates spatiotemporal separability. If the motion of the particles through the apparatus is a nonseparable process, then it is possible to account for the AB effect in terms of a purely local interaction between (nonseparable) electromagnetism and this process. For the particles effectively traverse closed curves C on their nonlocalized "trajectories", and so they interact with electromagnetism precisely where this is defined.

Even if the Aharonov-Bohm effect does exhibit such nonseparability, there is no violation of physical property holism (or, indeed, spatial separability). This makes it clear by example that holism and nonseparability are indeed distinct, though related, notions.

Quantum Field Theory

Certain phenomena that arise within quantum field theory have been taken as instances of nonseparability. As in the Aharonov-Bohm effect, this seems not to result from either physical property holism or a violation of spatial separability.

It is well known that even in the vacuum state, quantum field theory predicts statistical correlations between the results of measurements even if these occur in regions that cannot be connected by a light signal. At least in certain special cases, these correlations imply violations of Bell inequalities. No compound systems like photon pairs are involved, so it is hard to see how this can be explained by appeal to physical property holism or spatial nonseparability (though one might argue that in this context spacetime regions constitute the relevant quantum systems, with the subsystem relation corresponding to containment). But it is not unreasonable to suggest that the correlations reflect some failure of spatiotemporal separability. Whether this is true or not depends on whether it is possible to understand the results of simultaneous measurements in quantum field theory as reflecting some intrinsic physical property associated with the disconnected spacetime region occupied by the measurement events.

Wayne (1998) has suggested that quantum field theory is best interpreted as postulating extensive holism or nonseparability. On this interpretation, the fundamental quantities in quantum field theory are vacuum expectation values of products of field operators defined at various spacetime points. The field can be reconstructed out of all of these. Nonseparability supposedly arises because the vacuum expectation value of a product of field operators defined at an n-tuple of distinct spacetime points does not supervene on qualitative intrinsic physical properties defined at those n points, together with the spatiotemporal relations among the points.

But it is not clear that vacuum expectation values of products of field operators defined at n-tuples of distinct spacetime points represent either qualitative intrinsic physical properties of these n-tuples or physical relations between them. Evaluation of the extent to which quantum field theory illustrates holism or nonseparability must await further progress in the interpretation of quantum field theory. (Redhead(1995) represents a relevant first step.)

String Theory

At the turn of the 21st century, string theory (or its descendant, M-theory) has emerged as a speculative candidate for unifying much of fundamental physics, including quantum mechanics and general relativity. Existing string theories proceed by quantizing classical theories of basic entities that are extended in one or more dimensions of a space that has 6 or 7 tiny compact dimensions in addition to the three spatial dimensions of ordinary geometry. If these additional dimensions are appropriately considered spatial, then it is natural to extend the concepts of spatial and spatiotemporal separability to encompass them. In that case, processes involving classical strings (or p-branes with p > 0) would count as (spatiotemporally) nonseparable, even though all particles and their properties conform to spatial separability.

The status of nonseparability within a quantized string field theory is not so easy to assess, because of the general problems associated with deciding what the ontology of any relativistic quantum field theory should be taken to be.


Other Internet Resources

Two sites with some relevance are:

Related Entries

action at a distance | Bell’s Theorem | Einstein, Albert: Einstein-Bohr debates | physics: Reichenbach’s common cause principle | quantum mechanics: modal interpretations of | quantum theory: quantum entanglement and information

Copyright © 1999 by
Richard Healey

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First published: July 22, 1999
Content last modified: July 22, 1999