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Supplement to Formal Learning Theory

The basic building block of formal learning theory is the notion of
an **evidence item**. For a general formulation, we may simply
begin with a set *E* of evidence items. In general, nothing need
be assumed about this set; in what follows, I will assume that
*E* is at most countable, that is, that there are at most
countably many evidence items. Some authors assume that evidence is
formulated in first-order logic, typically as literals (e.g., [Earman
1992], [Martin and Osherson 1988]). In formal models of language
learning, the evidence items are strings, representing grammatical
strings from the language to be learned. In the example of the Riddle
of Induction, the evidence items are G and B, respectively
represented in the picture by a transparent and by a filled diamond,
so *E* = {G,B}.

Given the basic set *E* of evidence items, we have the notion
of a **finite evidence sequence**. A finite evidence sequence is a
sequence (e_{1}, e_{2}, ..., e_{n}) of
evidence items, that is, members of *E*. For example, the
observation that the first three emeralds are green corresponds to
the evidence sequence (G,G,G). A typical notation for a finite
evidence sequence is *e*. If a finite evidence sequence *e*
has *n* members, we say that the sequence is of length *n*
and write *lh*(*e*) = *n*.

The next step is to consider an **infinite evidence
sequence**. An infinite evidence sequence is a sequence
(e_{1}, e_{2}, ..., e_{n}, ...) that
continues indefinitely. For example, the infinite sequence
(G,G,G,...,G,....) represents the circumstance in which all observed
emeralds are green. A typical notation for an infinite evidence
sequence is
.
Following Kelly [1996], the remainder of this supplement refers to
an infinite evidence sequence as a **data stream**. Even though
the notion of an infinite data sequence is mathematically
straightforward, it takes some practice to get used to employing
it. We often have occasion to refer to finite initial segments of a
data stream, and introduce some special notation for this purpose:
Let
|*n*
denote the first *n* evidence items in the data stream
.
For example if
= (G,G,G,...,G,...) is the data stream featuring only green emeralds, then
|3
= (G,G,G) is the finite evidence sequence corresponding to the
observation that the first three emeralds are green. We also write
_{n}
to denote the *n*-th evidence item observed in
.
For example, if
= (G,G,G,...,G,...), then
_{2} = G.

An **empirical hypothesis** is a claim whose truth supervenes on
a data stream. That is, a complete infinite sequence of observations
settles whether or not an empirical hypothesis is true. For example,
the hypothesis that "all observed emeralds are green" is
true on the data stream featuring only green emeralds, and false on
any data stream featuring a nongreen emerald. In general, we assume
that a **correctness relation ***C* has been specified, where
*C*(,*H*)
holds just in case hypothesis *H* is correct an data stream
.
What hypotheses are taken as correct on which data streams is a
matter of the particular application. Given a correctness relation,
we can define the empirical content of a hypothesis *H* as the
set of data streams on which *H* is correct. Thus the empirical
content of hypothesis *H* is given by
{:
*C*(,
*H*)}. For formal purposes, it is often easiest to dispense
with the correctness relation and simply to identify hypotheses with
their empirical content. With that understanding, in what follows
hypotheses will often be viewed as **sets of data streams**. For
ease of exposition, I do not always distinguish between a hypothesis
viewed as a set of data streams and an expression denoting that
hypothesis, such as "all emeralds are green".

An inquirer typically does not begin inquiry as a tabula rasa, but
has background assumptions about what the world is like. To the
extent that such background assumptions help in inductive inquiry,
they restrict the space of possible observations. For example in the
discussion of the Riddle of Induction above, I assumed that that no
data stream will be obtained that has green emeralds followed by blue
emeralds followed by green emeralds. In the conservation principle
problem discussed in the main entry, the operative background
assumption is that the complete particle dynamics can be accounted
for with conservation principles. As with hypotheses, we can
represent the empirical content of given background assumptions by a
set of data streams. Again it is simplest to identify **background
knowledge** *K* with a set of data streams, namely the ones
consistent with the background knowledge.

In a logical setting in which evidence statements are literals,
learning theorists typically assume that a given data stream will
feature all literals of the given first-order language (statements
such as P(a) or
P(a)),
and that the total set of evidence statements obtained during
inquiry is consistent. With that background assumption, we may view
the formula
x.P(x)
as an empirical hypothesis that is correct on an infinite evidence
sequence
just in case no literal
P(a)
appears on
,
that is for all *n *it is the case that
_{n}
P(a).
More generally, a data stream with a complete, consistent
enumeration of literals determines the truth of every quantified
statement in the given first-order language.

An **inductive method** is a function that assigns hypotheses to
finite evidence sequences. Following Kelly [1996], I use the symbol
for an inductive method. Thus if *e* is a finite evidence
sequence, then
(*e*)
= *H* expresses the fact that on finite evidence sequence
*e*, the method
outputs hypothesis *H*. It is also possible to have a method
assign probabilities to hypotheses rather than choose a single
conjecture, but I leave this complication aside here. Inductive
methods are also called "learners" or
"scientists"; no matter what the label is, the mathematical
concept is the same. In the Goodmanian Riddle above, the natural
projection rule outputs the hypothesis "all emeralds are
green" on any finite sequence of green emeralds. Thus if we
denote the natural projection rule by
,
and the hypothesis that all emeralds are green by "all G",
we have that
(G)
= "all G",
(GG)
= "all G", and so forth. Letting
= (G,G,G,...,G,...) be the data stream with all green emeralds, we
can write
|1
= (G),
|2
= (GG), etc., so we have that
(|1)
= "all G",
(|2)
= "all G", and more generally that
(|*n*)
= "all G" for all *n*.

An inductive method
**converges to** a hypothesis *H* on a data stream
**by time n** just in case for all later times

A **discovery problem** is a pair (**H**, *K*) where *K
*is a set of data streams representing background knowledge and
**H** is a mutually exclusive set of hypotheses that covers
*K*. That is, for any two hypotheses *H*, *H*' in
**H**, viewed as two sets of data streams, we have that *H*
*H*' =
.
And for any data stream
in K, there is a (unique) hypothesis *H* in **H** such that
*H*. For example, in the Goodmanian Riddle of Induction, each
alternative hypothesis is a singleton containing just one data
stream, for example {(G,G,G,...)} for the empirical content of
"all emeralds are green". The background knowledge *K*
is just the union of the alternative hypotheses. In the problem
involving the generalizations "all but finitely many ravens are
white" and "all but finitely many ravens are black",
the former hypothesis corresponds to the set of data streams
featuring only finitely many black ravens, and the latter to the set
of data streams featuring only finitely many white ravens. The
background knowledge *K* corresponds to the set of data streams
that eventually feature only white ravens or eventually feature only
black ravens. Since each alternative hypothesis in a discovery
problem (**H**, *K*) is mutually exclusive, for a given data
stream
in *K* there is exactly one hypothesis correct for that data
stream; I write
H()
to denote that hypothesis.

In a discovery problem (**H**, *K*), an inductive method
**succeeds** on a data stream
in *K* iff
converges to the hypothesis correct for
;
more formally,
**succeeds** on a data stream
in *K *iff
converges to
H() on
.
An inductive method
**solves** the discovery problem (**H**, *K*) iff
succeeds on all data streams in *K*. If
solves a discovery problem (**H**, *K*), then we also say that
is **reliable** for (**H**, *K*). If there is a reliable
inductive method
for a discovery problem (**H**, *K*), we say that the
problem (**H**, *K*) is **solvable**. The main entry
presented several solvable discovery problems. Characterization
theorems like the one discussed there give conditions under which a
discovery problem is solvable.

*Efficient* inductive inquiry is concerned with maximizing
epistemic values other than convergence to the truth. Minimizing the
number of mind changes is a topic in the main entry; what follows
defines this measure of inductive performance as well as error and
convergence time. Consider a discovery problem (**H**, *K*)
and a data stream
in *K*.

- The
**convergence time**, or**modulus**, of a method on is the least time*n*by which converges to a hypothesis*H*on . If is a reliable method for (**H**,*K*), then converges to a hypothesis on every data stream consistent with background knowledge*K*-- more specifically, converges to the correct hypothesis H() -- and the convergence time of is well-defined. - An inductive method
**commits an error**at time*n*on iff (|*n*) is false, i.e., if (|*n*)H(). As with convergence time, if is reliable, then it makes only finitely many errors on any data stream consistent with background knowledge. The number of errors commited by on a data stream is thus given by |{*n*:(|*n*)H()}|. - To count mind changes (and errors) properly, it is useful to
allow methods to produce an "uninformative conjecture" ?,
which we may think of as a tautologous proposition. The point is that
we don't want to count a change from "no opinion" to an
informative hypothesis as a mind change. This device allows us to
represent methods that "wait" until further evidence before
taking an "inductive leap". Formally we say that an
inductive method
**changes its mind**at time*n*+1 on iff the method's previous conjecture at time*n*was informative and changes at time*n*+1. In symbols,**changes its mind**at time*n*+1 on iff: (|*n*)? and (|*n*)(|*n+*1). The number of mind changes made by on a data stream is thus given by |{*n*: changes its mind on at time*n*}|.

As we saw in the main entry, assessing methods by how well they do vis-a-vis these criteria of cognitive success leads to restrictions on inductive inferences in the short run, sometimes very strong restrictions. Learning-theoretic characterization theorems specify the structure of problems in which efficient inquiry is possible, and what kind of inferences lead to inductive success when it is attainable.

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*First published: February 2, 2002*

*Content last modified: February 2, 2002*