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In 1926, Mally presented the first formal system of deontic logic. His system had several consequences which Mally regarded as surprising but defensible. It also had a consequence ("A is obligatory if and only if A is the case") which Menger (1939) and almost all later deontic logicians have regarded as unacceptable. We will not only describe Mally's system but also discuss how it may be repaired.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Mally's Formal Language
- 3. Mally's Axioms
- 4. Mally's Theorems
- 5. Surprising Consequences
- 6. Menger's Criticism
- 7. Where Did Mally Go Wrong?
- 8. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases
- 9. Alternative Deontic Principles
- 10. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

In 1926, the Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879-1944) proposed
the first formal system of deontic logic. In the book in which he
presented this system, *The Basic Laws of Ought: Elements of the
Logic of Willing*, Mally gave the following motivation for his
enterprise:

In 1919, everybody was using the word self-determination. I wanted to obtain a clear understanding of this word. But then, of course, I immediately stumbled on the difficulties and obscurities surrounding the concept of Ought, and the problem changed. The concept of Ought is the basic concept of the whole of ethics. It can only serve as a usable foundation for ethics when it is captured in a system of axioms. In the following I will present such an axiomatic system.^{[1]}

As Mally's words indicate, he was not primarily interested in
deontic logic for its own sake: he mainly wanted to lay the
foundation of "an exact system of pure ethics" (*eine exakte reine
Ethik*). More than half of his book is devoted to the development
of this exact system of ethics. In the following, we will, however,
concentrate on the formal part of his book, both because it is its
"hard core" and because it is the part that has attracted the most
interest.

Mally based his formal system on the classical propositional
calculus as formulated in Whitehead's and Russell's
*Principia Mathematica* (vol. 1, 1910).

The non-deontic part of Mally's system had the following
vocabulary: the sentential letters A, B, C, P and Q (these symbols
refer to states of affairs), the sentential variables M and N, the
sentential constants V (the *Verum*, Truth) and
(the *Falsum*, Falsity), the propositional quantifiers
and
, and the connectives
, & ,
,
and
.
is defined by
=
V.

The deontic part of Mally's vocabulary consisted of the unary connective !, the binary connectives f and , and the sentential constants U and .

- Mally read !A as "A ought to be the case" (
*A soll sein*) or as "let A be the case" (*es sei A*). - He read A f B as "A requires B" (
*A fordert B*). - He read A B as "A and B require each other."
- He read U as "the unconditionally obligatory" (
*das unbedingt Geforderte*). - He read
as "the unconditionally forbidden" (
*das unbedingt Verbotene*).

f, and are defined by:

Def. f . A f B = A !B (Mally 1926, p. 12) Def. . A B = (A f B) & (B f A) Def. . = U

Mally did not only read !A as "it ought to be the case that A."
Because a person's willing that a given state of affairs A be
the case is often expressed by sentences of the form "A ought to be
the case" (for example, someone might say "it ought to be the case
that I am rich and famous" to indicate that she wants to be rich and
famous), he also read !A as "A is desirable" or "I want it to be the
case that A." As a result, his formal system was as much a theory
about *Wollen* (willing) as a theory about *Sollen*
(ought to be the case). This explains the subtitle of his book. In
modern deontic logic, the basic deontic connective O is seldom read
in this way.

We have just described one respect in which Mally's deontic logic was different from more modern proposals. There are two other conspicuous differences:

- Mally was only interested in the deontic status of states of
affairs; he paid no special attention to the deontic status of
actions. Thus, his
*Deontik*was a theory about*Seinsollen*(what ought to be the case) rather than*Tunsollen*(what ought to be done). Modern authors often regard the concept of*Tunsollen*as fundamental. - In modern deontic logic, the notions of prohibition F, permission P and waiver W are usually defined in terms of obligation O: FA = OA, PA = FA, WA = OA. Such definitions are not to be found in Mally's book.

Mally adopted the following informal deontic principles (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

(i) If A requires B and if B then C, then A requires C. (ii) If A requires B and if A requires C, then A requires B and C. (iii) A requires B if and only if it is obligatory that if A then B. (iv) The unconditionally obligatory is obligatory. (v) The unconditionally obligatory does not require its own negation.

Mally did not offer much support for these principles. They simply seemed intuitively plausible to him.

Mally formalized his principles as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

I. ((A f B) & (B C)) (A f C) II. ((A f B) & (A f C)) (A f (B & C)) III. (A f B) !(A B) IV. U !U V. (U f )

Axiom IV is strange:

- !U is a more natural formalization of (iv).
- Axiom IV seems redundant: !A !A is a tautology, so we have !A f A by Def. f, whence !(!A A) by Axiom III(), whence M !M by existential generalization. Axiom IV seems to add nothing to this.
- Axiom IV is the only axiom or theorem mentioned by Mally in which U occurs as a bound variable: in Axiom V and in theorems (15)-(17), (20)-(21), (23), (23) and (27)-(35) (to be displayed below), U is either a constant or a free variable. One should treat it in the same way in the formalization of (iv).

For these reasons, we replace Axiom IV by the following
axiom:^{[2]}

Mally could hardly have objected to this version of Axiom IV because it is equivalent with his theorem (23), i.e., V f U, in virtue of Def. f. In the following "Axiom IV" will always refer to our version of Axiom IV rather than Mally's.

IV. !U

Using Def. f, Axioms I-V may also be written as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19 and p. 24):

I. ((A !B) & (B C)) (A !C) II. ((A !B) & (A !C)) (A !(B & C)) III. (A !B) !(A B) IV. V f U V. (U !)

Mally derived the following theorems from his axioms
(Mally 1926, pp. 20-34).^{[3]}

(1) (A f B) (A f V) (2) (A f ) M (A f M) (3) ((M f A) (M f B)) (M f (A B)) (4) ((M f A) & (N f B)) ((M & N) f (A & B)) (5) !P M (M f P) (6) (!P & (P Q)) !Q (7) !P !V (8) ((A f B) & (B f C)) (A f C) (9) (!P & (P f Q)) !Q (10) (!A & !B) !(A & B) (11) (A B) !(A B) (12) (A f B) (A !B) !(A B) !(A & B) !(A B) (13) (A !B) (A & !B) (A !B) (14) (A f B) (B f A) (15) M (M f U) (16) (U A) !A (17) (U f A) !A (18) !!A !A (19) !!A !A (20) (U f A) (A U) (21) !A (A U) (22) !V (23) V U (23) V f U (24) A f A (25) (A B) (A f B) (26) (A B) (A B) (27) M ( f M) (28) f (29) f U (30) f (31) (32) (U f ) (33) (U ) (34) U V (35)

Mally called theorems (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)-(35) "surprising"
(*befremdlich*) or even "paradoxical" (*paradox*). He
viewed (34) and (35) as the most surprising of his surprising
theorems. But Mally's reasons for calling these theorems
surprising are puzzling if not confused.

Consider, for example, theorem (1). Mally interpreted this theorem
as follows: "if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the
case" (Mally 1926, p. 20). He regarded this as a surprising
claim, and we agree. However, Mally's interpretation of (1) is
not warranted. (1) only says that if A requires B, then A requires
the *Verum*. The expression "if A requires B, then A requires
everything that is the case" is to be formalized as

This formula is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I. In other words, Mally should have reasoned as follows: (1) is surprising; but (1) is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I; Axiom 1 is uncontroversial; so (1) is to be regarded as surprising.

(1) (A f B) (C (A f C))

A similar pattern is to be seen in many of Mally's other remarks about theorems which surprised him. He generally read too much into them and confused them with some of the consequences they had in his system:

- Mally was surprised by (2) because he thought that it says that if A requires B and B is not the case, then A requires every state of affairs whatsoever (Mally 1926, p. 21). But (2) says no such thing. Mally's paraphrase is a paraphrase of (A f B) (B (A f C)) (a consequence of (2) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (2).
- Mally paraphrased (7) as "if anything is required, then everything that is the case is required" (Mally 1926, p. 28), which is indeed surprising. However, Mally's paraphrase corresponds with !A (B !B) (a consequence of (7) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (7).
- Mally paraphrased (22) as "the facts ought to be the case" (Mally 1926, p. 24). We grant that this is a surprising claim. But the corresponding formula in Mally's language is A !A (a consequence of (22) in virtue of Axiom I), not (22).
- Mally read (27) as "if something which ought not to be the case is the case, then anything whatsoever ought to be the case" (Mally 1926, pp. 24, 33), but this is a paraphrase of !A (A !B) (a theorem of Mally's system) rather than (27).
- Mally paraphrased (33) as "what is not the case is not obligatory" (Mally 1926, p. 25) and as "everything that is obligatory is the case" (Mally 1926, p. 34). These assertions are indeed surprising, but Mally's readings of (33) are not warranted. They are paraphrases of !A A rather than (33).
- Mally made the following remark about (34) and (35):
The latter sentences, which seem to identify being obligatory with being the case, are surely the most surprising of our "surprising consequences."

^{[4]}However, (34) and (35) do not assert that being obligatory is equivalent with being the case, for the latter statement should be formalized as A !A. The latter formula is a theorem of Mally's system, as will be shown in a moment, but it is not to be found in Mally's book.

Mally regarded theorems (28)-(32) as surprising because of their relationships with certain other surprising theorems:

- (28)-(30) are instantiations of (27). But this is not sufficient to call these theorems surprising. Mally actually viewed (28) as less surprising than (27): one might use it to justify retaliation and revenge (Mally 1926, p. 24).
- (31) implies (28)-(30) and is therefore at least as surprising as those theorems.
- Mally viewed (32) as surprising because the surprising theorem (33) is an immediate consequence of (32) and the apparently non-surprising theorem (25).

Mally's list of surprising theorems seems too short: for example, (24) is equivalent with A !A in virtue of Def. f. But A !A may be paraphrased as "the facts ought to be the case," an assertion which Mally regarded as surprising (Mally 1926, p. 24). So then why didn't he call (24) surprising? Did it not surprise him after (22)?

Even though Mally regarded many of his theorems as surprising, he
thought that he had discovered an interesting concept of "correct
willing" (*richtiges Wollen*) or "willing in accordance with
the facts" which should not be confused with the notions of
obligation and willing used in ordinary discourse. Mally's
"exact system of pure ethics" was mainly concerned with this concept,
but we will not describe this system because it belongs to the field
of ethics rather than deontic logic.

In 1939, Karl Menger published a devastating critique of Mally's formal system. He first pointed out that A !A is a theorem of this system. In other words, if A is the case, then A is obligatory, and if A ought to be the case then A is indeed the case. As we have already noted in connection with theorems (34) and (35), Mally made the same claim in informal terms, but the formula A !A does not occur in his book.

Menger's theorem A
!A
may be proven as follows (Menger's proof was different;
**PC** denotes the propositional calculus).

First, A !A is a theorem:

1. A ((!B !B) & (B A)) [ PC]^{[5]}2. ((!B !B) & (B A)) (!B !A) [ I ] 3. A (!B !A) [ 1, 2, PC]4. !B (A !A) [ 3, PC]5a. !U [ Ax. IV ] 5b. !(!A A) [ III(), PC]6. A !A [ 4, either 5a or 5b, PC]

Second, !A A is a theorem:

1. ((U !A) & (A )) (U !) [ I ] 2. ((U !A) & (A )) [ 1, V, PC]3. ((U !A) & (A )) (!A A) [ PC]^{[6]}4. !A A [ 2, 3, PC]

Because A !A and !A A are theorems, A !A is a theorem as well.

Menger gave the following comment:

This result seems to me to be detrimental for Mally's theory, however. It indicates that the introduction of the sign ! is superfluous in the sense that it may be cancelled or inserted in any formula at any place we please. But this result (in spite of Mally's philosophical justification) clearly contradicts not only our use of the word "ought" but also some of Mally's own correct remarks about this concept, e.g. the one at the beginning of his development to the effect that p (!q or !r) and p !(q or r) are not equivalent. Mally is quite right that these two propositions are not equivalent according to the ordinary use of the word "ought." But they are equivalent according to his theory by virtue of the equivalence of p and !p (Menger 1939, p. 58).

Almost all deontic logicians have accepted Menger's verdict. After 1939, Mally's deontic system has seldom been taken seriously.

Where did Mally go wrong? How could one construct a system of deontic logic which does more justice to the notion of obligation used in ordinary discourse? Three types of answers are possible:

- Mally should not have added his deontic axioms to classical propositional logic;
- Some of his deontic principles should be modified; and
- Both of the above. Menger advocated the latter view: "One of the reasons for the failure of Mally's interesting attempt is that it was founded on the 2-valued calculus of propositions" (Menger 1939, p. 59).

We will only explore the first two suggestions. Each of them will turn out to be sufficient, so the third proposal is overkill.

We will first show that if Mally's deontic principles are added to a system in which the so-called paradoxes of material and strict implication are avoided, many of the "surprising" theorems (such as (34) and (35)) are no longer derivable and A !A is no longer derivable either. But most of the theorems which Mally regarded as "plausible" are still derivable. The resulting system is closely related to Anderson's relevant deontic logic (1967).

After this, we will show that one might also modify some of the specifically deontic principles: Def. f and Axiom I may be modified in such a way that the resulting system is almost identical with the system nowadays known as standard deontic logic. The resulting system agrees less well with Mally's deontic expectations (as revealed by his expressions of surprise) than the first one does, but it is adequate in the sense that (34), (35) and A !A are no longer derivable.

Mally's informal postulates (i)-(iii) and (v) are conditionals
or negations of conditionals, i.e., of the form "if ... then --" or
"not: if ... then --." Føllesdal and Hilpinen (1981,
pp. 5-6) have suggested that such conditionals should not be
formalized in terms of material implication and that some sort of
strict implication would be more appropriate. But this suggestion is
not altogether satisfactory, for if
I and
III
are added to the rather weak system of strict implication **S3**
(with
as the symbol of strict implication), then the undesirable theorem A
!A
is again derivable.^{[7]}

In systems of strict implication the so-called paradoxes of material
implication (such as A
(B
A))
are avoided, but the so-called paradoxes of strict implication
(such as (A &
A)
B) remain.
What would happen to Mally's system if *both* kinds of
paradoxes were avoided? This question can be answered by adding
Mally's axioms to a system in which none of the so-called
"fallacies of relevance" can be derived (see the entry on
relevance logic).

In the following, we will add Mally's axioms to the most
popular system of this type, relevant system **R**. The result is
better than in the case of **S3**: most of the theorems which
Mally regarded as surprising are no longer derivable, and
Menger's theorem A
!A
is not derivable either. But many "plausible" theorems can still be
derived.

Relevant system **R** with the propositional constant t ("the
conjunction of all truths") has the following axioms and rules
(Anderson & Belnap 1975, ch. V;
is defined by A
B = (A
B) & (B
A)):

Self-implication. A A Prefixing. (A B) ((C A) (C B)) Contraction. (A (A B)) (A B) Permutation. (A (B C)) (B (A C)) & Elimination. (A & B) A, (A & B) B & Introduction. ((A B) & (A C)) (A (B & C)) Introduction. A (A B), B (A B) Elimination. ((A C) & (B C)) ((A B) C) Distribution. (A & (B C)) ((A & B) C) Double Negation. A A Contraposition. (A B) (B A) Ax. t. A (t A) Modus Ponens. A, A B / B Adjunction. A, B / A & B

A relevant version **RD** of Mally's deontic system may be
defined as follows:

- The language is the same as the language of
**R**, except that we write V instead of t, add the propositional constant U and the unary connective !, and define , , f and as in Mally's system. - Axiomatization: add Mally's Axioms I-V to the axioms
and rules of
**R**.

**RD** has the following properties.

- Axioms I, II and III may be replaced by the following three
simpler
axioms:
^{[8]}I*. (A B) (!A !B) II*. (!A & !B) !(A & B) III*. !(!A A) - Formulas
I-V,
(3), (4), (6), (8)-(11), (14), (16)-(18),
(23)
and (30) are theorems of
**RD**.^{[9]} - Formulas (1), (2), (5), (7), (12), (13), (15), (19)-(23), (24)-(29),
(31)-(35), A
!A and !A
A
are not
derivable.
^{[10]} - There are 12 mismatches between
**RD**and Mally's expectations: (5), (12)-(13), (15), (19)-(21), (23) and (24)-(26) are not derivable even though Mally did not regard these formulas as surprising, and (30) is a theorem even though Mally viewed it as surprising. - Formulas (34) and (35) (the formulas which Mally viewed as the
most surprising theorems of his system) are in a sense stranger than
Menger's theorem A
!A
because the latter theorem is derivable in
**RD**supplemented with (34) or (35) while neither (34) nor (35) is derivable in**RD**supplemented with A !A.^{[11]}

Although most of Mally's surprising theorems are not derivable
in **RD**, this has nothing to do with Mally's own reasons
for regarding these theorems as surprising. They are not derivable in
**RD** because they depend on fallacies of relevance. Mally never
referred to such fallacies to explain his surprise. His
considerations were quite different, as we have already
described.

**RD** is closely related to Anderson's relevant deontic
logic **ARD**, which is defined as **R** supplemented with the
following two axioms (Anderson 1967, 1968, McArthur 1981; Anderson
used the unary connective O instead of !):

ARD1. !A (A ) ARD2. !A !A

- All theorems of
**RD**are theorems of**ARD**.^{[12]} - ARD1(
)
is not a theorem of
**RD**+ARD2.^{[13]}This formula does not occur in Mally's book. According to Anderson, Bohnert (1945) was the first one to propose it.^{[14]} - ARD2 is not a theorem of
**RD**+ARD1.^{[15]}This formula does not occur in Mally's book, but Mally endorsed the corresponding informal principle: "a person who wills correctly does not will (not even implicitly) the negation of what he wills; correct willing is free of contradictions."^{[16]} **RD**supplemented with ARD1( ) and ARD2 has the same theorems as**ARD**.^{[17]}

Anderson's system has several problematical features (McArthur
1981, Goble 1999, 2001) and **RD** shares most of these
features. But we will not go into this issue here. It is at any rate
clear that **RD** is better than Mally's original system.

Instead of changing the non-deontic propositional basis of
Mally's system, one might also modify the specifically deontic
axioms and rules. This might of course be done in various ways, but
the following approach works well without departing too much from
Mally's original
assumptions.^{[18]}

First, regard f as primitive and replace Mally's definition of f in terms of and ! (Def. f, the very first specifically deontic postulate in Mally's book) by the following definition of ! in terms of V and f :

Second, replace Axiom I, which may also be written as (B C) ((A f B) (A f C)), with the following

Def. !. !A = V f A

R f . B C / (A f B) (A f C)

We may then derive:

1. B C / !B !C [ Def. !, R f ] 2. (!A & !B) !(A & B) [ Def. !, Ax. II ] 3. !V [ 1, Ax. IV, PC]4. ! [ 1, Ax. III(), Ax. V, PC(ex falso) ]

The so-called standard system of deontic logic **KD** is defined
as **PC** supplemented with 1-4 (except that ! is usually written
as O: see the entry on
deontic logic),
so the new system is at least as strong as **KD**. It is not
difficult to see that it is in fact identical with **KD**
supplemented with OU (Mally's Axiom IV) and the following
definition of f : A f B = O(A
B).
In modern deontic logic, the notion of *commitment* is
sometimes defined in this way.

In the new system, Mally's theorems have the following status.

- II, IV, (1)-(5), (7)-(11), (13)-(15), (17), (20)-(24) and (27)-(32) are derivable.
- I, III, V, (6), (12), (16), (18)-(19), (25)-(26), (33)-(35), A !A and !A A are not derivable.
- There are 20 mismatches with Mally's deontic expectations: 10 "plausible" formulas are no longer derivable, namely I, V, (6), (12), (16), (18)-(19) and (25)-(26), and 10 "surprising" theorems are still derivable, namely (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)-(32).
- Although (34) and (35) are not derivable, adding them would by no means lead to the theoremhood of A !A.

There were only 12 mismatches in the case of **RD**, so the new
system does less justice to Mally's deontic expectations than
**RD** did. But it agrees better with his general outlook because
it is still based on classical propositional logic, a system to which
Mally did not object (not that he had much choice in the 1920s).

Many of Mally's surprising theorems are derivable in **KD**,
but they have, as it were, lost their sting: those theorems lead to
surprising consequences when combined with Mally's Axiom I
and his definition of f , but they are completely harmless without
these postulates.

The standard system of deontic logic has several problematical features. The fact that each provable statement is obligatory is often regarded as counterintuitive, and there are many other well-known "paradoxes." The revised version of Mally's system shares these problematical features. But we will not discuss these issues here. The standard system is at any rate better than Mally's original proposal.

Mally's deontic logic is unacceptable for the reasons stated by Menger (1939). But it is not as bad as it may seem at first sight. Only relatively minor modifications are needed to turn it into a more acceptable system. One may either change the non-deontic basis to get a system that is similar to Anderson's system, or apply two patches to the deontic postulates to obtain a system similar to standard deontic logic.

Some authors have refused to view Mally's deontic logic as a "real" deontic system and say that they "mention it only by way of curiosity" (Meyer and Wieringa 1993, p. 4). The above shows that this judgment is too harsh. It is only a small step, not a giant leap, from Mally's system to modern systems of deontic logic, so Mally's pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt.

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Jutta Valent, eds.,
*Bausteine zu einer Geschichte der Philosophie an der Universität Graz*, Amsterdam/Atlanta (*Studien zur Oesterreichischen Philosophie*, vol. 32). [We have not yet seen this paper.] - Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell, 1910,
*Principia Mathematica*, vol. 1, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

- Basic information page on Ernst Mally (Edward Zalta, Stanford University).
- MaGIC 2.1.4. MaGIC (Matrix Generator for Implication Connectives) is a program which finds matrices for implication connectives for a wide range of propositional logics. MaGIC was written by John Slaney of the Automated Reasoning Group, The Research School of Information Sciences and Engineering, The Australian National University.

*First published: April 5, 2002*

*Content last modified: April 5, 2002*