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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to The Analysis of Knowledge


1. See Radford 1966.

2. It is important not to misunderstand the justification condition. What it requires for knowledge is not that the subject have engaged in the activity of justifying the belief, or performed the act of showing (or trying to show) that the belief is justified. Rather, what the justification condition requires is merely that the belief that qualifies as knowledge have the property of being justified. It can have that property even if the subject has not in fact shown to anyone that the belief is justified. Consider an ordinary person's belief that five and five is ten. Most people have never attempted to justify this belief, and probably would be at a loss as to how to go about justifying it. But for most people, that belief would qualify as an instance of knowledge. The importance of the distinction between the activity of justifying and a belief's property of being justified is emphasized by William Alston in the following passage: "To turn to justification, the first point is that I will be working with the concept of a subject S's being justified in believing that p, rather than with the concept of S's justifying a belief. That is, I will be concerned with the state or conditionof being justified, rather than with the activity of justifying a belief. It is amazing how often these concepts are conflated in the literature. The crucial difference between them is that while to justify a belief is to marshal considerations in its support, in order for me to be justified in believing that p it is not necessary that I have done anything by way of an argument for p or for my epistemic situation vis-à-vis p. Unless I am justified in many beliefs without arguing for them, there is precious little I justifiably believe." Alston 1991, p. 71. For an alternative view, see Almeder 1999, pp. 90 and 123. Almeder defends the view that, "as a matter of ordinary discourse, ‘being justified’ is not something we can always separate from the activity of giving, or being able to give, reasons when the question ‘How do you know?’ is appropriately asked." Ibid, p. 92.

3. For a defense of evidentialism, see Feldman and Conee 1985. For criticisms of evidentialism, see De Rose 2000, and Plantinga 1996, pp. 358-361.

4. For a good discussion of objections to the belief condition, see Lehrer 1990, chapter 2.

5. Gettier 1963.

6. Gettier states explicitly the assumption that a justified belief can be false.

7. There are, therefore, two reasons why knowledge is not to be analyzed as true belief. First, a true belief might fail to be justified. Second, a true belief might be justified but fail to be knowledge because the subject is in a Gettier-type situation.

8. See Chisholm 1977, chapter 6. Chisholm's strategy of building a degettierization clause into the justification condition is difficult to understand, given Chisholm's deep commitment to internalism. Since degettierization is an external matter, this strategy makes justification an external property. (See note 46) Thus, for internalists the place to take care of the Gettier problem is clearly a fourth condition.

9. See, for example, Armstrong 1973, p. 152, and Clark 1963. For further references, see Shope 1983, p. 24. This monograph provides a comprehensive discussion of the Gettier literature up to 1980. For a shorter but excellent discussion of the Gettier problem, see the Appendix in Pollock 1986.

10. See Goldman 1976.

For an example of a reliability condition amended so as to solve the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976. See also Goldman 1986, pp. 46-7.

11. For examples of J-reliabilism, see: Goldman 1979, 1986, and Swain 1981.

12. For examples of K-reliabilism, see: Armstrong 1973, Dretske 1981, and Nozick 1981.

13. Dretske, 1989, p. 95.

14. Dretske 1985, p. 177.

15. Ibid, p. 179.

16. We might, therefore, distinguish between reliabilism, and reliabilism+, where the latter, unlike the former, involves a suitable degettierization clause. For an example of a reliability condition amended so as to solve the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976. See also Goldman 1986, pp. 46-7. It should be noted, however, that the "+" in reliabilism+ need not take the form of a fourth condition. Rather, the "+" can simply be a suitable clause within the justification condition, where that condition is, of course, formulated in terms of reliability. (For an example of a reliability condition amended so as to solve the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976. See also Goldman 1986, pp. 46-7.) But within an internalist JTB+ account of knowledge (to be discussed in the next section), the"+" demands a separate and fourth condition, since internal justification and degettierization differ in a crucial respect: unlike the former, the latter is an external affair. See note 46. Consequently, if we think of the "+" in JTB+ as a separate condition that cannot be mixed in with the justification condition, then the need to account for Gettier cases does not require of us to move from reliabilism to reliabilism+ in the same way as it requires of us to move from JTB to JTB+.

17. For literature discussing the internalism/externalism debate, see Alston 1989, pp. 185-226, BonJour 1985, chapter 3, Conee and Feldman, forthcoming, Goldman 1999, Fumerton 1995, Sosa 1999, Steup 1998, and Steup, 2001b.

18. Chisholm 1989, p. 7.

19. Chisholm 1977, p. 17.

20. Conee and Feldman (forthcoming) argue that internalism should be characterized in terms of mental states and events.

21. On the other hand, if mental states/events are not directly recognizable, the mental state criterion might not give internalists what they want. The problem here is that internalists would not want to count, for example, the state of being reliably clairvoyant as a mental state. If they did, they would not be in a position to deny that (unwittingly )reliable clairvoyance is a source of justification. Thus the need arises to differentiate between neurophysiological states that are, and those that are not, mental states. It might be that the best way to achieve this is to say that only directly recognizable neurophysiological states are mental states. But if the direct recognizability criterion is needed to define mental states, then mental state internalism does not appreciably differ from accessibility internalism.

22. If S is knocked out, or perhaps only sleeping, is he in a position to know the justificational status of any of her beliefs? Those who would say ‘no’ should reformulate the definition of J-internalism as follows: At any time t at which S is capable of thinking and holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified.

23. For a brief article on the concept of evidence, see Feldman 1992. See also Feldman 1988b.

24. For discussion of this issue, see Goldman 1999, and Steup 2001b.

25. The reason for this is that the kind of evidence that is relevant to a belief's justificational status must be evidence the subject possesses. But what brings evidence into the subject's possession? According to a strict view, only if it comes in the form of propositions that the subject believes. The problem with this view is its narrow scope. It excludes sensory experiences and memories from the kind of evidence that a subject possesses. Arguably, the best way to include them is to say this: evidence the subject possesses consists of the sorts of things that she can recognize on reflection, that is, that are directly recognizable to her.

26. It could be objected that an evidentialist would not have to be a K-internalist. The two theories are logically independent. Perhaps they are. It seems to me, however, that an evidentialist who doesn't take the possession of evidence to be a necessary condition of knowledge would be a strange bird indeed.

27. This view was held, for example, by Chisholm. In the second edition of his Theory of Knowledge, he wrote:

We may assume that every person is subject to a purely intellectual requirement---that of trying his best to bring it about that, for every proposition h that he considers, he accepts h if and only if h is true. (1977, p. 14)

Laurence BonJour is another epistemologist who endorses a deontological conception of epistemic justification. He expresses it thus:

The distinguishing characteristic of epistemic justification is thus its essential or internal relation to the cognitive goal of truth. It follows that one's cognitive endeavors are epistemically justified only if and to the extent that they are aimed at this goal, which means very roughly that one accepts all and only those beliefs which one has good reason to think are true. To accept a belief in the absence of such a reason, however appealing or even mandatory such acceptance might be from some other standpoint, is to neglect the pursuit of truth; such acceptance is, one might say, epistemically irresponsible. My contention here is that the idea of avoiding such irresponsibility, of being epistemically responsible in one's believings, is the core of the notion of epistemic justification. (1985, p. 8)

For further literature on the deontological conception of justification, see Alston 1989, pp. 81-152, Feldman 1988, and Steup 1996, chapter four.

28. For literature on the role of truth in epistemology, see Alston 1996, chapter 8, David 2001, and De Paul 2001.

29. Alternatively, evidentialists could drop the first part of this conjunction. Is it really my epistemic duty to believe everything that my evidence supports? It could be objected that it is hard to understand why it should be my epistemic duty to clutter up my belief system with trivial logical consequences of what my evidence supports. The reply to that would be that the consideration of clutter is not an epistemic, but a practical consideration. For discussion of this issue, see Feldman 1988.

30. For example, Goldman (1999) takes the rationale for internalism to rest on the deontological conception of justification as its main premise. For discussion of this issue, see Feldman forthcoming, and Steup 2001b.

31. The argument for (3) would go as follows: The concept of a duty has built into it an epistemic aspect. That by virtue of which a subject has a duty must, in the very least, be readily knowable, if not directly recognizable, to the subject. For otherwise, the could be such a thing as an unrecognizable duty, which is a conceptual impossibility. Critics of the argument displayed in the main text could argue that ready knowability is less than direct recognizability, but certainly enough to put the concept of duty on a solid footing. Hard-boiled internalists would insist that ready knowability either amounts to direct recognizability, or isn't quite enough.

32. See the critique of externalism in chapter 3 of BonJour 1985.

33. I add "good reasons" to allow for the possibilities of internalists who are not evidentialists, and would characterize internal justification not in terms of not evidence but reasons.

34. The evil demon objection to reliabilism can be found in Cohen 1984, pp. 280-82, Foley 1985, Ginet 1985, and Lehrer 1990, p. 166.

35. Harman 1977, p. 17.

36. Harman 1984, p. 33. Harman 1984, p. 33.

37. At the beginning of his 1977, Goldman explicitly states his analytic goal: to give necessary and sufficient conditions of epistemic justification in non-epistemic terms.

38. See Chisholm 1989, p. 61f, where Chisholm makes it abundantly clear that he intends his "formal epistemic principles" to state what epistemic justification supervenes on. See also Steup 1996, chapter 9, where I argue that, as far as the analytic goal is concerned, there is surprising overlap between the internalist Chisholm and the externalist Goldman.

39. For recent literature on the naturalization of epistemology, see the Kornblith 1999 and Feldman 1999.

40. Thus Chisholm writes: "According to [the] traditional conception of "internal" epistemic justification, there is no logical connection between epistemic justification and truth. A belief may be internally justified and yet be false. This consequence is not acceptable to the externalist. He feels that an adequate account of epistemic justification should exhibit some logical connection between epistemic justification and truth." Chisholm 1989, p. 76f. See also Fumerton 1995, pp. 200-203.

41. An externalist alternative to reliabilism is Plantinga's proper functionalism. See Plantinga 1993a and 1993b.

42. It should be mentioned, however, that Alston also makes an effort to appreciate the appeal of internalism. See pp. 227-248 in his 1989.

43. Alston 1993, p. 9.

44. For a discussion of Dretske's question, see Almeder 1998, p. 132-136.

45. Alston, for example, endorses the view that animals and small children cannot have justified beliefs. He writes: "Lower animals, very small children, and idiots acquire and utilize much perceptual knowledge concerning the immediate environment; otherwise they would not be able to move around in it successfully. But they are not capable of acting in the light rules. So [justification as a normative property] is at best a necessary condition for the knowledge possessed by the likes of normal mature human beings." (1989, p. 173) I am inclined to concur with Alston. Although animals do of course have sensory experiences, I do not think that these experiences constitute evidence for them, for I take the concept of evidence to have a deontological aspect. A subject doesn't have evidence for p simply by virtue of being, for example, in a sensory state of the right sort. Rather, such a sensory state is evidence only if it entitles the subject, or makes it permissible for her, to believe that p. But animals are not subject to entitlements or permissions of that sort. I would, therefore, reject the suggestion that animals and little children can have evidence. For a contrary view, see Russell 2001.

46. Degettierization is an external matter because gettierization is an external matter. And gettierization is an external matter because a subject who is in a Gettier-type situation cannot tell on reflection (recognize directly) that she is in such a situation. On reflection, such a subject would have to come to the conclusion that she has knowledge.

47. I think it would be fair to say, however, that the subject matter of traditional epistemology has been IK rather than EK. Of course, this is not by itself a reason to prefer IK, since it might be a reflection of the shortcomings of traditional epistemology instead of an indication of the superiority of IK.

48. There are alternative approaches to the analysis of knowledge which I did not discuss in this article. First of all, I should mention Plantinga's proper functionalism, as represented by his 1993a and 1993b. I should also mention Linda Zagzebski's recent defense of virtue epistemology. Zagzebski 1996 and 1999. The virtue approach is also advocated in Goldman 1991, various papers in Sosa 1991, and Greco 1993.

Copyright © 2001 by
Matthias Steup

First published: February 5, 2001
Content last modified: February 5, 2001