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Original Position

The idea of the original position is perhaps the most lasting contribution of John Rawls to our theorizing about social justice. The original position is a hypothetical situation in which rational calculators, acting as agents or trustees for the interests of concrete individuals, are pictured as choosing those principles of social relations under which their principals would do best. Their choices are subject to certain constraints, however, and it is these constraints which embody the specifically moral elements of original position argumentation. Crudely, the rational calculators do not know facts about their principals which would be morally irrelevant to the choice of principles of justice. This restriction on their reasoning is embodied, picturesquely, in Rawls's so-called veil of ignorance, which occludes information, for instance, about principals' age, sex, religious beliefs, etc. Once this information about principals is unavailable to their agents, the plurality of interested parties disappears, and the problem of choice is rendered determinate. According to Rawls, agents so situated would choose two principles of justice, lexically ordered, affirming the equality of basic rights and an approach to social inequalities governed by the ‘difference principle’, according to which inequalities are unjust unless removing them would worsen the situations of the worst-off members of society. Original position argumentation is an example of contemporary contractarianism, involves a pure-proceduralist approach to the determination of moral principles, and is framed by reflective equilibration with widely agreed principles of public morality.

Reflective Equilibrium

There are epistemological and political interpretations of the original position.

On the epistemological reading, the original position is a methodological device for ridding the ethico-political ‘observer’ of hindrances to h/er clear and distinct perception of ethico-political facts. Just as it may be necessary to employ prosthetic sensory devices to make observations of distant or minute objects or to use techniques of controlled experimentation to eliminate the influence of ‘noise’ and theoretically irrelevant confounding variables, so too, on this reading, might it be necessary, in order clearly to observe the ethico-political facts, to use some such device as the original position. Indeed, the original position might be well adapted to such a task. Eliminating knowledge of personal characteristics eliminates the possibility of bias in favor of those characteristics and thus enforces the kind of impartiality or disinterestedness that is held to be integral to a moral perspective. (In this regard, as Rawls himself recognizes, the original position device resembles that of ideal spectator theorists.)

This epistemological reading is nevertheless not the interpretation of the original position favored by Rawls himself. Although he has not repudiated the kind of ethico-political ‘realism’ that is presupposed by this reading, he believes that, since ‘realism’ in this sense is a reasonably disputed doctrine, a practical approach to the task of ethico-political justification must ‘prescind’ from the realism/non-realism debate within ethico-political meta-theory. Since there is reasonable disagreement about realism, we cannot presuppose it in the context of public political disputation. (On account of the ‘burdens of judgment’, we cannot expect to resolve the debate about realism to the (reasonable) satisfaction of every reasonable person; this doctrine therefore cannot provide a basis for political theorizing.)

On the political reading, the original position is a ‘device of representation’. Specifically, it represents, in the veil of ignorance, widely accepted principles for the choice of principles of justice. More concretely, the veil of ignorance embodies the concept of justice--i.e. the idea that distributions should not be based on morally irrelevant features. The information occluded by the veil of ignorance is, precisely, the community's understanding of what features are morally irrelevant to the choice of principles of justice. Although members of a given community may disagree about many matters relevant to issues of justice, they share--or are alleged or assumed to share--an understanding of justice that, while insufficiently concrete or detailed to provide on its own a workable conception of justice, is adequate to the task of framing the choice of such a conception. Working within the framework defined by the veil of ignorance and derived from this widely shared concept of justice, rational calculators choose principles of justice on the basis of their fiduciary duty to the concrete individuals whom they represent. Their choice is not of an ‘objectively correct’ conception of justice; it is, rather, of that conception which best expresses a shared understanding of justice in the community whose members they represent.

Rawls's idea of reflective equilibrium expresses this political understanding of justification. How are we to justify the claim that some particular conception of justice is the appropriate one? We are to do so, according to Rawls, by finding that conception which can be brought into reflective equilibrium with the considered judgments of justice which are current in a particular community. Of course, the process of reflective equilibration is dialectical. The main moments of the process are these.

These operations are repeated until eliminable divergence is at a minimum; this is the state of reflective equilibrium. Individuals' concrete and specific judgments about justice are in equilibrium with those of other individuals, and all individuals in the community share both an abstract concept of justice (embodied in the veil) and a workable public conception of justice.

Early discussants assumed that the method of reflective equilibration was to be understood epistemologically. Even in A Theory of Justice, there was much textual support for the alternative political reading, but, whatever the situation in the early 1970s, it soon became clear that Rawls's preferred reading was indeed the political one. There are two stories about the development of Rawls's thinking. On the one hand, some commentators believe that Rawls had adopted an epistemological, specifically Kantian, approach to ethico-political justification in his earlier work, at least up to A Theory of Justice, which he then abandoned under the pressure of communitarian, specifically Hegelian, criticism at the hands, in particular, of Michael Sandel. On the other hand, some commentators believe that Rawls's position, at least since A Theory of Justice, has remained resolutely political, and that any genuine development of his thought has been prompted by considerations internal to his own perspective. (Rawls seems, in Political Liberalism, to endorse this latter reading of the history.)

For the mature Rawls (and perhaps too for the Rawls of A Theory of Justice), all ethico-political justification, in public contexts, is unavoidably politically rather than epistemologically based. It is based, in other words, on a convergence--or as Rawls calls it, an overlapping consensus of the main substantive ethico-political doctrines current in a community. Absent such a basis for convergence, there is no possibility of discovering, via reflective equilibration, principles of justice which can effectively regulate interactions between and distributions to the members of the community. And since such disagreement would make improbable any uncoerced acceptance of some epistemologically sanctioned set of principles, no voluntaristic basis for social justice could be found in this community--even if an ‘objective’ basis could be.

Pure Proceduralism

The method of original position argumentation is an example of pure proceduralism in ethico-political theorizing. This aspect of Rawls's work seems not to have been adequately conceptualized, but it is crucial for understanding larger issues.

Imagine that there is for a particular community a public conception of the good. In this case, it might be possible to develop rules for the distribution of goods and services on a broadly teleological basis. That is right (whether action or distribution or institution) whose implementation maximizes the realization of the good. Of course, the availability of a public conception of the good is not, perhaps, a sufficient condition for the viability of such a teleological approach. Even given such a conception, a teleological approach may still be insufficiently sensitive to distributional issues. And, indeed, this is one reason why Rawls rejects a teleological approach to ethico-political justification. But Rawls also argues on other grounds against a teleological approach. In particular, he thinks that no such approach is viable (i) because the availability of a public conception of the good is a necessary condition for the viability of such an approach, and (ii) because there is no such public conception of the good in our society and in societies like it.

If we cannot develop ethico-political principles of right and justice on a teleological basis, then how can we do so? According to Rawls, we can do so via original position argumentation, framed with considerations of reflective equilibrium. That is right and just which would be acknowledged as such from the point of view of the original position. And what makes being acknowledged from this point of view the ‘right-maker’ for principles of justice? Because this point of view is the appropriate one for determining principles of justice, on account of its reflecting the community's existing concept of justice--on account of its reflecting their overlapping consensus of views about justice.

Notice that there is no teleological reasoning at work here. The right-maker for principles of justice is not defined in terms of the consequences for the realization of the good of conformity with those principles. The right-maker is (hypothetical) acceptance from a particular point of view. The right-maker for principles, in other words, is their being the ‘output’ of a particular procedure, in particular the procedure of original position argumentation. The reasoners in the original position are not trying, through their deliberations, to ensure an outcome that meets some already existing standard of justice for institutions. Why not? Because there is no such standard until it is constructed by their deliberation. And there is no such standard because there is pre-existing consensus within the community on neither a conception of the good--which, were it to exist, might permit a perfectly or imperfectly procedural approach to determining the principles of right, nor a full-blown conception of justice--which, were it to exist, would render any further reasoning otiose.

Veil of Ignorance

Far and away the most striking feature of Rawls's original position idea is the veil of ignorance. As Rawls points out, the idea of an initial situation of choice for ethico-political principles is common to other approaches, and represents a hypotheticalization of familiar reasoning within the social contract tradition. What is particularly interesting about Rawls's approach is that he proposes to restrict the basis for reasoning rather than expanding it, which is, for instance, the approach taken within the ideal spectator framework.

Crudely, ideal-spectator theorists make two theoretical ‘moves’ which Rawls more or less reverses. Recognizing that ethico-political thinking ought to be conducted from an impartial perspective, ideal-spectator theorists capture this notion of impartiality by amalgamating ethically-relevant information about all relevant parties--e.g. all the members of some community, and by assuming that the spectator in whom this information is lodged makes h/er determination of principles on an equitable basis--e.g. in assigning equal weights to information about the preferences of individuals. There are various reasons for wondering whether this procedure is really a coherent one. Most notably, assumptions about the spectator's ability to store and synthesize information and calculate on its basis are wildly unrealistic. (See Cherniak 1986.) Furthermore, the spectator's calculations not only permit, they force h/er to reckon inter-personal gains and losses in the same way that a purely prudential self-interested reasoner would reckon intra-personal gains and losses. This is problematic for two reasons, one of which Rawls himself emphasizes. First of all, and this is Rawls's primary objection, such a procedure forces the spectator to sacrifice one individual's interests to those of others, theoretically without limit, whenever doing so would result in the maximization of the total the spectator is calculating. Secondly, the idea is suspect, to say the least, that there is some basis for the commensuration of individuals' diverse ways of valuing that would permit the determination of some socially valid aggregate for each of the various states of affairs which are being evaluated.

Crudely, Rawls hopes to avoid these difficulties by reversing the ‘moves’ of the spectator theorist. Instead of augmenting the information available to choosers, Rawls deliberately impoverishes it. Instead of requiring choosers to be impartial, he requires them to be purely self-interested--though, of course, in an extended sense; his choosers act to advance the interests of their principals. And by requiring unanimity among the various trustees or agents, Rawls ensures that individuals' interests are not sacrificed to that of ‘the collective’; each individual can veto, through h/er agent/trustee, any social settlement that isn't adequately respectful of h/er individuality. The veil of ignorance is of importance in this context. It ensures impartiality, despite the self-interestedness of the choosers, by preventing them, through lack of knowledge, from choosing in accordance with partial perspectives that might be favored by their principals. My agent A cannot hold out for some social settlement that favors people with those characteristics; s/he doesn't know what they are. S/he will therefore have to protect my interests, as s/he must as their trustee, only by holding out for a social settlement in which no one's interests are given short shrift. H/er impartiality is a product of h/er self-interestedness plus h/er ignorance. And the latter, crucial to this procedure, is a product of the veil of ignorance.

This account of matters also enables us to clear up a confusion that was often voiced in the first few years after the publication of A Theory of Justice. It was said that Rawls had sought--as others such as David Gauthier do seek--to reduce ethico-political principles of right to principles of prudence. This on account of the purely self-interested deliberations of choosers in the original position. What this suggestion ignores is that, though the choosers reason in a purely prudential way, their reasoning is constrained by their ignorance, and their ignorance is expressive of the moral demand for impartiality.


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Copyright © 1996, 1997by
Fred D'Agostino

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First published: February 27, 1996
Content last modified: July 28, 1997