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Notes to Indispensability Arguments in the Philosophy of Mathematics

2. Most scientific realists accept inference to the best explanation. Indeed, it might be said that inference to the best explanation is the cornerstone of scientific realism. But, as we saw in note 1, inference to the best explanation may be seen as a kind of indispensability argument, so any realist who accepts the former while rejecting the latter is in a somewhat delicate position.

3. This theorem states
that relative to a partition of the vocabulary of an axiomatizable
theory *T* into two classes, *t* and *o* (theoretical
and observational, say) there exists an axiomatizable theory *T**
in the language whose only non-logical vocabulary is *o,* of all
and only the consequences of *T* that are expressible in *o*
alone. If the vocabulary of the theory can be partitioned in the way
that Craig's theorem requires, then the theory can be reaxiomatized so
that apparent reference to any given theoretical entity is
eliminated. See Field (1980, p. 8) for further details.

4. It turns out that the details of the formulation of naturalism are crucial to the argument. See Maddy (1998) for a slightly different formulation that doesn't support the conclusion of the Quine-Putnam argument.

5. The issue of how likely modern theories such as general relativity and quantum mechanics are to yield to nominalisation is a very interesting and controversial matter. David Malament (1982) argues that quantum mechanics, for one, is likely to resist nominalisation because of the central role infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces play in the theory. Mark Balaguer (1996a; 1998), however, suggests a way of nominalising the Hilbert spaces in question.

6. For example, the
continuum hypothesis is the assertion that the cardinality of the real
numbers is the first non-denumerable cardinal. It turns out that
neither this hypothesis nor its negation is provable from the ZFC
axioms; the question of the size of the continuum is
*independent* of ZFC.

7. It is tempting to formulate Maddy's third objection as follows:

Naturalism endorses actual mathematical practice. This practice typically does not rely on extra-mathematical canons of justification. So it seems that naturalism endorses belief in some mathematical theories with or without finding physical applications for them. Presumably this belief carries with it certain ontological commitments. So it seems that we ought to have ontological commitment to at least some entities that are not indispensable to our best (empirical) theories. Thus it might be argued that a thoroughgoing naturalist is not committed toThis, however, I think is to misrepresent Maddy's argument. For starters, the indispensability argument can be made to work with P1 reading: ‘We ought to have ontological commitment to all the entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories’. That is, the ‘only’ part argued against in the above formulation of Maddy's objection is unnecessary. More importantly, I think that Maddy's objection is subtler than this formulation. The objection is directed at the motivation for P1 - not at P1 itself. Her aim is to show that confirmational holism ought to be rejected. This would rob P1 of much of its plausibility, as we shall see in the discussion following that dealing with Sober's objection.onlythe entities of our best scientific theories and thus is not committed to P1.

8. For example,
‘There is a city larger than Hobart’ and ‘There is a
natural number larger than 100’ are true just in case there
exist objects in the respective domains of quantification with the
properties of being larger than Hobart and being larger than the
natural number 100 respectively. Such a strategy is not open to
anyone who holds that (i) both these sentences are true, (ii) numbers
do not exist and (iii) cities do exist. Most nominalists thus find
themselves unable to employ such a semantics. Field is a notable
exception here (Field, 1980; 1989); he denies that sentences such as
‘There is a natural number larger than 100’ are true. He
claims that they are *true-in-the-story-of-mathematics* but
that this is not true *simpliciter*. He thus avoids the
difficult problem of providing a nominalisticlly acceptable account
of the truth of such sentences. (He does, however, have a residual
worry. According to Field, sentences such as ‘In Peano number
theory there is a number larger than 100’ *are* true
*simpliciter*, but it's not clear that he has a
fully-developed semantics for these.)

9. I'd like to thank Helen
Regan, Angela Rosier and Ed Zalta for comments on earlier versions of
this entry.

Mark Colyvan

*First published: December 21, 1998 *

*Content last modified: February 5, 1999*