|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Libertarianism, as usually understood, is a theory about the permissible use of non-consensual force. It holds that agents, at least initially, fully own themselves and have moral powers to acquire property rights in external things under certain conditions. These property rights (in their own person and in other things) set the limits of permissible non-consensual force against a person: such force is permissible only when it is necessary to prevent that person from violating someone's rights or to impose rectification for such violation (e.g., compensation or punishment). The use of force against an innocent person is thus not permissible to benefit that person (paternalism), to benefit others (e.g., compulsory military service), or even to prevent third parties from violating the rights of others (e.g., killing innocents when necessary to prevent a terrorist attack). These limits on the use of force thus radically limit the legitimate powers of government.
Libertarianism is often thought of as right-wing doctrine. This, however, is mistaken for at least two reasons. First, on social -- rather than economic -- issues libertarianism tends to be left-wing. It opposes laws that restrict consensual and private sexual relationships between adults (e.g., gay sex, non-marital sex, deviant sex), laws that restrict drug use, laws that impose religious views or practices on individuals, and compulsory military service. Second, in addition to the better-known version of libertarianism -- right-libertarianism -- there is also a version known as left-libertarianism. Both endorse full self-ownership, but they differ with respect to the powers agents have to appropriate unappropriated natural resources (land, air, water, etc.). Right-libertarianism holds that typically such resources may be appropriated by the first person who discovers them, mixes her labor with them, or merely claims them -- without the consent of others, and with little or no payment to them. Left-libertarianism, by contrast, holds that unappropriated natural resources belong to everyone in some egalitarian manner. It can, for example, require those who claim rights over natural resources to make a payment to others for the value of those rights. This can provide the basis for a kind of egalitarian redistribution.
The best-known early statement of (something close to) libertarianism is Locke (1690). The most influential contemporary work is Nozick (1974).
Libertarianism holds that agents are, at least initially, full self-owners. Agents are full self-owners just in case they own themselves in just the same way that they can fully own inanimate objects. This full private ownership of a person or thing includes (1) full control rights over (to grant or deny permission for) the use of the person or thing, (2) a full immunity to the non-consensual loss of any of the rights of ownership as long as one does not violate the rights of others, (3) full power to transfer all these rights to others (by sale, rental, gift, or loan), and (4) a full right to compensation if someone violates any of these rights. The property rights in question are moral rights, and may not be legally recognized. Thus, a country that legally allows involuntary slavery fails to recognize the (moral) self-ownership of the slaves. It's also important to note that ownership can vary in strength depending on how strong the corresponding bundle of rights is. Libertarianism in the strict sense is committed to full self-ownership, which is a maximally strong bundle of ownership rights.
At the core of full self-ownership are the full control rights over the use of one's person. One has full control rights over the use of an object just in case one has all the control rights over the use of that object and there are no impersonal duties (duties owed to no one) with respect to such use. Thus, full control rights over one's person consist of three components: (a) full protective claim-rights over one's person: no one may use one's person without one's permission, (b) the absence of any claim-rights held by others over one's person: no one else's permission is needed for permissible use, and (c) the absence of impersonal duties concerning the use of one's person: any use is permissible if it violates no one's rights. Stated otherwise, one has full control rights over one's person if and only if one has full protective claim-rights over the use thereof and one has a full liberty to use one's person (i.e., one has no personal or impersonal duties concerning the use thereof).
An agent who fully owns a given object has no impersonal or personal duties concerning the use of the object. She will typically, however, have a wide range of duties concerning the use of other objects. Because many uses of her owned objects will also involve the use of other objects, she is not morally permitted to use her object in any way she pleases -- the full owner of a baseball bat is not permitted to bash it into my head.
At the core of full self-ownership, then, is full control self-ownership, the full right to control the use of one's person (but not necessarily any right to transfer this right to others, or any tax immunity for the possession or exercise of this right). Something like control self-ownership is arguably needed to recognize the fact there are some things (e.g., various forms of physical contact) that may not be done to a person without her consent, but which may be done with that consent.
Full-self ownership is sometimes thought to guarantee that the agent has a certain basic liberty of action, but this is not so. For if the rest of the world (natural resources and artifacts) is fully (maximally) owned by others, one is not permitted to do anything without their consent -- since that would involve the use of their property. The protection that self-ownership affords is a basic protection against others doing certain things to one, but not a guarantee of liberty. Even this protection, however, may be merely formal. A plausible thesis of self-ownership must allow that some rights (e.g., against imprisonment) may be lost if one violates the rights of others. Hence, if the rest of world is owned by others, then anything one does without their consent violates their property rights, and, as a result of such violations, one may lose some or all of one's rights of self-ownership. This point shows that, because agents must use natural resources (occupy space, breathe air, etc.), self-ownership on its own has no substantive implications. It is only when combined with assumptions about how the rest of the world is owned (and the consequences of violating those property rights) that substantive implications follow.
It is often supposed that full self-ownership gives one property rights in ones' products, but this is so only if the products are part of oneself (e.g., an improvement in one's ability to do mental arithmetic). For products produced from natural resources involve materials that may belong to others, and a person who makes something from stolen materials may not own the product. Again, it all depends on how the rest of the world is owned. This point will be addressed again below.
Let us now consider four important objections to full self-ownership. One objection is that it permits voluntary enslavement. For agents have, it claims, not only the right to control the use of their person, but also the right to transfer that right (e.g., by sale or gift) to others. Some libertarians -- such as Rothbard (1982) -- deny that such transfer is even possible, since others cannot control one's body. This, however, seems to be a mistake, since what is at issue is the moral right to control permissible use (by giving or denying permission), not the psychological capacity to control. Many authors -- such as Locke (1690) and Grunebaum (1987) -- deny that the rights over oneself are so transferable, typically on the ground that such transfers undermine one's autonomy. These authors thus reject full self-ownership, although they endorse a partial form. Those who defend the right of self-enslavement -- Steiner (1994), for example -- typically defend it on the grounds (roughly) that the right to exercise one's autonomy is more fundamental than the protection or promotion of one's autonomy.
A second objection to full self-ownership is that it denies that individuals have an enforceable obligation to perform actions that help the needy, except through voluntary commitment. Some authors who endorse a form of self-ownership -- such as Locke (1690) and Grunebaum (1987) -- hold that one's rights of self-control are limited by an enforceable obligation to provide aid to others when the aid is necessary for their basic survival. Such authors thus reject full self-ownership. Those who reject the enforceable obligation to help the needy typically do so on the grounds that it induces a form of partial slavery.
A third substantive objection to full self-ownership is that it includes a right to make gifts of one's services, and that such gifts, when given from members of an older generation to members of a younger generation, can significantly disrupt the conditions of equality of opportunity. (Note that the right to make gifts of external things is not at issue here, since it does not follow from full self-ownership alone.) Those who defend the right of gifts of personal services emphasize how gifts of personal services are an essential part of intimate personal relationships. They also insist that if a person has the right to perform an action for his/her own benefit, then she also has the right to perform it for someone else's benefit. A possible reply here is that although the donor may well have the power to make gifts of her services, others may not have a right to the full benefit of those services (e.g., the benefits may not be immune to taxation).
A fourth objection to full self-ownership is that it (like rights in general) can lead to inefficient outcomes. Where there are externalities or public goods (such as police protection), each person may be better off if some of each person's rights are infringed (e.g., if each person is required to provide service each week on a police patrol). Given the problems generated by prisoners' dilemmas and other kinds of market failure, in large societies it will typically be impossible to obtain everyone's consent to perform such services. Many, however, would argue that it is nonetheless permissible to force them into providing services (in violation of full self-ownership) as long as everyone benefits appropriately.
Libertarianism is committed to full self-ownership. A distinction can be made, however, between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism, depending on the stance taken on how natural resources can be owned.
Right-libertarianism -- the traditional form of libertarianism -- holds that natural resources are initially unowned and typically may be appropriated without the consent of, or significant payment to, others. It holds, for example, that whoever first discovers, first mixes her labor with, or first claims (different theories specify different conditions) a natural resource owns that resource as long, perhaps, as certain minimal conditions are satisfied. Radical right libertarians -- such as Rothbard (1978, 1982) and Kirzner (1978) -- hold that that there are no constraining conditions. Agents are free to acquire ownership of whatever unappropriated natural resources they find, mix their labor with, or claim -- even if this disadvantages others. Natural resources are simply up for grabs. The most sophisticated defense of this view is probably that of Kirzner (1978), who argues that those who discover natural resources are creating something valuable -- namely the knowledge that those resources exist. It is the creative aspect of discovery that generates the unrestricted right to appropriate.
Lockean right-libertarians -- such as Nozick (1974) -- on the other hand, hold that appropriation is legitimate only if enough and as good is left for others (the Lockean proviso, specified by Locke (1690)). A person who discovers and claims a water hole in the desert does not become the full owner of the water hole if, in some appropriate sense, this disadvantages others. Lockean right-libertarians interpret the Lockean proviso (that enough and as good be left for others) in welfarist terms: no one should be made worse off in some sense by the appropriation. This can be further interpreted in different ways: Is it the specific act of appropriation that should make no one worse off, or is it the general practice of appropriation of natural resources that should make no one worse off? However that is answered, what is the appropriate baseline? Non-appropriation (no private property of natural resources), the most efficient (in some specified sense) form of property rights (which may be limited in various ways), or something else? Thus, Lockean right-libertarianism can take many different specific forms. It is a matter of dispute which version is the most plausible.
Right-libertarianism, then, holds that natural resources are initially unowned and they may be appropriated under a broad range of conditions. Left-libertarianism, by contrast, holds that natural resources are owned by the members of society in some egalitarian sense, so that appropriation is legitimate only with their consent, or with a significant payment to them.
According to one version of left-libertarianism, natural resources are jointly owned in the sense that authorization to use, or to appropriate, is given through some specified collective decision-making process (e.g., by majority or unanimous decision). One form of this approach holds that collective approval is needed for any use, as well as appropriation, of natural resources. As Fressola (1981) and Cohen (1995) have argued, however, this is implausible. It implies that, for agents like us, no one has the right to do anything (e.g., stand in a given spot, eat an apple, or even breathe) without authorization from other members of society. For every action requires the use of some natural resources (e.g., occupying a spatial location), and thus no one is permitted to do anything without approval from others.
A more plausible form of joint ownership of natural resources -- held perhaps by Grotius (1625) and Pufendorf (1672), and explored by Gibbard (1976) -- holds that, prior to any agreement, agents are permitted to use natural resources in conformance with specified terms of common use, but they have no exclusive rights of use (no private ownership). Roughly, this means that they are permitted to use natural resources in various ways (occupy locations, breathe air, eat apples) as long as those resources are not then in use by others (and perhaps subject to certain conditions of sustainability), but they have no rights over any natural resources that they are not currently using. On this view, the initial rights over natural resources are like rights over public park benches. One has a right to use a resource (e.g., sit in one), but once one stops using it, one has no right to prevent others from using it.
Even this form of joint ownership of natural resources, however, is implausible. For it has the implication that no appropriation (i.e. acquisition of exclusive rights of use) is permitted in the absence of actual collective agreement. It is most implausible to hold that the consent of others is required for just appropriation when communication with others is impossible, extremely difficult, or expensive (as it almost always is). Furthermore, even when communication is relatively easy and costless, it's unclear why one needs the consent of others as long as one makes an appropriate compensatory payment for the natural resources appropriated.
A plausible conception of the ownership of natural resources should, then, arguably be common-use-based in the sense that (roughly) agents are permitted to use unappropriated natural resources as long as they violate no one's self-ownership (nor, perhaps, certain constraints of fair use). It should also be unilateralist in the sense of allowing agents to appropriate unappropriated natural resources without the consent of others under appropriate conditions. Right-libertarianism takes such an approach, and, as we shall now see, left-libertarianism can also take such an approach.
The most well developed, and best known, form of left-libertarianism is Georgist libertarianism -- as developed, for example, by George (1879, 1892) and Steiner (1977, 1980, 1981, 1994). It holds that agents may appropriate unappropriated natural resources as long as they pay for the competitive value (based on supply and demand) of the rights they claim. Given the existence of multiple generations, the most plausible version of this approach arguably requires that rights over natural resources be rented (as opposed to purchased) at the competitive rent value (so as to ensure that for each generation the total payment equals current competitive value). Both George and Steiner defend the view that the fund so generated should be divided equally among all (i.e., that each person is entitled to an equal share of the value of natural resources). Other views, however, are possible. One is that the funds should be allocated to promote effective equality of opportunity for a good life (and thus give more to those who have less valuable opportunities).
Georgist left-libertarianism -- even the version that allocates the rent fund to promote effectively equality of opportunity -- does not guarantee that people have effectively equal opportunities to have a good life. The rents from rights over natural resources may not be sufficient for that purpose. Otuska (1998) defends a unilateralist version of left-libertarianism that does guarantee equal opportunities for a good life. He argues that individuals may unilaterally appropriate natural resources to the extent that it is compatible with everyone having an equal opportunity for a good life. To the extent a person appropriates more than such a share (which will be relatively small for those who are relative well endowed), she owes others compensation for their decreased opportunities for a good life.
So far, we have addressed the core libertarian rights of full self-ownership and the right to appropriate natural resources. A complete libertarian theory must also specify what enforcement rights individuals have when others violate their rights. The idea of full self-ownership does not include a specification of enforcement rights. This is because the relevant idea is universal full self-ownership (i.e., every agent being a full self-owner), and this notion is indeterminate with respect to enforcement rights. For a given individual, a maximal set of self-ownership rights would include both a full immunity against loss even if the agent violates the rights of others (and hence others would not be permitted to use non-consensual force against her ever) and maximal enforcement rights against others (which would permit the agent to use force against others in order to prevent or to rectify their violation of her rights). This set of rights, however, is not universalizable. If one agent has the strong immunity to loss of rights, then other agents cannot have the strong enforcement rights (which require the offending agent to have lost some of her rights of self-ownership). Thus, full (universalizable) self-ownership can include a full immunity to loss (but no enforcement rights against the person), or full enforcement rights against the person (but no immunity to loss for rights violations), or anything in between.
One possible position is extreme pacifism, according to which individuals are never permitted to use non-consensual force against others. Another is moderate pacifism, according to which individuals are permitted to use non-consensual force against others only when necessary in self-defense (or the defense of others). This moderate view would allow the use of force against a person to prevent her from wrongfully using force against others, but it would not allow the use of force to rectify past violations (e.g., punish or extract compensation from the rights-violator). Most libertarian positions would allow the use of force for cases of rectification. Many would allow the use of force for retributive punishment, but some -- Barnett (1998), for example -- reject retributive punishment and insist that compensation for wrongful harms is the sole justification for the rectificatory use of force.
Libertarianism holds that many of the powers of the modern welfare state are morally illegitimate. Agents of the state violate the rights of citizens when they punish, or threaten to punish, a person for riding a motorcycle without a helmet, for taking drugs, for refusing to serve in the military, for engaging in consensual sexual relations in private, or for gambling. Furthermore, agents of the state violate the rights of citizen when they force, or threaten to force, individuals to transfer their legitimately held wealth to the state in order to provide for pensions, to help the needy, or to pay for public goods (e.g., parks or roads). (Left-libertarians object to such transfers to the extent that these are in excess of what is owed for the appropriation of natural resources.) Some libertarian-leaning theorists -- such as Hayek (1960) -- argue that it is legitimate to force people to pay their fair share of the costs of providing basic police services (i.e., protection of the libertarian rights and prosecution of those who violate them), but it's hard to see how this could be legitimate on strictly libertarian grounds. If one does not voluntarily agree to share one's wealth in this way, the mere fact that one reaps a benefit from the services does not, on libertarian grounds, generate an enforceable duty to pay one's fair share.
One objection, then, that libertarians raise against the modern welfare state is that it uses force, or the threat thereof, to restrict people's freedom to engage in activities that do not impose force on others. A second objection is that the modern welfare state -- and most states generally -- uses force, or the threat thereof, to restrict people's freedom to use force to protect and enforce their own rights. Although most states recognize a right to use force in self-defense, few states recognize a right to extract compensation forcibly from, or to punish, a person who has violated one's rights. Only the state, it is claimed, has the right to engage in such actions. The state may punish those who attempt to impose the relevant rectification -- even if they impose the very same rectification that the state would impose. Non-pacifist libertarians, however, deny this. Each individual has the right to enforce his rights in various ways, and these are not lost unless the individual voluntarily gives them up. The objection here, then, is not that agents of the state enforce people's rights (which they are perfectly entitled to do if the protected person so wishes), but rather that the state uses force to prevent citizens from directly enforcing their own rights.
The above objections to the modern welfare state would be made by both right-libertarians and left-libertarians. Left-libertarians, however, can endorse certain state-like activities that right-libertarians reject. For on most left-libertarian views, individuals have an enforceable duty to pay others for the value of the rights that they claim over natural resources. Individuals seeking economic justice could form organizations that, under certain conditions, could force individuals to give them the payment they owe for their rights over natural resources, and could then transfer the payments to the individuals who are owed payments (after deducting a fee for the service, if the person agrees). The organization could also provide various public goods such as basic police services, national defense, roads, parks, and so on. By providing such public goods, the value of the rights claimed over natural resources by individuals will increase (e.g., rights over land for which police protection is provided are more valuable than rights over that land without police protection). Such public goods could be provided when and only when they would be self-financing based on the increased rents that they generate.
Such organizations thus engage in many of the activities of the modern states, and left-libertarianism can accept the legitimacy of such activities. There are, however, three important qualifications. First, organizational activities are limited to enforcing people's libertarian rights and to enhancing people's opportunities by providing public goods. Force is never used to restrict activities that violate no libertarian rights. Second, no monopoly on such activities is claimed. There may be many organizations providing such services. Third and finally, the agents of the organization are permitted to force an agent to make her payment for the value of rights over natural resources only if such use is, in some suitable sense, the most reliable way of ensuring that she discharges her duty. Corrupt or inefficient organizations are not permitted to use force to collect such payments. Furthermore, even honest and efficient organizations are not so permitted when the individual owing the payment will voluntarily make the payment directly the relevant parties.
Libertarianism, then, is not only critical of the modern welfare state, but of states in general. Given that so much of modern life seems to require a state, libertarianism's anarchist stance is a powerful objection against it. In reply, libertarians argue that (1) many of the effects of states are quite negative, (2) many of the positive results can be obtained without the state through voluntary mechanisms, and (3) even if some positive results cannot be so obtained, the ends do not justify the means in these cases.
Libertarianism is typically formulated as a theory of the permissible use of force. This political libertarianism holds that the use of force is permissible just in case it violates no one's libertarian rights (e.g., is consensual or is necessary to prevent a rights violation). Here we will briefly note two other topics that libertarianism could be taken to address. One is moral permissibility in general. Libertarianism, that is, could be taken as giving a full moral theory of permissible action. This ethical libertarianism says that an action is permissible just in case it violates no one's libertarian rights. This is a much more radical doctrine than political libertarianism. For it denies that there are any impersonal duties and that there are any non-enforceable duties owed to others. Most political libertarians probably reject ethical libertarianism.
Another topic that libertarianism can be taken to address is justice. Justice can be understood in different ways. One way is as the limits of the permissible use of force. So understood, political libertarianism is a theory of justice. Justice can, however, be understood to mean something different. It is often taken to mean something like what we owe others. Understood as a theory of justice in this sense, libertarianism holds that we owe each person a duty not to violate her libertarian rights, and nothing more. One could object to libertarianism in this sense on the ground that some of the obligations that we owe others are not permissibly enforceable (e.g., keeping our non-contractual promises, or providing personal services to help the needy). Even if libertarianism is correct about our enforceable obligations to others (political libertarianism), it may not be plausible as an account of what we owe others (justice).
Above, we have been understanding libertarianism to be a moral/political principle that can be used to assess the actions of individuals and economic/political structures. Sometimes libertarianism is understood instead as a characteristic of economic/political structures, namely as being laissez-faire (minimal government intervention). Libertarianism as a principle endorses laissez-faire as a kind of economic/political structure, but, of course, it is also possible to endorse laissez-faire using other principles, such as utilitarianism (e.g., see Friedman (1989)).
Understood as a moral/political principle, libertarianism can be understood as a basic principle or as a derivative one. As is typical (but not universal), we have been understanding libertarianism to be a basic moral/principle (e.g., based on natural rights). It is possible, however, to defend libertarianism as a derivative principle. Rule utilitarianism could lead to libertarian principles as could rule contractarianism (see, e.g., Narveson 1988).
Libertarianism asserts that each autonomous agent initially fully owns herself and that agents have moral power to acquire property rights in natural resources and artifacts. What is the status of non-autonomous beings -- such as children and many animals -- that have moral standing (e.g., because sentient)? One possible reply is to deny that non-autonomous beings have any moral standing (e.g., because only beings capable of having moral duties -- agents -- are owed any duties). Non-autonomous beings are simply things to be used. As such, they can be the full private property of agents. Few people, however, will accept that position. Children are not the full private property of their parents. Dogs may not be tortured for fun. Another possibility is to hold that non-autonomous sentient beings are also full self-owners, where the rights involved are understood as protecting their interests rather than their choices (see, for example, Vallentyne 2002). This, of course, would have the wild implication that rats are protected by rights of self-ownership. Perhaps there is some plausible intermediate position, but if so, it has not yet been developed adequately.
According to libertarianism, the permissibility of using force on a given occasion depends on what the past was like. If an agent has transferred some of this rights to others (e.g., partial enslavement), has consented to the use of force (e.g., to participate in a boxing match), or violated the rights of others, then force may well be permissible. Under other conditions, however, it will not be permissible. Given that the history of the world is full of systematic violence (genocide, invasion, murder, assault, theft, etc.), we can be sure that the current distribution of legal rights (over things, wealth, etc.) did not come about legitimately and that adequate reparations have not been made. At the same time, however, we have little knowledge of the specific rights violations that took place in the past (e.g., we have little knowledge of all but the most egregious rights violations that took place more than one hundred years ago). Thus, we have little knowledge of what uses of force today are permissible.
The epistemic problem confronting libertarianism is no worse than that confronting utilitarianism and other consequentialist theories. Consequentialist theories require knowledge of the entire future that will result from each possible action, and we have very little such knowledge. Libertarianism requires knowledge of the entire past, and we also have very little such knowledge. The appropriate answer in both cases is that the facts determine what is permissible, and we should simply make our best judgements about what is permissible based on what we know. Moral reality is complex, and it's not surprising that it's extremely difficult to know what is permissible.
In the case of libertarianism, an additional response is possible. One could hold that there is a moral statute of limitations for rights violations. After the passage of enough time -- or perhaps, after the passage of enough time during which no claim for rectification is made -- the right of rectification for a specific past rights-violation may cease to be valid. If the period of time is short enough (e.g., 100 years), this will radically reduce the epistemic problem. It's not clear, however, that there is a plausible principled libertarian justification (as opposed to a practical one) for such a statute of limitations. (Of course, the adverse incentive effects of such a limitation may provide strong practical reasons against it.)
Libertarianism is attractive because it provides significant protection against interference from others and because it is sensitive to what the past was like (e.g., what agreements were made and what rights violations took place). It faces, however, the serious objection that it gives too much protection from interference and not enough attention to making the future better (e.g., by meeting people's basic needs, making people's lives go better, or promoting equality). As with all prominent moral and political theories, the overall assessment of libertarianism is a matter of on-going debate.
Table of Contents
First published: September 5, 2002
Content last modified: September 5, 2002