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Lawyers are typically interested in the question: What is the law on a particular issue? This is always a local question and answers to it are bound to differ according to the specific jurisdiction in which they are asked. In contrast, the philosophy of law is interested in the general question: What is Law? This general question about the nature of law presupposes that law is a unique social-political phenomenon, with more or less universal characteristics that can be discerned through philosophical analysis. General jurisprudence, as this philosophical inquiry about the nature of law is called, is meant to be universal. It assumes that law possesses certain features, and it possesses them by its very nature, or essence, as law, whenever and wherever it happens to exist. However, even if there are such universal characteristics of law, the reasons for a philosophical interest in elucidating them remain to be explained. First, there is the sheer intellectual interest in understanding such a complex social phenomenon which is, after all, one of the most intricate aspects of human culture. Law, however, is also a normative social practice: it purports to guide human behavior, giving rise to reasons for action. An attempt to explain this normative, reason-giving aspect of law is one of the main challenges of general jurisprudence. These two sources of interest in the nature of law are closely linked. Law is not the only normative domain in our culture; morality, religion, social conventions, etiquette, and so on, also guide human conduct in many ways which are similar to law. Therefore, part of what is involved in the understanding of the nature of law consists in an explanation of how law differs from these similar normative domains, how it interacts with them, and whether its intelligibility depends on such other normative orders, like morality or social conventions.
Contemporary legal theories define these two main interests in the nature of law in the following terms. First, we need to understand the general conditions which would render any putative norm legally valid. Is it, for example, just a matter of the source of the norm, such as its enactment by a particular political institution, or is it also a matter of the norm's content? This is the general question about the conditions of legal validity. Second, there is the interest in the normative aspect of law. This philosophical interest is twofold: A complete philosophical account of the normativity of law comprises both an explanatory and a normative-justificatory task. The explanatory task consists of an attempt to explain how legal norms can give rise to reasons for action, and what kinds of reasons are involved. The task of justification concerns the elucidation of the reasons people ought to have for acknowledging law's normative aspect. In other words, it is the attempt to explain the moral legitimacy of law. A theory about the nature of law, as opposed to critical theories of law, concentrates on the first of these two questions. It purports to explain what the normativity of law actually consists in.
Thus, elucidating the conditions of legal validity and explaining the normativity of law form the two main subjects of any general theory about the nature of law. In the course of the last few centuries, two main rival philosophical traditions have emerged, providing different answers to these questions. The older one, dating back to late mediaeval Christian scholarship, is called the natural law tradition. Since the early 19th century, Natural Law theories have been fiercely challenged by the legal positivism tradition promulgated by such scholars as Jeremy Bentham and John Austin. The philosophical origins of Legal Positivism are much earlier, though, probably in the political philosophy of Thomas Hobbes. The main controversy between these two traditions concerns the conditions of legal validity. Basically, Legal Positivism asserts, and Natural Law denies, that the conditions of legal validity are purely a matter of social facts. In contrast to Positivism, Natural Law claims that the conditions of legal validity are not exhausted by social facts; the moral content of the putative norms also bears on their legal validity. As the famous dictum of Saint Augustine has it: lex iniusta non est lex (unjust law is not law).
The main insight of Legal Positivism, that the conditions of legal validity are determined by social facts, involves two separate claims which have been labeled The Social Thesis and The Separation Thesis. The Social Thesis asserts that law is, profoundly, a social phenomenon, and that the conditions of legal validity consist of social facts. Early Legal Positivists followed Hobbes' insight that the law is, essentially, an instrument of political sovereignty, and they maintained that the basic source of legal validity resides in the facts constituting political sovereignty. Law, they thought, is basically the command of the sovereign. Later legal Positivists have modified this view, maintaining that social conventions, and not the facts about sovereignty, constitute the grounds of law. Most contemporary legal Positivists share the view that there are conventional rules of recognition, namely, social conventions which determine certain facts or events that provide the ways for the creation, modification, and annulment of legal standards. These facts, such as an act of legislation or a judicial decision, are the sources of law conventionally identified as such in each and every modern legal system.
Natural lawyers deny this insight, insisting that a putative norm cannot become legally valid unless it passes a certain threshold of morality. Positive law must confirm in its content to some basic precepts of Natural Law, that is, universal morality, in order to become law in the first place. In other words, Natural Lawyers maintain that the moral content of norms, and not just their social origins, also form part of the conditions of legal validity.
The Separation Thesis is an important negative implication of this Social Thesis, maintaining that there is a conceptual separation between law and morality, that is, between what the law is, and what the law ought to be. The Separation Thesis, however, has often been overstated. It is sometimes thought that Natural Law asserts, and Legal Positivism denies, that the law is, by necessity, morally good or that the law must have some minimal moral content. The Social Thesis certainly does not entail the falsehood of the assumption that there is something necessarily good in the law. Legal Positivism can accept the claim that law is, by its very nature or its essential functions in society, something good that deserves our moral appreciation. Nor is Legal Positivism forced to deny the plausible claim that wherever law exists, it would have to have a great many prescriptions which coincide with morality. There is probably a considerable overlap, and perhaps necessarily so, between the actual content of law and morality. Once again, the Separation Thesis, properly understood, pertains only to the conditions of legal validity. It asserts that the conditions of legal validity do not depend on the moral content of the norms in question. What the law is cannot depend on what it ought to be in the relevant circumstances.
Many contemporary legal Positivists would not subscribe to this formulation of the Separation Thesis. A contemporary school of thought, called Inclusive Legal Positivism, endorses the Social Thesis, namely, that the basic conditions of legal validity derive from social facts, such as social rules or conventions which happen to prevail in a given community. But, Inclusive Legal Positivists maintain, legal validity is sometimes a matter of the moral content of the norms, depending on the particular conventions that happen to prevail in any given community. Those social conventions on the basis of which we identify the law may, but need not, contain reference to moral content as a condition of legality.
The NaturaLaw tradition has undergone a considerable refinement in the 20th century, mainly because its classical, popular version faced an obvious objection about its core insight: Basically, it is just difficult to maintain that morally bad law is not law. The idea that law must pass, as it were, a kind of moral filter in order to count as law strikes most jurists as incompatible with the legal world as we know it. Therefore, contemporary Natural Lawyers have suggested different and more subtle interpretations of the main tenets of Natural Law. For example, John Finnis views Natural Law (in its Thomist version) not as a constraint on the legal validity of positive laws, but mainly as an elucidation of an ideal of law in its fullest, or highest sense, concentrating on the ways in which law necessarily promotes the common good. As we have noted earlier, however, it is not clear that such a view about the necessary moral content of law is at odds with the main tenets of Legal Positivism.
The idea that the conditions of legal validity are at least partly a matter of the moral content of the norms is articulated in a sophisticated manner by Ronald Dworkin's legal theory. Dworkin is not a classical Natural Lawyer, however, and he does not maintain that morally acceptable content is a precondition of a norm's legality. His core idea is that the very distinction between facts and values in the legal domain, between what the law is and what it ought to be, is much more blurred than Legal Positivism would have it: Determining what the law is in particular cases inevitably depends on moral-political considerations about what it ought to be. Evaluative judgments partly determine what the law is.
Dworkin's legal theory is not based on a general repudiation of the classical fact-value distinction, as much as it is based on a certain conception of legal reasoning. This conception went through two main stages. In the 1970's Dworkin argued that the falsehood of Legal Positivism resides in the fact that it is incapable of accounting for the important role that legal principles play in determining what the law is. Legal positivism envisaged, Dworkin claimed, that the law consists of rules only. However, this is a serious mistake, since in addition to rules, law is partly determined by legal principles. The distinction between rules and principles is basically a logical one. Rules, Dworkin maintained, apply in an all or nothing fashion. If the rule applies to the circumstances, it determines a particular legal outcome. If it does not apply, it is simply irrelevant to the outcome. On the other hand, principles do not determine an outcome even if they clearly apply to the pertinent circumstances. Principles basically provide the judges with a reason to decide the case one way or the other, and hence they only have a dimension of weight. That is, the reasons provided by the principle may be relatively strong, or weak, but they are never absolute. Such reasons, by themselves, cannot determine an outcome, as rules do.
The most interesting, and from a Positivist perspective, most problematic, aspect of legal principles, however, consists in their moral dimension. According to Dworkin's theory, unlike legal rules, which may or may not have something to do with morality, principles are essentially moral in their content. It is, in fact, partly a moral consideration which determines whether a legal principle exists or not. Why is that? Because a legal principle exists, according to Dworkin, if the principle follows from the best moral and political interpretation of past judicial and legislative decisions in the relevant domain. In other words, legal principles occupy an intermediary space between legal rules and moral principles. Legal rules are posited by recognized institutions and their validity derives from their enacted source. Moral principles are what they are due to their content, and their validity is purely content dependent. Legal principles, on the other hand, gain their validity from a combination of source-based and content-based considerations. As Dworkin put it in the most general terms: According to law as integrity, propositions of law are true if they figure in or follow from the principles of justice, fairness, and procedural due process that provide the best constructive interpretation of the community's legal practice. (Law's Empire, at p. 225) The validity of a legal principle then, derives, from a combination of facts and moral considerations. The facts concern the past legal decisions which have taken place in the relevant domain, and the considerations of morals and politics concern the ways in which those past decisions can best be accounted for by the correct moral principles.
Needless to say, if such an account of legal principles is correct, the separation thesis can no longer be maintained. But many legal philosophers doubt that there are legal principles of the kind Dworkin envisaged. There is an alternative, more natural way to account for the distinction between rules and principles in the law: the relevant difference concerns the level of generality, or vagueness, of the norm-act prescribed by the pertinent legal norm. Legal norms can be more or less general, or vague, in their definition of the norm-act prescribed by the rule, and the more general or vague they are, the more they tend to have those quasi-logical features Dworkin attributes to principles.
In the 1980's Dworkin radicalized his views about these issues, striving to ground his anti-positivist legal theory on a general theory of interpretation, and emphasizing law's profound interpretative nature. Despite the fact that Dworkin's interpretative theory of law is extremely sophisticated and complex, the essence of his argument from interpretation can be summarized in a rather simple way. The main argument consists of two main premises. The first thesis maintains that determining what the law requires in each and every particular case necessarily involves an interpretative reasoning. Any statement of the form According to the law in S, x has a right/duty etc., to y is a conclusion of some interpretation or other. Now, according to the second premise, interpretation always involves evaluative considerations. More precisely, perhaps, interpretation is neither purely a matter of determining facts, nor is it a matter of evaluative judgment per se, but an inseparable mixture of both. Clearly enough, one who accepts both these theses must conclude that the separation thesis is fundamentally flawed. If Dworkin is correct about both theses, it surely follows that determining what the law requires always involves evaluative considerations.
Both of Dworkin's two theses are highly contestable. Some legal philosophers have denied the first premise, insisting that legal reasoning is not as thoroughly interpretative as Dworkin assumes. Interpretation, according to this view, is an exception to the standard understanding of language and communication, rendered necessary only when the law is, for some reason, unclear. However, in most standard instances, the law can simply be understood, and applied, without the mediation of interpretation. Other legal philosophers denied the second premise, challenging Dworkin's thesis that interpretation is necessarily evaluative.
Dworkin's legal theory shares certain insights with the Inclusive version of Legal Positivism. Note, however, that although both Dworkin and Inclusive Legal Positivists share the view that morality and legal validity are closely related, they differ on the grounds of this relationship. Dworkin maintains that the dependence of legal validity on moral considerations is an essential feature of law which basically derives from law's profoundly interpretative nature. Inclusive Positivism, on the other hand, maintains that such a dependence of legal validity on moral considerations is a contingent matter; it does not derive from the nature of law or of legal reasoning as such. Inclusive Positivists claim that moral considerations affect legal validity only in those cases which follow from the social conventions which happen prevail in a given legal system. In other words, the relevance of morality is determined in any given legal system by the contingent content of that society's conventions. As opposed to both these views, traditional, or as it is now called, Exclusive Legal Positivism maintains that a norm is never rendered legally valid in virtue of its moral content. Legal validity, according to this view, is entirely dependent on the conventionally recognized factual sources of law.
It may be worth noting that those legal theories maintaining that legal validity partly depends on moral considerations must also share a certain view about the nature of morality. Namely, they must hold an objective stance with respect to the nature of moral values. Otherwise, if moral values are not objective and legality depends on morality, legality would also be rendered subjective, posing serious problems for the question of how to identify what the law is. Some legal theories, however, do insist on the subjectivity of moral judgements, thus embracing the skeptical conclusions which follow about the nature of law. According to these skeptical theories, law is, indeed, profoundly dependent on morality, but, as these theorists assume that morality is entirely subjective, it only demonstrates how the law is also profoundly subjective, always up for grabs, so to speak. This skeptical approach, fashionable in so called post-modernist literature, crucially depends on a subjectivist theory of values, which is rarely articulated in this literature in any sophisticated way.
There are several issues entangled here, and we should carefully separate them. John Austin famously maintained that each and every legal norm, as such, must comprise a threat backed by sanction. This involves at least two separate claims: In one sense, it can be understood as a thesis about the concept of law, maintaining that what we call law can only be those norms which are backed by sanctions of the political sovereign. In a second, though not less problematic sense, the intimate connection between the law and the threat of sanctions is a thesis about the normativity of law. Basically, it is a reductionist thesis, maintaining that the normativity of law consists in the subjects' ability to predict the chances of incurring punishment or evil.
In addition to this particular controversy, there is the further question, concerning the relative importance of sanctions for the ability of law to fulfill its social functions. Hans Kelsen, for instance, maintained that the monopolization of violence in society, and the law's ability to impose its demands by violent means, is the most important of law's functions in society. Twentieth century legal Positivists, like H.L.A. Hart and Joseph Raz, deny this, maintaining that the coercive aspect of law is much more marginal than their predecessors assumed. Once again, the controversy here is actually twofold: is coercion essential to what the law does? And even if it is not deemed essential, how important it is, compared with the other functions law fulfils in our lives?
Austin's reductionist account of the normativity of law, maintaining that the normative aspect of law simply consists in the subjects' ability to predict sanctions, was discussed extensively, and fiercely criticized, by H.L.A. Hart. Hart's fundamental objection to Austin's reductionist account of law's normativity is, on his own account, that the predictive interpretation obscures the fact that, where rules exist, deviations from them are not merely grounds for prediction that hostile reactions will follow.... but are also a reason or justification for such reaction and for applying the sanctions. (The Concept of Law, at p. 82) This emphasis on the reason-giving function of rules is surely correct, but perhaps not enough. Supporters of the predictive account could claim that it only begs the further question of why people should regard the rules of law as reasons or justifications for actions. If it is, for example, only because the law happens to be an efficient sanction-provider, then the predictive model of the normativity of law may turn out to be correct after all. In other words, Hart's fundamental objection to the predictive model is actually a result of his vision about the main functions of law in society, holding, contra Austin and Kelsen, that those functions are not exclusively related to the ability of the law to impose sanctions.
It is arguable, however, that law's functions in our culture are more closely related to its coercive aspect than Hart seems to have assumed. Contemporary use of game theory in the law tends to show that the rationale of a great variety of legal arrangements can be best explained by the function of law in solving problems of opportunism, like the so called Prisoner's Dilemma situations. In these cases, the law's main role is, indeed, one of providing coercive measures. Be this as it may, we should probably refrain from endorsing Austin's or Kelsen's position that providing sanctions is law's only function in society. Solving recurrent and multiple coordination problems, setting standards for desirable behavior, proclaiming symbolic expressions of communal values, resolving disputes about facts, and such, are important functions which the law serves in our society, and those have very little to do with law's coercive aspect and its sanction-providing functions.
The extent to which law can actually guide behavior by providing its subjects with reasons for action has been questioned by a very influential group of legal scholars in the first half of the 20th century, called the Legal Realism school. American Legal Realists claimed that our ability to predict the outcomes of legal cases on the basis of the rules of law is rather limited. In the more difficult cases which tend to be adjudicated in the appellant courts, legal rules, by themselves, are radically indeterminate as to the outcome of the cases. The Legal Realists thought that lawyers who are interested in the predictive question of what the courts will actually decide in difficult cases need to engage in sociological and psychological research, striving to develop theoretical tools which would enable us to predict legal outcomes. Thus Legal Realism was mainly an attempt to introduce the social sciences into the domain of jurisprudence for predictive purposes. To what extent this scientific project succeeded is a matter of controversy. Be this as it may, Legal Realism paid very little attention to the question of the normativity of law, that is, to the question of how the law does guide behavior in those cases in which it seems to be determinate enough.
A much more promising approach to the normativity of law is found in Joseph Raz's theory of authority, which also shows how such a theory about the normativity of law entails important conclusions with respect to the conditions of legal validity. The basic insight of Raz's argument is that the law is an authoritative social institution. The law, Raz claims, is a de facto authority. However, it is also essential to law that it must be held to claim legitimate authority. Any particular legal system may fail, of course, in its fulfillment of this claim. But the law is the kind of institution which necessarily claims to be a legitimate authority.
According to Raz, the essential role of authorities in our practical reasoning is to mediate between the putative subjects of the authority and the right reasons which apply to them in the relevant circumstances. An authority is legitimate only if its putative subjects are likely to comply better with the relevant reasons which apply to them by following the authoritative resolution than by trying to figure out or act on those reasons by themselves.
Now, it follows that for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be of the kind of thing capable of claiming it, namely, capable of fulfilling such a mediating role. What kinds of things can claim legitimate authority? There are at least two such features necessary for authority-capacity: First, for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be the case that its directives are identifiable as authoritative directives, without the necessity of relying on those same reasons which the authoritative directive replaces. If this condition is not met, namely, if it is impossible to identify the authoritative directive as such without relying on those same reasons the authority was meant to rely on then the authority could not fulfill its essential, mediating role. In short, it could not make the practical difference it is there to make. Note that this argument does not concern the efficacy of authorities. The point is not that unless authoritative directives can be recognized as such, authorities could not function effectively. The argument is based on the rationale of authorities within our practical reasoning. Authorities are there to make a practical difference, and they could not make such a difference unless the authority's directive can be recognized as such without recourse to the reasons it is there to decide upon. In other words, it is nonsensical to have authorities if, to discover what is an authority and what is not, you have to engage in the same reasoning process that reliance on the authority is supposed to replace. Secondly, for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be capable of forming an opinion on how its subjects ought to behave, distinct from the subjects' own reasoning about their reasons for action. In other words, a practical authority, like law, must be basically personal authority, in the sense that there cannot be an authority without an author.
Raz's conception of legal authority provides very strong support for Exclusive Legal Positivism since it requires that the law, qua an authoritative resolution, be identifiable on its own terms, that is, without having to rely on those same considerations which the law is there to settle. Therefore a norm is legally valid (i.e. authoritative) only if its validity does not derive from moral or other evaluative considerations about which it is there to settle. Notably, Raz's theory challenges both Dworkin's anti-positivist legal theory, and the Inclusive version of Legal Positivism. This challenge, and the controversies it gave rise to, form one of the main topics discussed in contemporary general jurisprudence.
Explaining the rationale of legal authority, however, is not the only component of a theory about the normativity of law. If we hold the Legal Positivist thesis that law is essentially founded on social conventions, another important question arises here: how can a conventional practice give rise to reasons for action and, in particular, to obligations? Some legal philosophers claimed that conventional rules cannot, by themselves, give rise to obligations. As Leslie Green observed, Hart's view that the fundamental rules [of recognition] are mere conventions continues to sit uneasily with any notion of obligation, and this Green finds troubling, because the rules of recognition point to the sources that judges are legally bound to apply. (The Concept of Law Revisited, at p. 1697) The debate here is partly about the conventional nature of the rules of recognition, and partly about the ways in which conventions can figure in our reasons for action. According to one influential theory, inspired by David Lewis, conventional rules emerge as solutions to multiply and recurrent coordination problems. If the rules of recognition are, indeed, of such a coordination kind, it is relatively easy to explain how they may give rise to obligations. Coordination conventions would be obligatory if the norm subjects have an obligation to solve the coordination problem which initially gave rise to the emergence of the relevant convention. It is doubtful, however, that coordination conventions are at the foundations of law. In certain respects the law may be more like a structured game, or an artistic genre, which are actually constituted by social conventions. Such constitutive conventions are not explicable as solutions to some pre-existing recurrent coordination problem. The conventional rules constituting the game of chess, for example, are not there to solve a coordination problem between potential players. Antecedent to the game of chess, there was no particular coordination problem to solve. The conventional rules of chess constitute the game itself as a kind of social activity people would find worthwhile engaging in. The constitutive conventions partly constitute the values inherent in the emergent social practice. Such values, however, are only there for those who care to see them. Constitutive conventions, by themselves, cannot ground an obligation to engage in the practice they constitute.
From a moral point of view, the rules of recognition, by themselves, cannot be regarded as sources of obligation to follow the law. Whether judges, or anybody else, should or should not respect the rules of recognition of a legal system, is basically a moral issue, that can only be resolved by moral arguments (concerning the age old issue of political obligation). And this is more generally so: the existence of a social practice, in itself, does not provide anyone with an obligation to engage in the practice. The rules of recognition only define what the practice is, and they can say nothing on the question of whether one should or should not engage in it. But of course, once one does engage in the practice, playing the judge, as it were, there are legal obligations defined by the rules of the game. In other words, there is nothing special in the idea of a legal obligation to follow the rules of recognition. The judge in a soccer game is equally obliged to follow the rules of his game, and the fact that the game is conventional poses no difficulty from this, let us say, internal-player's perspective. But again, the constitutive rules of soccer cannot settle for anyone the question of whether they should play soccer or not. Similarly, the rules of recognition cannot settle for the judge, or anyone else for that matter, whether they should play by the rules of law, or not. They only tell the judges what the law is. Unlike chess or soccer, however, the law may well be a kind of game that people have an obligation to play, as it were. But if there is such an obligation, it must emerge from external, moral, considerations, that is, from a general moral obligation to obey the law. The complex question of whether there is such a general obligation to obey the law, and whether it depends on certain features of the relevant legal system, is extensively discussed in the literature on political obligation. A complete theory about the normativity of law must encompass these moral issues as well.
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First published: May 27, 2001
Content last modified: May 27, 2001