#### Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

## Proof of Step 1

A given point a_{0} on the unit sphere E uniquely picks out a
unit vector from the origin to a_{0} which in turn uniquely
picks out a ray in R3 through the origin and a_{0}. We here
work with unit vectors, since this involves no loss of generality.
We write a_{0}, a_{1}, ... for points and
u(a_{0}), u(a_{1}), ... for the corresponding unit
vectors. We call a KS diagram realizable on E, if there is a 1:1
mapping of points of E, and thus of vectors in R3, to vertices of the
diagram such that the orthogonality relations in the diagram --
namely, vertices joined by a straight line represent mutually
orthogonal points -- are satisfied by the corresponding
vectors.
We now show (see Kochen and Specker 1967: , Redhead 1987: 126):

If vectors u(a_{0}) and u(a_{9}),
corresponding to points a_{0} and a_{9} of the
following ten-point KS graph
_{1} are separated by an
angle
with 0
sin ^{-1} (1/3), then
_{1}
is realizable.

Figure 4: Ten-point KS graph
_{1}

Suppose that
, the angle between
u(a_{0}) and u(a_{9}), is any acute angle. Since
u(a_{8}) is orthogonal to u(a_{0}) and
u(a_{9}), and u(a_{7}) also is orthogonal to
u(a_{9}), u(a_{7}) must lie in the plane defined by
u(a_{0}) and u(a_{9}). Moreover, the direction of
u(a_{7}) can be chosen such that, if
is the angle between u(a_{0})
and u(a_{7}), then
=
/2 .
Now, let u(a_{5}) = ** i** and
u(a_{6}) = **k** and choose a third vector
**j** such that **i**, ** j**,
**k** form a complete set of orthonormal vectors. Then
u(a_{1}), being orthogonal to **i**, may be
written as:

u(a_{1}) = (**j** +
*x***k**) (1 + *x*^{2})
^{-1/2}

for a suitable real number *x*, and similarly
u(a_{2}), being orthogonal to **k**, may be
written as:
u(a_{2}) = (**i** +
*y***j**) (1 + *y*^{2})
^{-1/2}

for a suitable real number *y*. But now the orthogonality
relations in the diagram yield:
u(a_{3}) = u(a_{5}) ×
u(a_{1}) = (-*x***j** + **k**) (1 +
*x*^{2}) ^{-1/2}
u(a_{4}) = u(a_{2}) × u(a_{6}) =
(*y***i**
**j**) (1 + *y*^{2})
^{-1/2}

Now, u(a_{0}) is orthogonal to u(a_{1}) and
u(a_{2}), so:
u(a_{0}) =
u(a_{1}) × u(a_{2}) /
( | u(a_{1}) × u(a_{2}) | )
=
(-*x**y***i** + *x***j**
**k**)
(1 + *x*^{2} + *x*^{2}
*y*^{2}) ^{-1/2}

Similarly, u(a_{7}) is orthogonal to u(a_{3}) and
u(a_{4}), so:
u(a_{7}) =
u(a_{4}) × u(a_{3}) /
( | u(a_{4}) × u(a_{3}) | )
=
(-**i**
*y***j**
*xy***k**)
(1 + *y*^{2} +
*x*^{2} *y*^{2})
^{-1/2}

Recalling now that the inner product of two unit vectors just equals
the cosine of the angle between them, we get:
u(a_{0}) u(a_{7}) =
cos
=
*xy*[(1 + *x*^{2} +
*x*^{2} *y*^{2})
(1 + *y*^{2} + *x*^{2}
*y*^{2})] ^{-1/2}

Thus:
sin =
*xy*[(1 + *x*^{2} +
*x*^{2} *y*^{2})
(1 + *y*^{2} +
*x*^{2} *y*^{2})]
^{-1/2}

This expression achieves a maxium value of 1/3 for
*x* = *y* =
1. Hence, the diagram is
realizable, if 0
sin^{-1}(1/3),
or, equivalently if 0
sin
1/3.

Copyright © 2000
by

Carsten Held

*cheld@uni-freiburg.de*
Return to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

*First posted: September 10, 2000*

*Last modified: September 10, 2000*