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Informal Logic

Sometimes informal logic is portrayed as a theoretical alternative to formal logic. While some informal logicians may see the discipline this way, this description places too much emphasis on a rejection of formal methods of analysis -- a rejection which does not characterize all informal logicians. The field can, therefore, be better described as the attempt to develop logical tools that can analyze and assess the "informal" reasoning that occurs in natural language contexts in, for example, political debate, legal proceedings, social commentary, and the opinion pieces featured in the mass media (in newspapers, magazines, television, the Internet, and so on).

Historically, informal logic can be described as a field which has ‘broken away’ from formal logic. In some cases, this break is characterized by a vehement rejection of formal methods of analysis but the relationship of the latter to informal logic is a matter of dispute. Few commentators would maintain that formal methods can be applied with full rigor, but many believe that they can contribute to an understanding of informal reasoning and much of the work in the field assumes a premise/conclusion model of argument which is derived from a formal paradigm. In the future, informal logic may be linked to formal logic by attempts to convert its insights into formal analogues which can be used to construct computer models of natural language reasoning, in research in AI (Artificial Intelligence), and so on.

Three distinct approaches to argument characterize informal logic. The first is founded on fallacy theory, the second is rhetorical, and the third is dialogical. The fallacy approach has been criticized by many theorists and is slowly giving way to a more general account of good reasoning which subsumes it. The account of argument that results establishes the criteria for good causal arguments, arguments by analogy, etc., and treats fallacies as failures to live up to these criteria.

Many informal logicians borrow freely from all three of these approaches, and from a variety of related disciplines and traditions. Literature in the field may, in view of this, apply techniques borrowed from formal logic, philosophy of language, communication theory, game theory, AI, speech act theory and so on. Important topics in recent literature include legal argumentation, the viability of the distinction between linked and convergent premises, deductivism, enthymemes, relevance, the management of argumentative exchange, adversarial and non-adversarial models of argument, visual modes of reasoning, premise acceptability, the logic of humor, arguments by analogy, and antecedents of informal logic in ancient, medieval and early modern times.


The origins of informal logic are found in the call for more relevant higher education that characterizes the social and political movements of the nineteen sixties. In logic this precipitated a more concerted attempt to apply its methods to concrete examples of everyday reasoning. The beginning of informal logic is the attempt to replace the artificial examples that characterize earlier logic books (early editions of Copi, e.g.) with instances of reasoning, argument and debate which are directly taken from newspapers, television and the mass media.

In attempting to analyze such reasoning, informal logicians were greatly influenced by a number of earlier works which analyzes ordinary language arguments. Aristotle's treatment of fallacies and his theory of rhetoric remain a frequent basis for discussion and research. The two modern works which most anticipate and influence informal logic are Hamblin's Fallacies and Toulmin's The Uses of Argument. The latter is especially notable for its emphasis on "the standards and values of practical reasoning," as opposed to "the abstract and formal criteria relied on in mathematical logic and much twentieth century epistemology."

Informal logic proper begins in North America in the nineteen seventies. The most influential figures in its development are Ralph H. Johnson and J. Anthony Blair. Their Logical Self-Defense was one of the first introductory texts to emphasize concrete examples of informal reasoning and their Informal Logic Newsletter quickly became a focus for discussion, news and research. Now the journal Informal Logic, it remains a barometer for developments in the field in its eighteenth year of publication.

Other journals which have played a significant role in the development of informal logic include Argumentation, Philosophy and Rhetoric, Argumentation and Advocacy (formerly the Journal of the American Forensic Association) and Teaching Philosophy. Philosophy journals like the American Philosophical Quarterly and the Canadian Journal of Philosophy have also published significant articles in the field.

In keeping with an emphasis on concrete examples of actual reasoning, the development of informal logic has been tied to pedagogical discussions of the ways in which students can best be taught to reason well in the social, political and work related contexts. One prominent feature of the evolution of informal logic is, therefore, the publication of dozens (and probably hundreds) of textbooks designed to teach students how to reason in such contexts. In many cases, these texts (e.g., those by Govier, Kahane and Ruggiero) are also of theoretical interest, for they implicitly or explicitly advocate and elaborate a particular theoretical approach.

Three Approaches

Early approaches to informal logic emphasized fallacy theory. Its limits have been the subject of a great deal of discussion and debate (witness the articles in Hans Hansen & Robert Pinto's Fallacies), but formal and informal fallacies continue to be a vigorous subject of research. Hamblin's treatment serves as a common reference point, as does the work of John Woods and Douglas Walton, who have discussed a great variety of fallacies in a series of articles and books, first as co-authors and then as individuals. It is notable that their early work (and Woods' later work) frequently employs formal methods of analysis.

One significant development in the literature on fallacies is a number of articles which point out that instances of traditional fallacies -- ad bacculum, ad hominem, two wrongs reasoning, etc. -- often constitute good arguments. Though many introductory textbooks have ignored such developments, those commentators who theoretically defend the fallacy approach have responded by developing a more careful treatment of the fallacies than was previously the case. Groarke, Tindale and Fisher have tried to consolidate concerns about individual fallacies by developing criteria that distinguish between good and bad variants of traditional fallacy forms, in the process exchanging fallacies for corresponding forms of good argument.

A second approach to informal logic borrows from rhetorical perspectives which include classical rhetoric (especially as it is found in Aristotle) and contemporary rhetorical theory. To a much greater extent that formal logic, they have traditionally addressed practical concerns about argument and persuasion. In the attempt to understand informal argument, much can be learned from their willingness to discuss and analyze features of informal reasoning that extend beyond traditional logical concerns. Rhetoric's emphasis on audience does, for example, underscore an essential ingredient of effective argument that extends beyond logical notions of validity and soundness: in a real life context, an argument which is sound (i.e. deductively valid with true premises) is unlikely to achieve its desired end if it is constructed in a way that violates the deeply held sentiments (the pathos) of its intended audience.

A third prominent approach to informal logic borrows from communication theory. It sees argumentation as a form of dialogical exchange and dispute resolution which must conform to implicit normative rules. These rules determine what moves and counter-moves are and are not acceptable in a dialogue. An understanding of such rules -- and a recognition that the rules for dialogue differ in different kinds of contexts (scientific, political, etc.) -- is, on this account, the key to understanding argument. Problems with particular arguments -- fallacies, for example -- are explained as violations of the rules of dialogue.

The foremost representative of the dialogical approach to informal logic is Douglas Walton. Like other commentators who develop this approach, he is greatly influenced by the Dutch "pragma-dialectic" theory of argumentation developed by Frans H. Van Eemeren and Rob Grootendorst of the University of Amsterdam. Taken in conjunction with informal logic, the critical thinking movement and related disciplines, the latter has helped make argumentation theory an area of intensive international research and discussion (for a collection of papers which well represents the state of the art in this multi-disciplinary field, see van Eemeren et. al.).

An Example

The three approaches to informal logic can easily be demonstrated with a simple example which is taken from a Danish television debate over the question whether the Danish church should be separated from the Danish state (see Charlotte Jorgensen, "Hostility in public debate," in Van Eemeren et. al., Vol. IV). At one point in this debate, the debater arguing against the separation of church and state declares that "My opponent wants to sever the Danish church from the state for his own personal sake. His motion is an attempt to take over the church and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods."

We can plausibly understand this remark as a simple argument with one premise and an implicit (or "missing" or "hidden") conclusion. The premise (P) is the claim that "My opponent wishes to sever the Danish church from the state for the sake of his personal interests (i.e., in order to take it over and further his ecumenical theology by his usual mafia methods)." The implied conclusion (C) is the implicit claim that "We should (therefore) reject his motion to separate the Danish church and state." The argument can be diagrammed as:

Looked at from the point of view of fallacy theory, this is a classic case of ad hominem. Kahane, for example, describes it as a fallacy that occurs when an arguer is guilty "of attacking his opponent rather than his opponent's evidence and arguments" (65). In this case, the debater in question attacks the motivation and the character of the person promoting a separate Danish church instead of showing what is wrong with his evidence for the claim that this is a good idea. On these grounds, the fallacy approach rejects the proposed reasoning as fallacious.

Though dialogical approaches employ a different theoretical structure, they invite a very similar analysis. Van Eemeren and Grootendorst explain ad hominem as a violation of their first rule for "critical discussion," which maintains that "Parties [to a dispute] must not prevent each other from advancing standpoints or casting doubts on arguments." Different kinds of ad hominem (i.e., abusive, circumstantial and tu quoque ad hominem) are construed as different violations of this rule. In the case in question, it suffices to say that the debater's attack on his opponent illegitimately denies him his right to make a case for his position.

Rhetorical approaches are characterized by a more sympathetic attitude to ad hominem arguments. This attitude can be understood in terms of Aristotle's suggestion that the ethos of a speaker plays a crucial role in determining whether an argument is persuasive or not. Looked at from this point of view, an ad hominem is, in principle, an acceptable attack on the ethos of a speaker (or writer). This being said, this particular example of ad hominem remains problematic, for it is founded on a very heavy handed and (at least in the excerpt we have looked at) unsubstantiated charge against the debater who advocates the separation of the Danish church and state. One might therefore argue that this kind of strongly worded charge undermines the ethos of the speaker who forwards it rather than the person he attacks.

It is significant that the rhetorical approach clearly recognizes that ad hominem attacks can be entirely appropriate. One may, to take a different example, reasonably cast doubt on an arguer's reasoning by pointing out that they lack the requisite knowledge to make appropriate judgments in the area in question, by pointing out that they have a vested interest, and so on. If someone with no physics credentials wishes to sell one a device to see quarks, then one might very reasonably dismiss their arguments with an ad hominem. Such appeals play an essential role in ordinary language reasoning, for time constraints make it impossible to carefully analyze all the arguments presented to us and we must therefore decide which ones we pay attention to by relying on an assessment of the arguer.

It is in this regard important to recognize that one can easily adapt dialogical and fallacy approaches to informal reasoning so that they too recognize the possibility of reasonable ad hominems. If one adopts a fallacy approach, then this can be accomplished by defining ad hominem more narrowly, so that the fallacy only encompasses those attacks against the person which are fallacious. Alternatively, one can recognize ad hominem as in principle legitimate, but unreliable when it is not properly formulated -- when care is not taken to ensure that the argument in question does not attack an opponent's character in an irrelevant or an unsubstantiated manner).

If one adopts a dialogical approach, then one may recognize the possibility of good ad hominem reasoning by arguing that there are forms of dialogue which do not allow the participation of individuals who have vested interests or are in some other way not qualified to speak to an issue in some contexts. Such refinements are in keeping with our common understanding that, for example, a judge who adjudicates over a civil dispute must not have a vested interest in the outcome.

Relationship to Philosophy

Philosophy and philosophers have played a central role in defining informal logic and developing its approach to ordinary reasoning (communication theory and rhetoric have also made significant contributions). In part because of this, work in the field reflects philosophical concerns about the nature of rationality, the standards of good reasoning, the value of formal methods of analysis, the value of logic and rhetoric, and the social and political role of reasoning (especially in democracy). In the future, the analysis of ordinary reasoning which informal logic makes possible may allow new insights in philosophy of mind, ethics and epistemology.

Within the subdisciplines of philosophy, the emphasis that informal logic places on natural language reasoning and on concrete examples of everyday argumentation might be readily compared to the emphasis that the various kinds of "applied ethics" (biomedical ethics, business ethics, etc.) place on concrete moral problems. In both cases, one finds an approach to philosophy which places great emphasis on its relevance to practical concerns. In many ways, one might compare this attitude to philosophy to the one that characterizes ancient philosophical perspectives which emphasize the ways in which philosophy can contribute to day to day life (e.g., Stoicism, Skepticism and Epicureanism).

The ideal theory of informal logic will encompass both a general theory of argument and a procedure for applying it to concrete instances of reasoning. If the field can avoid the fragmentation that has tended to accompany a sometimes staggering proliferation of approaches derived from a variety of related disciplines, the end result may be a model of ordinary argumentation which makes much better sense from an informal and a formal point of view.


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Copyright © 1996, 1998 by
Leo Groarke
Wilfrid Laurier University

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First published: November 25, 1996
Content last modified: April 19, 1998