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Inspired by his reading of Kant, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762 - 1814) developed during the final decade of the eighteenth century a radically revised and rigorously systematic version of transcendental idealism, which he called Wissenschaftslehre of "Doctrine of Scientific Knowledge." Perhaps the most characteristic, as well as most controversial, feature of the Wissenschaftslehre (at least in its earlier and most influential version) is Fichte's effort to ground his entire system upon the bare concept of subjectivity, or, as Fichte expressed it, the "pure I." During his career at the University of Jena (1794-1799) Fichte erected upon this foundation an elaborate transcendental system that embraced the philosophy of science, ethics, philosophy of law or "right." and philosophy of religion.
Fichte was born May 19, 1762 in the village of Rammenau in the Oberlausitz area of Saxony. He was the eldest son in a family of poor and pious ribbon weavers. His extraordinary intellectual talent soon brought him to the attention of a local baron, who sponsored his education, first in the home of a local pastor, then at the famous Pforta boarding school, and finally at the universities of Jena and Leipzig. With the death of his patron, Fichte was forced to discontinue his studies and seek his livelihood as a private tutor, a profession he quickly came to detest.
Following a lengthy sojourn in Zurich, were he met his future wife, Johanna Rahn, Fichte returned to Leipzig with the intention of pursuing a literary career. When his projects failed, he was again forced to survive as a tutor. It was in this capacity that he began giving lessons on the Kantian philosophy in the summer of 1790. This first encounter with Kant's writings produced what Fichte himself described as a "revolution" in his manner of thinking. Whereas he had formally been torn between, on the one hand, a practical commitment to the moral improvement of humanity and, on the other, a theoretical commitment to "intelligible fatalism," he found in the Critical philosophy a way of reconciling his "head" and "heart" in a system that could meet the highest intellectual standards without requiring him to sacrifice his belief in human freedom.
Fichte eventually made his way to Königsberg, where he lived for a few months. After a disappointing interview with Kant, he resolved to demonstrate his mastery of the latter's philosophy by writing a treatise on a theme as yet unaddressed by Kant: namely, the question of the compatibility of the Critical philosophy with any concept of divine revelation. In a few weeks Fichte composed a remarkable manuscript in which he concluded that the only revelation consistent with the Critical philosophy is the moral law itself. Kant was sufficiently impressed by the talent of this unknown and impoverished young man to offer to arrange for the publication of Fichte's manuscript, which was published by Kant's own publisher in 1792 under the title Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation. The first edition of this work, however, for reasons that have never been satisfactorily explained, appeared without the author's name and preface and was quickly and widely hailed as a work by Kant himself. When the true identity of its author was revealed, Fichte was immediately catapulted from total obscurity to philosophical celebrity.
Meanwhile, Fichte was once again employed as a private tutor, this time on an estate near Danzig, where he wrote several, anonymously published political tracts. The first of these was published in 1793 with the provocative title Reclamation of the Freedom of Thought from the Princes of Europe, who have hitherto Suppressed it. In the summer of 1793 Fichte returned to Zurich where he married his fiancé and oversaw the publication of the first two installments of his spirited Contribution to the Rectification of the Public's Judgment of the French Revolution (1793 and 1794). In this work he not only defended the principles (if not all the practices) of the French revolutionaries, but also attempted to outline his own democratic view of legitimate state authority and insisted on the right of revolution. Despite the fact that these political writings were published anonymously, the author's identity was widely known, and Fichte thereby acquired a reputation, not wholly deserved, as a radical "Jacobin."
Following the completion of these projects, Fichte devoted his time in Zurich to concentrated efforts to rethink and to revise his own philosophical position. While maintaining his allegiance to the new Critical or Kantian philosophy, Fichte was powerfully impressed by the efforts of K. L. Reinhold to provide the Critical philosophy with a new, more secure "foundation" and to base the entire system upon a single "first principle." At the same time, he became acquainted with the works of two authors who were engaged in skeptical attacks upon the philosophies of both Kant and Reinhold: Solomon Maimon and G. E. Schulze ("Aenesidemus"). It was the need to respond to the sharp criticisms of these authors that eventually led Fichte to construct his own, unique version of transcendental idealism, for which, in the spring of 1794, he eventually coined the name Wissenschaftslehre ("Doctrine of Science" or "Theory of Scientific Knowledge").
It was at precisely this moment that he received an invitation to assume the recently vacated chair of Critical Philosophy at the University of Jena, which was rapidly emerging as the capital of the new German philosophy. Fichte arrived in Jena in May of 1794, and enjoyed tremendous popular success there for the next six years, during which time he laid the foundations and developed the first systematic articulations of his new system. Even as he was engaged in this immense theoretical labor, he also tried to address a larger, popular audience and also threw himself into various practical efforts to reform university life. As one bemused colleague observed, "his is a restless spirit; he thirsts for some opportunity to act in the world. Fichte wants to employ his philosophy to guide the spirit of his age." Indeed, a passionate desire to "have an effect" upon his own age remained a central feature of Fichte's character, most notably expressed a decade later in his celebrated Addresses to the German Nation, delivered in Berlin in 1806 during the French occupation. In Jena, this same desire is reflected in the enormously popular series of public lectures on "Morality for Scholars," which he began to deliver immediately upon his arrival in Jena. The first five of these lectures were published in 1794 under the title Some Lectures concerning the Scholar's Vocation.
Though Fichte has already hinted at his new philosophical position in his 1794 review of G. E,. Schulze's Aenesidemus, the first full-scale announcement of the same came in a short manifesto that he published as a means of introducing himself to his students and colleagues and attracting listeners to his lectures. (As an "extraordinary professor," Fichte was largely dependent upon fees paid by students attending his "private" lectures.) This manifesto, Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre (1794), articulated some of the basic ideas of the new philosophy, but it mainly focused upon questions of systematic form and the foundations of the same.
Fichte's first truly systematic work was his Foundation of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre (1794/95). As the title implies, this work, which remains to this day Fichte's best-known philosophical treatise, was not meant to be a presentation of his entire system, but only of the rudiments or first principles of the same. In fact, Fichte had not originally intended to publish this work at all, which was written less than a year after his first tentative efforts to articulate for himself his new conception of transcendental philosophy. The Foundation was originally intended to be distributed, in fascicles, to students attending his private lectures during his first two semesters at Jena, where the printed sheets could be subjected to analysis and questions and supplemented with oral explanations. Because of the great interest in Fichte's new philosophy, however, he soon authorized a public edition of the same, in two volumes. Parts I and II of the Foundation were published in 1794 and Part II in 1795. In 1795 he also published a substantial supplement to the Foundation, under the title Outline of the Distinctive Character of the Wissenschaftslehre with Respect to the Theoretical Faculty. The title pages of all three of these publications, however, still stipulated that they were intended only as "a manuscript for the use of his listeners." (When, in 1802, Fichte issued a second, one-volume edition of the Foundation and Outline, in 1801, this subtitle was dropped.)
Dissatisfied with many features of his initial presentation of the "foundational" portion of his system and surprised and shocked by the virtually universal misunderstanding of his published Foundation, Fichte immediately set to work on an entirely new exposition of the same, which he repeated three times in his private lectures on "The Foundations of Transcendental Philosophy (Wissenschaftslehre) nova methodo" (1796/76, 1797/98, 1798/99). Though he intended to revise these lectures for serial publication under the title An Attempt a New Presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre in the Philosophisches Journal einer Gesellschaft Teutscher Gelehrten, of which he himself was by then co-editor, only the two Introductions to and the first chapter of this "New Presentation" ever appeared (1797/98).
Even as he was thoroughly revising his presentation of the foundational portion of his system, Fichte was simultaneously engaged in elaborating the various subdivisions or systematic branches of the same. As was his custom, he did this first in his private lectures and then in published texts based upon the same. The first such extension was into the realm of philosophy of law and social philosophy, which resulted in the publication of Foundation of Natural Right in accordance with the Principles of the Wissenschaftslehre (published in two volumes in 1796 and 1797). The second was into the realm of moral philosophy, which resulted in the publication of the System of Ethical Theory in accordance with the Principles of the Wissenschaftslehre (1798). At this point, Fichte's own plans called for him to extend his system into the realm of philosophy of religion. He announced lectures on this topic for the Spring Semester of 1799, but before he could commence these lectures, his career at Jena had come to an abrupt and unhappy conclusion in the wake of the so-called "Atheism Controversy" of 1798/99.
In 1798 Fichte published in his Philosophical Journal a brief essay "On the Basis of Our Belief in a Divine Governance of the World," in which he attempted to sketch some of his preliminary ideas on the topic indicated in the title and simultaneously to give the first clear public hint of the character of a philosophy of religion "in accordance with the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre." The occasion for this essay was another essay, published in the same issue of the Philosophical Journal, by K. L. Forberg. As it happened, these two essays provoked an anonymous author to publish a pamphlet charging the authors with atheism and demanding Fichte's dismissal from his post at Jena. The matter quickly escalated into a major public controversy which eventually led to the official suppression of the offending issue of the journal and to public threats by various German princes to prevent their students from enrolling at the University of Jena. The crisis produced by these actions and the growing number of publications for and against Fichte -- which included an intemperate Appeal to the Public by Fichte himself (1799), as well as a more thoughtful response entitled "From a Private Letter" (1799) - eventually provoked F. H. Jacobi to publish his famous "open letter" to Fichte, in which he equated philosophy in general and Fichte's transcendental philosophy in particular with "nihilism." As the public controversy unfolded, Fichte badly miscalculated his own position and was finally forced to resign his position at Jena and to flee to Berlin, where he arrived in the summer of 1799.
At this point, the Prussian capital had no university of its own, and Fichte was forced to support himself by giving private tutorials and lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre and by a new flurry of literary production, increasingly aimed at a large, popular audience. The first of these "popular" writings was a brilliant presentation of some of the characteristic doctrines and conclusions of Fichte's system, with a strong emphasis upon the moral and religious character of the same. This work, The Vocation of Man (1800), which is perhaps Fichte's greatest literary achievements, was intended as an indirect response to Jacobi's public repudiation of the Wissenschaftslehre. That same year also saw the publication of a typically bold foray into political economy, The Closed Commercial State, in which Fichte propounds a curious blend of socialist political ideas and autarkic economic principles. Defending his philosophy against misunderstanding remained, however, Fichte's chief concern during this period, as is evidenced by the more direct response to Jacobi contained in his poignantly titled Sun-Clear Report to the Public at Large concerning the Actual Character of the latest Philosophy: An Attempt to Force the Reader to Understand (1801).
At the same time that he was addressing the public in this manner, Fichte was becoming ever more deeply engrossed in efforts to rethink and to rearticulate the very foundations of his system, beginning with his private lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre of 1801/2, and culminating in the three, radically new versions of the same produced during the year 1804. Indeed, he continued to produce new versions of the Wissenschaftslehre right up until his death. However, with the single exception of the extraordinarily condensed (and extraordinarily opaque) Presentation of the General Outlines of the Wissenschaftslehre (1810), none of these later versions of the Wissenschaftslehre was published during Fichte's lifetime. Some of them appeared, in severely edited form, in the collection of Fichte's Works published by his son several decades following his death, but most of them are only now being published for the first time in the critical edition of Fichte's writings produced by the Bavarian Academy of the Sciences. It appears that Fichte was so discouraged by the public reception of the first, 1794/95 presentation of the foundation of his system that he concluded that it was prudent to limit future new presentations of the same to the lecture hall and seminar room, where he could elicit reactions and objections from his listeners and respond immediately with the requisite corrections and clarifications. Be that as it may, Fichte never stopped trying to refine his philosophical insights and to revise his systematic presentation of the same. Their are more than a dozen different full-scale presentations or versions of the Wissenschaftslehre, most of which were written after his departure from Jena. "The Wissenschaftslehre" is not the name of a book; it is the name of a system of philosophy, one capable of being expounded in a variety of different ways.
In 1805 Fichte spend a semester as a professor at the University of Erlangen, but returned to Berlin in the fall of that year. The next year, 1806, he published in rapid succession three popular and well-received books, all of which were based upon earlier series of public lectures that he had delivered in Berlin: On the Essence of the Scholar (a reworking of some of the same themes first addressed in the similarly titled lectures of 1794); The Characteristics of the Present Age (an attempt to show the implications of his "system of freedom" for a speculative philosophy of history); and Guide to the Blessed Life (an eloquent and rather mystical treatise on philosophy and religion). Taken together, these three "popular" works are remarkable blends of speculative profundity and rhetorical eloquence.
With the entry of the French army of occupation into Berlin in 1806, Fichte joined the Prussian government in exile in Königsberg, where he delivered yet another course of lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre and wrote an important short book on Machiavelli as Author (1807), which defends a form of Realpolitik that at least appears to contrast quite starkly with the liberalism and political idealism of Fichte's earlier political writings. Fichte soon returned to occupied Berlin, however, where, in the winter of 1807/8, he delivered his celebrated Addresses to the German Nation (published in 1808). Though these lectures later obtained a place of dubious honor as founding documents in the history of German nationalism, they are mainly concerned with the issue of national identity (and particularly with the relationship between language and nationality) and the question of national education (which is the main topic of the work) -- both understood as means toward a larger, cosmopolitan end.
Fichte had always had a lively interest in pedagogical issues and assumed a leading role in planning the new Prussian university to be established in Berlin (though his own detailed plans for the same were eventually rejected in favor of those put forward by Wilhelm von Humboldt). When the new university finally opened in 1810, Fichte was the first head of the philosophical faculty as well as the first elected rector of the university. His final years saw no diminishment in the pace either of his public activity or of his philosophical efforts. He continued to produce new lectures on the foundations and first principles of his system, as well as new introductory lectures on philosophy in general ("Logic and Philosophy"  and "The Facts of Consciousness" ), political philosophy ("System of the Theory of Right"  and Theory of the State ) and ethics ("System of Ethical Theory" ). As presaged perhaps by his earlier book on Machiavelli, these late forays into the domain of practical philosophy betray a far darker view of human nature and defend a more authoritarian view of the state than anything to be found in Fichte's earlier, published writings on these subject.
In 1813 Fichte canceled his lectures so that his students could enlist in the "War of Liberation" against Napoleon, of which Fichte himself proved to be an indirect casualty. From his wife, who was serving as a volunteer nurse in a Berlin military hospital, he contracted a fatal infection of which he died on January 29, 1814.
The primary task of Fichte's system of philosophy (the Wissenschaftslehre) is to reconcile freedom with necessity, or, more specifically, to explain how freely willing, morally responsible agents can at the same time be considered part of a world of causally conditioned material objects in space and time. Fichte's strategy for answering this question -- at least in his early writings, which are the ones upon which his historical reputation as a philosopher has (at least until recently) been grounded and hence are the ones to be expounded here -- was to begin simply with the ungrounded assertion of the subjective spontaneity and freedom (infinity) of the I and then to proceed to a transcendental derivation of objective necessity and limitation (finitude) as a condition necessary for the possibility of the former. This is the meaning of his description, in his "First Introduction to the Wissenschaftslehre," of philosophy's task as that of "displaying the foundation of experience" or "explaining the basis of the system of representations accompanied by a feeling of necessity." Fichte derived this conception of the task and strategy of philosophy from his study of Kant, and no matter how far his own system seemed to diverge from "the letter" of the Critical philosophy, Fichte always maintained that it remained true to "the spirit" of the same. Central to this "spirit," for Fichte, is an uncompromising insistence upon the practical certainty of human freedom and a thoroughgoing commitment to the task of providing a transcendental account of ordinary experience that could explain the objectivity and necessity of theoretical reason (cognition) in a manner consistent with the practical affirmation of human liberty. Though Fichte attributed the discovery of this task to Kant, he believed that it was first accomplished successfully only in the Wissenschaftslehre, which he therefore described as the first "system of human freedom."
In an effort to clarify the task and method of transcendental philosophy, Fichte insisted upon the sharp distinction between the "standpoint" of natural consciousness (which it is the task of philosophy to "derive," and hence to "explain") and that of transcendental reflection, which is the standpoint required of the philosopher. He thus insisted that there is no conflict between transcendental idealism and the commonsense realism of everyday life. On the contrary, the whole point of the former is to demonstrate the necessity and unavailability of the latter.
However "Kantian" in spirit Fichte's enterprise might have been, he was at the same time all too keenly aware of what he considered to be certain glaring weaknesses and inadequacies in Kant's own execution of this project. Taking to heart the criticisms of such contemporaries as F. H. Jacobi, Salomon Maimon, and G. E. Schulze, Fichte propounded a radically revised version of the Critical philosophy. First of all, he argued that the very concept of a "thing in itself," understood as a mind-independent, external "cause" of sensations, is indefensible on Critical grounds. In addition, he maintained that Kant's denial of the possibility of "intellectual intuition," though certainly justified as a denial of the possibility of any non-sensory awareness of external objects, is nevertheless difficult to reconcile with certain other Kantian doctrines regarding the I's immediate presence to itself both as a (theoretically) cognizing subject (the doctrine of the transcendental apperception) and as a (practically) striving moral agent (the doctrine of the categorical imperative).
His study of the writings of K. L. Reinhold convinced Fichte that the systematic unity of the Critical philosophy -- specifically, the unity of theoretical and practical reason, of the First and Second Critiques -- was insufficiently evident in Kant's own presentation of his philosophy and that the most promising way to display the unity in question would be to provide both theoretical and practical philosophy with a common foundation. The first task for philosophy, Fichte therefore concluded, is to discover a single, self-evident starting point or first principle from which one could then somehow "derive" both theoretical and practical philosophy, which is to say, our experience of ourselves as finite cognizers and as finite agents. Not only would such a strategy guarantee the systematic unity of philosophy itself, but, more importantly, it would also display what Kant hinted at but never demonstrated: viz., the underlying unity of reason itself.
Since it is a central task of philosophy, so construed, to establish the very possibility of any knowledge or science (Wissenschaft) whatsoever, Fichte proposed to replace the disputed term "philosophy" (or "love of wisdom") with the new term Wissenschaftslehre or Theory or Science - a name intended to highlight the distinctively "second order" character of philosophical reflection. Though Fichte's proposal never caught on as a general name for what was once called "philosophy," it did become the universally acknowledged name for his own distinctive version of transcendental idealism. Here again, it important to keep in mind that "Wissenschaftslehre" is not the name of any particular Fichtean treatise, but is instead the general name for his entire system or project - an allegedly all-encompassing system that consists of a number of interrelated parts or systematic subdisciplines and an overarching project that could and would be expounded in a series of radically different presentations, employing a bewildering variety of systematic vocabularies.
In order to construct any genuine philosophy of freedom, maintained Fichte, the reality of freedom itself must simply be presupposed and thus treated as an incontrovertible "fact of reason" in the Kantian sense. This, of course, is not to deny the possibility of raising skeptical, theoretically grounded objections to such claims; on the contrary, it was the very impossibility of any theoretically satisfactory refutation of skepticism concerning the reality of freedom that led Fichte to affirm the inescapable "primacy of the practical" with respect to the selection of one's philosophical starting point.
To the extent that any proposed first principle of philosophy is supposed to be the first principle of all knowledge and hence of all argument, it clearly cannot be derived from any higher principle and hence cannot be established by any sort of reasoning. Furthermore, Fichte maintained that there are two and only two possible starting points for the philosophical project of "explaining" experience: namely, the concept of pure selfhood (which Fichte associated with pure freedom) and that of pure thinghood (which Fichte associated with utter necessity) -- neither of which can be warranted, qua philosophical starting point, by a direct appeal to experience, and each of which can be arrived at only by a self-conscious act of philosophical abstraction from ordinary experience (within which freedom and necessity, subject and object, are invariably joined as well as distinguished).
The two rival philosophical strategies made possible by these opposed starting points are unforgettably limned by Fichte in his two 1797 "Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre," in which he characterizes the sort of philosophy that begins with the pure I as "idealism" and that which begins with the thing in itself as "dogmatism." Since, according to Fichte's earlier argument in Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre, a unified system of philosophy can have one and only one first principle, and since there are two and only two possible first principles, then it follows that no "mixed" system of idealism/dogmatism is possible. Moreover, since dogmatism, as understood by Fichte, unavoidably implies a strict form of determinism or "intelligible fatalism," whereas idealism is, from the start, committed to the reality of human freedom, it is also practically impossible to reach any sort of "compromise" between two such radically opposed systems.
Though Fichte conceded that neither dogmatism nor idealism could directly refute its opposite and thus recognized that the choice between philosophical starting points could never be resolved on purely theoretical grounds, he nevertheless denied that any dogmatic system, that is to say, any system that commences with the concept of sheer objectivity, could ever succeed in accomplishing what was required of all philosophy. Dogmatism, he argued, could never provide a transcendental deduction of ordinary consciousness, for, in order to accomplish this, it would have to make an illicit leap from the realm of "things" to that of mental events or "representations" [Vorstellungen]. Idealism, in contrast, at least when correctly understood as the kind of Critical idealism that demonstrates that the intellect itself most operate in accordance with certain necessary laws, can -- at least in principle -- accomplish the prescribed task of philosophy and explain our experience of objects ("representations accompanied by a feeling of necessity") in terms of the necessary operations of the intellect itself, and thus without having to make an illicit appeal to things in themselves. To be sure, one cannot decide in advance whether or not any such deduction of experience from the mere concept of free self-consciousness is actually possible. This, Fichte conceded, is something that can be decided only after the construction of the system in question. Until then, it remains a mere hypothesis that the principle of human freedom, for all of its practical certainty, is also the proper starting point for a transcendental account of objective experience.
It must be granted that the truth of the Wissenschaftslehre's starting point cannot be established by any philosophical means, including its utility as a philosophical first principle. On the contrary -- and this is one of Fichte's most characteristic and controversial claims -- one already has to be convinced, on wholly extra-philosophical grounds, of the reality of one's own freedom before one can enter into the chain of deductions and arguments that constitute the Wissenschaftslehre. This is the meaning of Fichte's oft-cited assertion that "the kind of philosophy one chooses depends upon the kind of person one is." The only compelling reason why the transcendental idealist comes to a stop with -- and thus begins his system with -- the proposition that "the I freely posits itself" is therefore not because he is unable to entertain theoretical doubts on this score nor because he is simply unable to continue the process of reflective abstraction. Instead, he appeals to a principle eloquently expressed by Fichte in his essay "On the Basis of Our Belief in a Moral Governance of the World," namely: "I cannot go beyond this standpoint because I am not permitted to do so." It is precisely because the categorical imperative is in this way invoked to secure the first principle of his entire system that Fichte felt entitled to make the rather startling claim that the Wissenschaftslehre is the only system of philosophy that "accords with duty."
The published presentation of the first principles of the Jena Wissenschaftslehre commences with the proposition, "the I posits itself"; more specifically, "the I posits itself as an I." Since this activity of "self-positing" is taken to be the fundamental feature of I-hood in general, the first principle asserts that "the I posits itself as self-positing." Unfortunately, this starting point is somewhat obscured in Part I of the Foundation of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre by a difficult and somewhat forced attempt on Fichte's part to connect this starting point to the logical law of identity, as well as by the introduction of two additional "first principles," corresponding to the logical laws of non-contradiction and sufficient reason. (Significantly, this distraction is eliminated entirely in the 1796/99 Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo, which begins with the simple "postulate" or "summons" to the reader: "think the I, and observe what is involved in doing this.")
"To posit" (setzen) means simply "to be aware of," "to reflect upon," or "to be conscious of"; this term does not imply that the I must simply "creates" its objects of consciousness. The principle in question simply states that the essence of I-hood lies in the assertion of ones own self-identity, i.e., that consciousness presupposes self-consciousness (the Kantian "I think," which must, at least in principle, be able to accompany all our representations). Such immediate self-identify, however, cannot be understood as a psychological "fact," no matter how privileged, nor as an "action" or "accident" of some previously existing substance or being. To be sure, it is an "action" of the I, but one that is identical with the very existence of the same. In Fichte's technical terminology, the original unity of self-consciousness is to be understood as both an action and as the product of the same: as a Tathandlung or "fact/act," a unity that is presupposed by and contained within every fact and every act of empirical consciousness, though it never appears as such therein.
This same "identity in difference" of original self-consciousness might also be described as an "intellectual intuition," inasmuch as it involves the immediate presence of the I to itself, prior to and independently of any sensory content. To be sure, such an "intellectual intuition" never occurs, as such, within empirical consciousness; instead, it must simply be presupposed (that is, "posited") in order to explain the possibility of actual consciousness, within which subject and object are always already distinguished. The occurrence of such an original intellectual intuition is itself inferred, not intuited.
Unfortunately, Fichte confuses matters by sometimes using the term "inner" or "intellectual intuition" to designate something else entirely: namely, the act of philosophical reflection or purified self-observation through which the philosopher becomes conscious of the transcendental conditions for the possibility of ordinary experience -- among which, of course, is the occurrence of the "original" intellectual intuition as a Tathandlung. On other occasions, he employs the term "intellectual intuition" in yet another sense: namely, to designate our direct, practical awareness within everyday life of our moral obligations (categorical imperative qua "real intellectual intuition"). Given the subsequent abuse of this term by Schelling and the romantics, as well as the confusion that one sometimes finds among expositors of Fichte on this issue, it is crucial to recognize systematic ambiguity of the term "intellectual intuition" in Fichte's own writings.
A fundamental corollary of Fichte's understanding of I-hood (Ichheit) as a kind of fact/act is his denial that the I is originally any sort of "thing" or "substance." Instead, the I is simply what it posits itself to be, and thus its "being" is, so to speak, a consequence of its self-positing, or rather, is co-terminus with the same. The first principle of the Jena Wissenschaftslehre is thus equally "practical" and "theoretical," insofar as the act described by this principle is a "doing" as well as a "knowing," a deed as well as a cognition. Thus the problematic unity of theoretical and practical reason is guaranteed from the start, inasmuch as this very unity is a condition for the possibility of self-consciousness.
After establishing the first principle and conceiving the act expressed therein, the philosophical task is then to discover what other acts must necessarily occur as conditions for the possibility of the original, "simply posited," first act and then to do the same for each of these successively discovered acts (or the theorems in which they are formulated). By continuing in this manner, one will, according to Fichte, finally arrive at a complete deduction of the a priori structure of ordinary experience or, what amount to the same thing, a complete inventory of the "original acts of the mind." This is precisely the task of the first or "foundational" portion of the Jena system.
Just as we are never directly aware of the original act of self-positing with which the system commences, so are we also unaware -- except, of course, from the artificial standpoint of philosophical reflection -- of each of these additional "necessary but unconscious" acts that are derived as conditions necessary for the possibility of the originally posited act of self-positing. Furthermore, though we must, due to the discursive character of reflection itself, distinguish each of these acts from the others that it is conditioned by and that are, in turn, conditioned by it, none of these individual acts actually occurs in isolation from all of the others. Transcendental philosophy is thus an effort to analyze what is in fact the single, synthetic act through which the I posits for itself both itself and its world, thereby becoming aware in a single moment of both its freedom and its limitations, its infinity and its finitude. The result of such an analysis is the recognition that, although "the I simply posits itself," its freedom is never "absolute" or "unlimited"; instead, freedom proves to be conceivable -- and hence the I itself proves to be possible -- only as limited and finite. Despite widespread misunderstanding of this point, the Wissenschaftslehre is not a theory of the absolute I. Instead, the conclusion of both the Foundation of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre and of the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo is that the "absolute I" is a mere abstraction and that the only sort of I that can actually exist or act is a finite, empirical, embodied, individual self.
The I must posit itself in order to be an I at all; but it can posit itself only insofar as it posits itself as limited (and hence divided against itself, inasmuch as it also posits itself as unlimited or "absolute"). Moreover, it cannot even posit for itself its own limitations, in the sense of producing or creating these limits. The finite I (the intellect) cannot be the ground of its own passivity. Instead, according to Fichte's analysis, if the I is to posit itself at all, it must simply discover itself to be limited, a discovery that Fichte characterizes as a check or Anstoß to the free, practical activity of the I. Such an original limitation of the I is, however, a limit for the I only insofar as the I posits it as such. I does this, according to Fichte's analysis, by positing its own limitation, first, as a mere "feeling," then as a "sensation," then as an "intuition" of a thing, and finally as a "concept." The Anstoß thus provides the essential occasion or impetus that first sets in motion the entire complex train of activities that finally result in our conscious experience both of ourselves as empirical individuals and of a world of spatio-temporal material objects.
Though this doctrine of the Anstoß may seem to play a role in Fichte's philosophy not unlike that which has sometimes been assigned to the thing in itself in the Kantian system, the fundamental difference is this: the Anstoß is not something foreign to the I. Instead, it denotes the I's original encounter with its own finitude. Rather than claim that the Not-I is the cause or ground of the Anstoß, Fichte argues that the former is posited by the I precisely in order to "explain" to itself the latter, that is, in order to become conscious of the same. Though the Wissenschaftslehre demonstrates that such an Anstoß must occur if self-consciousness is to be actual, transcendental philosophy itself is quite unable to deduce or to explain the actual occurrence of such an Anstoß -- except as a condition for the possibility of consciousness. Accordingly, there are strict limits to what can be expected from any a priori deduction of experience. According to Fichte, transcendental philosophy can explain, for example, why the world has a spatio-temporal character and a causal structure, but it can never explain why objects have the particular sensible properties they happen to have or why I am this determinate individual rather than another. This is something that the I simply has to discover at the same time that it discovers its own freedom, and indeed, as a condition for the latter. (It must be admitted, however, that Fichte's own ambitious descriptions of his project sometimes obscure the essential limits of the same and that he sometimes gives his readers the false impression that the Wissenschaftslehre proposes to provide a complete a priori deduction of all the empirical details of experience. This however is certainly not the case.)
Despite this important stricture on the scope of transcendental philosophy, there remains much that can be demonstrated within the foundational portion of the Wissenschaftslehre. For example, it can be show that the I could not become conscious of its own limits in the manner required for the possibility of any self-consciousness unless it also possessed an original and spontaneous ability to synthesize the finite and the infinite. In this sense, the Wissenschaftslehre deduces the power of productive imagination as an original power of the mind. Similarly, it can be shown that the I could not be "checked" in the manner required for the possibility of consciousness unless it possessed, in addition to its original "theoretical" power of productive imaginative, an equally original "practical" power of sheer willing, which, once "checked," is immediately converted into a capacity for endless striving. The foundational portion of the Wissenschaftslehre thus also includes a deduction of the categorical imperative (albeit in a particularly abstract and morally empty form) and of the practical power of the I. For Fichte, therefore, "the primacy of the practical" means not simply that philosophy must recognize a certain autonomous sphere within which practical reason is efficacious and practical considerations are appropriate; instead, it implies something much stronger: namely, the recognition that, as Fichte puts it, "the practical power is the innermost root of the I" and thus that "our freedom itself is a theoretical determining principle of our world." The Wissenschaftslehre as a whole can therefore be described as a massive effort to demonstrate that reason could not be theoretical if it were not also practical -- at the same time, to be sure, that also demonstrates that reason could not be practical if were not also theoretical.
Freedom, according to Fichte's argument, is possible and actual only within the context of limitation and necessity, and thus it is never "absolute," but always limited and finite. On the other hand, just as surely as a free subject must posit its freedom "absolutely" -- that is to say, purely and simply (schlechthin) and "for no reason" whatsoever -- so must it never identify itself with any determinate or limited state of its own being. On the contrary, a finite free self must constantly strive to transform both the natural and the human worlds in accordance with its own freely-posited goals. The sheer unity of the self, which was posited as the starting point of the Foundations, is thereby transformed into an idea of reason in the Kantian sense: the actual I is always finite and divided against itself, and hence it is always striving for a sheer self-determinacy that it never achieves. Between the original abstraction of pure selfhood as sheer Tathandlung and the concluding (necessary) idea of a self that is only what it determines itself to be, in which "is" and "ought" wholly coincide, lies the entire realm of actual consciousness and real human experience.
Having established the foundation of his new system, Fichte then turned to the task of constructing upon this foundation a fully-articulated transcendental system, the overall structure of which is most clearly outlined in the concluding section of the transcripts of his lectures on Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo. According to this plan, which has no analog in Fichte's later writings, the Entire Wissenschaftslehre is to consisting of four, systematically interrelated parts:: (1) first philosophy, which corresponds to the "foundational" portion of the system, as presented in the Foundation of the entire Wissenschaftslehre and revised in the lectures on Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo; (2)"theoretical philosophy" or "philosophy of nature," (3) "practical philosophy" or ethics (corresponding to the content of the System of Ethics); and (4) "philosophy of the postulates," which includes the subdisciplines of "natural law" or "theory of right" (as expounded in the Foundation of Natural Right) and philosophy of religion.
By "philosophy of nature," Fichte seems to have had in mind something similar to Kant's Metaphysical First Principles of Nature, though Fichte himself devoted very little attention to the execution of such a project. The closest he ever came to developing a philosophy of nature according to transcendental principles is the compressed account of space, time, and matter presented in the Outline of the Distinctive Character of the Wissenschaftslehre with Respect to the Theoretical Faculty and the lectures on Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo. In neither of these works, however, does he make any effort to distinguish rigorously between the "theoretical" aspect of the foundational portion of his system and a distinctively "theoretical" subdivision of the same ("philosophy of nature"). In fact, a "philosophy of nature in accordance with the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre" turns out to me even more modest than Kant's and more closely resembles what later came to be called the philosophy of (natural) science than it does the speculative Naturphilosophie of Schelling and Hegel. Indeed, disagreement concerning the compatibility of a rigorously transcendental philosophy with a speculative, a priori "philosophy of nature" was the very issue that precipitated the rift between Fichte and his erstwhile disciple, Schelling. The popular picture of Fichte's attitude toward nature, namely, that he viewed the latter almost entirely from the perspective of human projects, that is, as the necessary realm for moral striving, is therefore very close to the truth.
In contrast to Fichte's rather cursory treatment of purely theoretical philosophy, ethics or "practical philosophy," which analyzes the determinate ways in which willing and acting are determinable by principles of pure reason, constitutes a major portion of the Jena system, and the System of Ethics is Fichte's longest single book. Whereas theoretical philosophy explains how the world necessarily is, practical philosophy explains how the world ought to be, which is to say, how it ought to be altered by rational beings. Ethics thus considers the object of consciousness not as something given or even as something constructed by necessary laws of consciousness, but rather as something to be produced by a freely acting subject, consciously striving to establish and to accomplish its own goals and guided only by its own self-legislated laws. The specific task of Fichte's ethics is therefore, first of all, to deduce the categorical imperative (in its distinctively moral sense) from the general obligation to determine oneself freely, and, second, to deduce from this the particular obligations that apply to every free and finite rational being.
Like all of Fichte's systematic treatises of the Jena period, The System of Ethics begins with a detailed analysis of what is involved in the self-positing of the I. In this case, the focus is upon the necessity that the I posit for itself its own activity or "efficacy," and upon a detailed analysis of the conditions for doing this. In this manner Fichte deduces what he calls "the principle of all practical philosophy," viz., that something objective (a being) follows from something subjective (a concept), and hence that the I must ascribe to itself a power of free purposiveness or causality in the sensible world. The I must posit itself as an embodied will, and only as such does it "discover" itself at all. From this starting point Fichte then proceeds to a deduction of the principle of morality: namely, that I must think of my freedom as standing under a certain necessary law or categorical imperative, which Fichte calls "the law of self-sufficiency" or "autonomy," and that I ought always to determine my freedom in accordance with this law. This, therefore, is the task of the philosophical science of "ethics," as understood by Fichte: to provide an a priori deduction of our moral nature in general and of our specific duties as human beings.
Viewed from the perspective of practical philosophy, the world really is nothing more than what Fichte once described as "the material of our duty made sensible," which is precisely the viewpoint adopted by the morally engaged, practically striving subject. On the other hand, this is not the only way the world can be viewed, and, more specifically, it is not the only way in which it is construed by transcendental philosophy. For this reason it is somewhat misleading to characterized the Wissenschaftslehre as a whole as a system of "ethical idealism." As noted above, Fichte certainly does succeed in constructing an account of consciousness that fully integrates the imperatives and activities of practical reason into the very structure of the latter, but this integration is always balanced by a recognition of the constitutive role of theoretical reason and of the sheer, contingent "giveness" of the I's original determinacy (doctrine of the Anstoß).
The final portion of the Jena system is devoted to "the philosophy of the postulates," a discipline that Fichte conceived of as occupying the middle ground between purely theoretical and purely practical philosophy. In this portion of the system the world is considered neither as it simply is nor as it simply ought to be; instead, the moral world is itself considered from the perspective of the natural world (that is, one considers the postulates that theoretical reason addresses to the practical realm) or else, alternatively, the natural world is considered from the perspective of the moral law (that is, one considers the postulates that practical reason addresses to the realm of theory). The first of these perspectives is that of juridical philosophy or philosophy of law, or what Fichte calls the "doctrine of right" (Rechtslehre); the latter is that of the philosophy of religion.
Fichte's philosophy of right (or of "natural law"), as expounded in his Foundation of Natural Right, is one of the most original and influential portions of the Jena Wissenschaftslehre. Written prior to Kant's treatment of the same topic (in Part One of the Metaphysics of Morals), Fichte's philosophy of right is notable, first of all, because of the way in which it distinguishes sharply between the realm of ethics and that of "right" and tries to develop a complete theory of the latter (a "theory of justice") without appealing to the categorical imperative or the moral law, and secondly, because of the inclusion within this theory of a thoroughly original "deduction" of the social character of human beings.
Fichte's transcendental account of natural right proceeds from the general principle that the I must posit itself as an individual in order to posit itself at all, and that in order to posit itself as an individual it must recognize itself as "summoned" or "solicited" by another free individual -- summoned, that is, to limit its own freedom out of respect for that of the freedom of the other. The same condition applies, of course, to the other; hence, mutual recognition of rational individuals turns out to be condition necessary for the possibility of I-hood in general. This a priori deduction of intersubjectivity is so central to the conception of selfhood developed in the Jena Wissenschaftslehre that Fichte, in his lectures on Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo, incorporated it into his revised presentation of the very foundations of his system, where the "summons" takes its place alongside "original feeling" (which takes the place of the earlier "check") as both a limit upon the absolute freedom of the I and a condition for the positing of the same.
The specific task of Fichte's theory of right is to consider the specific ways in which the freedom of each individual must be restricted in order that several individuals can live together with the maximum amount of mutual freedom, and it derives its a priori concepts of the laws of social interaction entirely from the sheer concept of an individual I, as conditions for the possibility of the latter. Fichte's concept of right therefore obtains its binding force not from the ethical law, but rather from the general laws of thinking and from enlightened self-interest, and the force of such considerations is hypothetical rather than categorical. The theory of right examines how the freedom of each individual must be externally limited if a free society of free and equal individuals is to be possible.
Unlike Kant, Fichte does not treat political philosophy merely as a subdivision of moral theory. On the contrary, it is an independent philosophical discipline with a topic and a priori principles of its own. Whereas ethics analyzes the concept of what is demanded of a freely willing subject, the theory of right describes what such a subject is permitted to do (as well as what he can rightfully be coerced to do). Whereas ethics is concerned with the inner world of conscience, the theory of right is concerned only with the external, public realm, though only insofar as the latter can be viewed as an embodiment of freedom.
Having established the general, albeit hypothetical concept of right, Fichte then turns to an investigation of the conditions necessary for the realization or "application" of the same: that is, for the actual coexistence of free individuals, or the existence of a free society. The sum of these "conditions" constitute the sum of our "natural rights" as human beings, rights that can be instantiated and guaranteed only within a deliberately constructed free society. On purely a priori grounds, therefore, Fichte purports to be able to determine the general requirements of such a community and the sole justification for legitimate political coercion and obligation.
The precise relationship of Fichte's theory of right to the social contract tradition is complex, but the general outline is as follows: Fichte presents an a priori argument for the fundamentally social character of human beings, an argument grounded upon an analysis of the very structure of self-consciousness and the requirements for self-posting. Only after this "deduction" of the concept of right and of the applicability of the same does he explicitly introduce the notion of what he calls the Staatsbürgervertrag or "citizens' contract," a notion that he goes on to analyze into a series of distinguishable moments, including the "civil contract" proper (or "property contract"), the "protection contract," and the "contract of unification," all of which must be supplemented by the contracts of "subjection" and "expiation." Fichte thus propounds what one might call a "contract theory of the state," but not of human community.
As numerous commentators, beginning with Hegel, whose own Philosophy of Right was strongly influenced, both positively and negatively, by Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right, have pointed out, the actual theory of the state that Fichte himself, in Part Two of that work, erected upon what would appear to be a rather "liberal" theoretical foundation contains many elements that are not usually associated with the individualistic, liberal tradition -- including a general indifference to questions of constitutional structure, public participation in government, etc., and a strong emphasis upon the "police" functions of the state (functions which, for Fichte, were not limited to concerns of security, but also included those of social welfare). This, however, is not particularly surprising, since the function of the state in Fichte's system is primarily to employ coercion to guarantee that the parties to the contract will, in fact, do what they have promised to do and to insure that every citizen will have an opportunity to realize his own (limited) freedom. One of the more remarkable features of Fichte's conception of right is that every citizen is entitled to the full and productive employment of his labor, and hence that the state has a duty to manage the economy accordingly. The truth is that Fichte's social and political theory is very difficulty to fit into the usual categories, but combines certain elements usually associated with liberal individualism with others more commonly associated with communitarian statism.
In addition to the postulates addressed by theoretical to practical reason, there are also those addressed by practical reason to nature itself. The latter is the domain of the transcendental philosophy of religion, which is concerned solely with the question of the extent to which the realm of nature can be said to accommodate itself to the aims of morality. The questions dealt with within such a philosophy of religion are those concerning the nature, limits, and legitimacy of our belief in divine providence. The philosophy of religion, as conceived by Fichte, his nothing to do with the historical claims of revealed religion or with particular religious traditions and practices. Indeed, this is precisely the distinction between philosophy of religion and "theology."
As noted above, Fichte never had a chance to develop this final subdivision of his Jena system, beyond the tentative foray into this domain represented by his controversial essay "Concerning the Basis of Our Belief in a Divine Governance of the World" and the works he contributed to the ensuing "atheism controversy." In "Concerning the Basis of our Belief" he certainly seems to contend that, so far as philosophy is concerned, the realm of the divine is that of this world, albeit viewed in terms of the requirements of the moral law, in which case it is transformed from the natural to the "the moral world order," and that no further inference to a transcendent "moral lawgiver" is theoretically or practically required or warranted. In this same essay Fichte also sought to draw a sharp distinction between religion and philosophy (a distinction parallel to the crucial distinction between the "ordinary" and "transcendental" standpoints) and to defend philosophy's right to postulate, on purely a priori grounds, something like a "moral world order." Philosophy of religion thus includes a deduction of the postulate that our moral actions really do make some difference in the world. But this is about as far as it can go.
With respect to the existence of God, the argument of Fichte's essay is primarily negative, inasmuch as it explicitly denies that any postulate of the existence of a God independent of the moral law is justifiable on philosophical grounds. In the wake of the atheism controversy, Fichte returned to this subject and, in his "From a Private Letter" and in Part Three of The Vocation of Man, attempted to restate his position in a manner that at least appeared to be more compatible with the claims of theism.
For much of the nineteenth century, beginning with Hegel's self-serving interpretation of the history of modern philosophy, Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre was generally assimilated into the larger history of Germany idealism. Criticized by both Schelling and Hegel as a one-sided, "subjective" idealism and a prime instance of the "philosophy of reflection," Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre was almost universally treated as a superceded rung on the ladder "from Kant to Hegel" and thus assigned a purely historical significance. Neglected as the Wissenschaftslehre may have been during this period, Fichte was not entirely forgotten, but remained influential as the author of the Addresses to the German Nation and was alternately hailed and vilified as one of the founders of modern pan-German nationalism.
This same situation prevailed throughout much of the twentieth century as well, during which Fichte's fortune seemed closely tied to that of Germany. Particularly during the long periods preceding, during, and following the two World Wars, Fichte was discussed almost exclusively in the context of German politics and national identity, and his technical philosophy tended to be dismissed as a monstrous or comical speculative aberration of no relevance whatsoever to contemporary philosophy. There were, to be sure, isolated exceptions and authors such as Fritz Medicus, Martial Gueroult, Xavier Léon, and Max Wundt who, during the first half of the twentieth century, took Fichte seriously as a philosopher and made lasting contributions to the study of his thought. But the real boom in Fichte studies has come only in the past four decades, during which the Wissenschaftslehre has once again become the object of intense philosophical scrutiny and lively, world-wide discussion -- as is evidenced by the establishment of large and active professional societies devoted to Fichte in Europe, Japan, and North America.
J. H. Stirling once quipped that "Fichte had two philosophical epochs; and if both belong to biography, only one belongs to history," and until quite recently there was a great deal of truth to this observation. Indeed, even today, Fichte's technical writings of the post-Jena period remain little-known to the vast majority of philosophers. Admittedly, it is hard to recognize these late texts -- which drop the strategy of beginning with an analysis of the self, along with the strong emphasis upon the "primacy of the practical," and which include unembarrassed references to "the absolute" and even to "absolute being" -- as the work of the same author who wrote the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre. Though Fichte himself always insisted that his basic philosophy remained the same, no matter how much his presentation thereof may have altered over the years, many sympathetic readers and not a few well-informed scholars have found it impossible to reconcile this claim with what at least appear to be the profound systematic and doctrinal differences between the "early" and "late" Wissenschaftslehre. It is therefore not surprising that the problematic "unity" of Fichte's thought continues to be vigorously debated by experts in the field.
Whatever one may conclude concerning the relationship between Fichte's earlier and later writings, it is certainly the case that, with the publication of numerous, faithfully edited "new" manuscripts of later versions of the Wissenschaftslehre, the focus of much of the best contemporary Fichte scholarship has shifted to his later texts, most of which were entirely unknown to earlier generations of readers. Seldom has a new edition of a philosopher's literary corpus had a greater effect upon the contemporary reputation of the thinker in question or a more stimulating effect upon contemporary scholarship than in the case of the monumental new critical edition of Fichte's works begun in the early nineteen-sixties under the auspices of the Bavarian Academy of the Sciences and the general editorship of Reinhard Lauth and others. Now nearing completion, this edition has contributed directly and enormously to the contemporary revival of interest in Fichte's philosophy in general, and in the later versions of the Wissenschaftslehre in particular. Much of the best recent work on Fichte, particularly in Germany, Italy, and Japan, has been devoted exclusively to his later thought. Stirling's observation is thus no longer true, inasmuch as the work of Fichte's "second epoch" has, however belatedly, now become the object of genuine and lively philosophical discussion and dispute.
In contrast, anglophone Fichte scholarship, which has also experienced quite a renaissance of its own over the past few decades, has remained largely focused upon the "classical" texts of the Jena period. This is no doubt due, in large part at least, to the appearance, during these same decades, of new, reliable translations of almost all of Fichte's early writings and the lack of translations of his later, unpublished texts. But it is also a reflection of the relatively anemic tradition of Fichte scholarship in England and North America, where even the early Wissenschaftslehre has long been neglected and underappreciated. Until quite recently, virtually no scholars writing in English were interested in examining the Wissenschaftslehre in its own right, but were mainly concerned to determine Fichte's position in relationship to Kant's or Hegel's. This situation, however, has fundamentally altered, and some of the most insightful and original current work on Fichte is being done in English.
Table of Contents
First published: August 30, 2001
Content last modified: August 30, 2001