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James hints at his religious concerns in his earliest essays and in The Principles, but they become more explicit in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (1897), Human Immortality: Two Supposed Objections to the Doctrine (1898), The Varieties of Religious Experience (1902) and A Pluralistic Universe (1909). James oscillated between thinking that a "study in human nature" such as Varieties could contribute to a "Science of Religion" and the belief that religious experience involves an altogether supernatural domain, somehow inaccessible to science but accessible to the individual human subject. James made some of his most important philosophical contributions in the last decade of his life. In a burst of writing in 1904-5 (collected in Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912)) he set out the metaphysical view most commonly known as "neutral monism," according to which there is one fundamental "stuff" which is neither material nor mental. He also published Pragmatism (1907), the culminating expression of a set of views permeating his writings.
James's discussion of Herbert Spencer broaches what will turn out to be characteristic Jamesean themes: the importance of religion and the passions, the variety of human responses to life, and the idea that we help to "create" the truths that we "register" (E, 21). Taking up Spencer's view that the adjustment of the organism to the environment is the basic feature of mental evolution, James charges that Spencer projects his own vision of what ought to be onto the phenomena he claims to describe. Survival, James asserts, is merely one of many interests human beings have: "The social affections, all the various forms of play, the thrilling intimations of art, the delights of philosophic contemplation, the rest of religious emotion, the joy of moral self-approbation, the charm of fancy and of wit -- some or all of these are absolutely required to make the notion of mere existence tolerable;..." (E, 13). We are all teleological creatures at base, James holds, each with his or her or own a priori values and categories. Spencer, then, "merely takes sides with the telos he happens to prefer" (E, 18).
James's fundamental empiricism is expressed in the claim that these values and categories fight it out in the course of human experience, that their conflicts "can only be solved ambulando, and not by any a priori definition." The "formula which proves to have the most massive destiny," he concludes, "will be the true one" (E, 17). Yet James wishes to defend his sense that any such formulation will be determined as much by a freely-acting human mind as by the world, a position he would later (in Pragmatism) call "humanism": "there belongs to mind, from its birth upward, a spontaneity, a vote. It is in the game, and not a mere looker-on; and its judgments of the should-be, its ideals, cannot be peeled off from the body of the cogitandum as if they were excrescences..." (E, 21).
"The Sentiment of Rationality" (1879, 82)
This essay was first published in Mind in 1879; a second part appeared in the Princeton Review in 1882. Both parts were used to construct the essay of this title published in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (1897). Although he never quite says that rationality is a sentiment, James holds that a sentiment -- really a set of sentiments -- is a "mark" of rationality. The philosopher, James writes, will recognize the rationality of a conception "as he recognizes everything else, by certain subjective marks with which it affects him. When he gets the marks, he may know that he has got the rationality." These marks include a "strong feeling of ease, peace, rest" (WB 57), and a "feeling of the sufficiency of the present moment, of its absoluteness" (WB 58). "Fluid" thinking, whether logical or cosmological, is said to produce the sentiment, as when we learn that the "the balloon rises by the same law whereby the stone sinks" (WB 59). However, balancing the "passion for parsimony" (WB 58) such unifications satisfy is a passion for distinguishing: a "loyalty to clearness and integrity of perception, dislike of blurred outlines, of vague identifications" (WB 59). The ideal philosopher is a blend of these two passions of rationality, and James thinks that even some great philosophers go too far in one direction or another. Spinoza's unity of all things in one substance is "barren,"; and so is Hume's "looseness and separateness of everything..." (WB 60).
Sentiments of rationality operate not just in logic or science, but in ordinary life. When we first move into a room, for example, "we do not know what draughts may blow in upon our back, what doors may open, what forms may enter, what interesting objects may be found in cupboards and corners." These uncertainties, minor as they may be, act as "mental irritant[s]" (WB 67-8), which disappear when we know our way around the room and come to "feel at home" there. These feelings of confident expectation, of knowing how certain things will turn out, are another form of the sentiment of rationality.
James begins the second part of his essay by considering the case when "two conceptions [are] equally fit to satisfy the logical demand" for fluency or unification. In such a case, one must consider a "practical" component of rationality: "the one which awakens the active impulses, or satisfies other aesthetic demands better than the other, will be accounted the more rational conception, and will deservedly prevail" (WB 66). James here puts the point as one of psychology -- a prediction of what will prevail -- but he also evaluates it, for it will prevail "deservedly." James rejects reductive materialism because it denies to "our most intimate powers...all relevancy in universal affairs" (WB 71), and hence fails to activate these impulses or satisfy these demands.
As in his essay on Spencer, James continues to explore the relations between the temperament that forms the philosopher's outlook and the outlook itself: "Idealism will be chosen by a man of one emotional constitution, materialism by another." James's empathetic understanding extends to both: idealism offers a sense of intimacy with the universe, the feeling that ultimately I "am all." But people of contrasting temperaments find in idealism "a narrow, close, sick-room air," leaving out an element of danger, contingency and wildness -- "the rough, harsh, sea-wave, north-wind element" (WB 75). Both the intimacy and the wildness answer to propensities, passions, and powers in human beings. Although James has his criticisms of reductive materialisms, he understands -- from the inside as it were -- some of the materialistic passion. Those with a materialistic temperament, he writes, "sicken at a life wholly constituted of intimacy," and have a desire "to escape personality, to revel in the action of forces that have no respect for our ego, to let the tides flow, even though they flow over us." The "strife" of these two forms of "mental temper," James predicts, will always be seen in philosophy (WB 76). Certainly they are always seen in the philosophy of William James.
The rhythm of a lost word may be there without a sound to clothe it....Everyone must know the tantalizing effect of the blank rhythm of some forgotten verse, restlessly dancing in one's mind, striving to be filled out with words (PP 244).In this last quotation, James tackles a philosophical problem from a psychological perspective. Although he refrains from answering the question of whether these "responses" are in fact deep organs of communication with the nature of things -- reporting only that they seem to us to be so -- in his later writings, such as Varieties of Religious Experience, and A Pluralistic Universe, he confesses, and to some degree defends, his belief that the question should be answered affirmatively.
Our father and mother, our wife and babes, are bone of our bone and flesh of our flesh. When they die, a part of our very selves is gone. If they do anything wrong, it is our shame. If they are insulted, our anger flashes forth as readily as if we stood in their place. (PP 280).
There is an excitement during the crying fit which is not without a certain pungent pleasure of its own; but it would take a genius for felicity to discover any dash of redeeming quality in the feeling of dry and shrunken sorrow (PP, p. 1061).
"Will you or won't you have it so?" is the most probing question we are ever asked; we are asked it every hour of the day, and about the largest as well as the smallest, the most theoretical as well as the most practical, things. We answer by consents or non-consents and not by words. What wonder that these dumb responses should seem our deepest organs of communication with the nature of things! (PP, p. 1182).
In the deservedly famous chapter on "The Stream of Thought" James takes himself to be offering a richer account of experience than those of traditional empiricists such as Hume. He believes relations, vague fringes, and tendencies are as experienced directly (he would later label this fact part of his "radical empiricism.") Rather than a succession of "ideas," James finds a stream, the waters of which blend; and where, because of its position in the flow, each situation is unique. Our consciousness -- or, as he prefers to call it sometimes, our "sciousness" -- , is "steeped and dyed" in the waters of sciousness or thought that surround it. Our psychic life not only has edges, it has rhythm: it is a series of transitions and resting-places, of "flights and perchings" (PP 236). We rest when we remember the name we have been searching for; and we are off again when we hear a noise that might be the baby waking from her nap.
Interest -- and its close relative, attention -- is a major component not only of James's psychology, but of the epistemology and metaphysics that seep into his discussion. A thing, James states in "The Stream of Thought," is a group of qualities "which happen practically or aesthetically to interest us, to which we therefore give substantive names.... (PP 274). And reality "means simply relation to our emotional and active life...whatever excites and stimulates our interest is real " (PP 924).
Our capacity for attention to one thing rather than another is for James the sign of an "active element in all consciousness,...a spiritual something...which seems to go out to meet these qualities and contents, whilst they seem to come in to be received by it." (PP 285). This "spiritual something" is the target of another passage from James's chapter on "Attention," where he speaks of "a star performer" or "original psychic force" which takes the form not of mere attention, but of "the effort to attend." According to James's revisionary account of freedom, we are mostly not free, but we achieve freedom in cases which settle, for a while, the direction or orientation of our lives. In these cases we feel the "sting and excitement of our voluntary life," and we sense that "things are really being decided..." (PP, 429). Faced with the tension between scientific determinism and our belief in our own freedom or autonomy, James restricts the claims of science, which "must be constantly reminded that her purposes are not the only purposes, and that the order of uniform causation which she has use for, and is therefore right in postulating, may be enveloped in a wider order, on which she has no claims at all" (PP, 1179).
The Principles thus encompasses several metaphysical and methodological stances. James often writes as a scientist, as befits his education in biology and medicine. The second and third chapters are entitled "The Functions of the Brain" and "On Some General Conditions of Brain Activity." James alleges that habit, the subject of the fourth chapter, is "at bottom a physical principle" (PP 110). Yet, James presents himself -- as in his title -- as a psychologist, not as a physiologist. The method of the psychologist "first last and always" is introspection, which sometimes reveals a personal, traditionally subjective stream of thought, but which, as practiced by James, anticipates phenomenology in its pursuit of a more "pure" description of the stream of thought that does not presuppose it to be mental or material. One such passage concerns a
child newly born in Boston, who gets a sensation from the candle-flame which lights the bedroom, or from his diaper-pin [who] does not feel either of these objects to be situated in longitude 71 W. and latitude 42 N.....The flame fills its own place, the pain fills its own place; but as yet these places are neither identified with, nor discriminated from, any other places. That comes later. For the places thus first sensibly known are elements of the child's space-world which remain with him all his life" (PP 681-2).This passage, taking off from sensations, is rooted in James's empiricism, but it operates as a counter to traditional empiricism, for which "all our sensations at first appear to us as subjective or internal, and are afterwards and by a special act on our part extradited or projected so as to appear located in an outer world" (PP 678). In contrast, James's view is that the outer and inner worlds are later constructions from the original data of consciousness -- which are neither objective nor subjective. This psychological view anticipates James's late metaphysical "pure experience" account, published in Essays in Radical Empiricism.
Two noteworthy chapters late in The Principles are entitled "The Emotions" and "Will." The first sets out the theory -- also enunciated by the Danish physiologist Carl Lange -- that emotion follows, rather than causes, its bodily expression: "Common-sense says, we lose our fortune, are sorry and weep; we meet a bear, are frightened and run; we are insulted by a rival, are angry and strike. The hypothesis here to be defended says that this order of sequence is incorrect...that we feel sorry because we cry, angry because we strike, afraid because we tremble....." (PP, pp. 1065-6). The significance of this view, according to James, is that our emotions are tied in with our bodily expressions. What, he asks, would grief be "without its tears, its sobs, its suffocation of the heart, its pang in the breast-bone?" Not an emotion, James answers, for a "purely disembodied human emotion is a nonentity" (PP 1068). As Wittgenstein was to suggest, the human body may be "the best picture of the human soul" (Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, New York, Macmillan, 1968, p. 178).
In his chapter on "Will" James opposes the theory of his contemporary Wilhelm Wundt that there is one special feeling -- a "feeling of innervation" -- present in all intentional action. In his survey of a range of cases, James finds that some actions involve an act of resolve or of outgoing nervous energy, but others do not. For example:
I sit at table after dinner and find myself from time to time taking nuts or raisins out of the dish and eating them. My dinner properly is over, and in the heat of the conversation I am hardly aware of what I do; but the perception of the fruit, and the fleeting notion that I may eat it, seem fatally to bring the act about. There is certainly no express fiat here;..." (PP 1131).The chapter on "Will" also contains striking passages that anticipate the concerns of The Varieties of Religious Experience: about moods, "changes of heart," and "awakenings of conscience." These, James observes, may affect the "whole scale of values of our motives and impulses (PP 1140).
In science, James notes, we can afford to await the outcome of investigation before coming to a belief. The cases of belief formation and justification to which James draws attention in "The Will to Believe" are, in contrast, "forced" -- we must come to some belief even if all the relevant evidence is not in. If I am on a mountain trail, faced with an icy ledge to cross, and do not know whether I can make it, I may be forced to consider the question whether I can or should believe that I can cross the ledge. This is a "momentous" question: if I am wrong I may fall to my death, and if I believe rightly that I can cross the ledge, my holding of the belief may itself contribute to my success. In such a case, James asserts, I have the "right to believe" -- precisely because such a belief may help bring about the fact believed in. This is a case "where a fact cannot come at all unless a preliminary faith exists in its coming" (WB 25).
James applies his analysis to religious belief, particularly to the possible case in which one's salvation depends on believing in God in advance of any proof that God exists. In such a case the belief may be justified by the outcome to which having the belief leads. James also takes his analysis outside of the religious domain, to a wide range of secular human life:
A social organism of any sort is what it is because each member proceeds to his own duty with a trust that the other members will simultaneously do theirs.... A government, an army, a commercial system, a ship, a college, an athletic team, all exist on this condition, without which not only is nothing achieved, but nothing is even attempted (WB, 24).James tries to justify the systems of "trust" on which society's beliefs and actions are based. Yet at the same time there is an intensely personal, even existential, tone to his essay, epitomized by James's appeal near the end to "respect one another's mental freedom," and by his concluding citation of Fitz James Stephen's statement that "In all important transactions of life we have to take a leap in the dark...."( WB 31).
Another essay in the collection, "Reflex Action and Theism," attempts a reconciliation of science and religion. By "reflex action" James understands the biological picture of the organism as responding to sensations with a series of actions. Human beings and other higher animals have evolved a theoretical or thinking stage between the sensation and the action, and it is here that God comes up, at least for human beings. James holds that the thought of God is a natural human response to the universe, regardless of whether we can prove that God exists. God will be, as James puts it, the "centre of gravity of all attempts to solve the riddle of life" (WB, 116). James ends the essay by advocating a "theism" that posits "an ultimate opacity in things, a dimension of being which escapes our theoretic control" (WB, 143).
The Will to Believe also contains James's most developed account of morality, "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life." Morality for James rests on sentience -- without it there are no moral claims and no moral obligations. But once sentience exists, a claim is made, and morality gets "a foothold in the universe" (WB 198). Although James insists that there is no common essence to morality, he does find a guiding principle for ethical philosophy in the principle that we "satisfy at all times as many demands as we can" (WB, 205). This satisfaction is to be arrived at by working towards a "richer universe...the good which seems most organizable, most fit to enter into complex combinations, most apt to be a member of a more inclusive whole" (WB, 210). We arrive at laws and moral formulations by a kind of "experiment," James holds. (WB, 206). By such experiments, we have liberated ourselves for the most part from slavery and "arbitrary royal power" (WB, 205). But there is nothing final about the results: "as our present laws and customs have fought and conquered other past ones, so they will in their turn be overthrown by any newly discovered order which will hush up the complaints that they still give rise to, without producing others louder still" (WB, 206).
James sets out a central distinction of the book in early chapters on "The Religion of Healthy-Mindedness" and "The Sick Soul." The healthy-minded religious person -- Walt Whitman is one of James's main examples -- has a deep sense of "the goodness of life," (79) and a soul of "sky-blue tint" (80). Healthy-mindedness can be involuntary, just natural to someone, but often comes in more willful forms. Liberal Christianity, for example, represents the triumph of a resolute devotion to healthy-mindedness over a morbid "old hell-fire theology" (91). James also cites the "mind-cure movement" of Mary Baker Eddy, for whom "evil is simply a lie, and any one who mentions it is a liar" (107). This remark allows us to draw the contrast with the religion of "The Sick Soul," for whom evil cannot be eliminated. From the perspective of the sick soul, "radical evil gets its innings" (163). No matter how secure one may feel, the sick soul finds that "[u]nsuspectedly from the bottom of every fountain of pleasure, as the old poet said, something bitter rises up: a touch of nausea, a falling dead of the delight, a whiff of melancholy...." These states are not simply unpleasant sensations, for they bring "a feeling of coming from a deeper region and often have an appalling convincingness" (136). James's main examples here are Leo Tolstoy's "My Confession," John Bunyan's autobiography, and a report of terrifying "dread" -- allegedly from a French correspondent but actually from James himself. Some sick souls never get well, while others recover or even triumph: these are "twice-born." In chapters on "The Divided Self, and the Process of Its Unification" and on "Conversion," James discusses St. Augustine, Henry Alline, Bunyan, Tolstoy, and a range of popular evangelists, focusing on what he calls "the state of assurance" (241) they achieve. Central to this state is "the loss of all the worry, the sense that all is ultimately well with one, the peace, the harmony, the willingness to be, even though the outer conditions should remain the same" (248).
Varieties' classic chapter on "Mysticism" offers "four marks which, when an experience has them, may justify us in calling it mystical..." (380). The first is ineffability: "it defies expression...its quality must be directly experienced; it cannot be imparted or transferred to others." Second is a "noetic quality": mystical states present themselves as states of knowledge. Thirdly, mystical states are transient; and, fourth, subjects are passive with respect to them: they cannot control their coming and going. Are these states, James ends the chapter by asking, "windows through which the mind looks out upon a more extensive and inclusive world[?]" (428).
In chapters entitled "Philosophy" -- devoted in large part to pragmatism -- and "Conclusions," James finds that religious experience is on the whole useful, even "amongst the most important biological functions of mankind," but he concedes that this does not make it true. James articulates his own belief -- which he does not claim to prove -- that religious experiences connect us with a greater, or further, reality not accessible in our normal cognitive relations to the world: "The further limits of our being plunge, it seems to me, into an altogether other dimension of existence from the sensible and merely understandable world" (515).
James first announced his commitment to pragmatism in a lecture given at Berkeley in 1898, entitled "Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results." Other sources for Pragmatism were lectures given at Wellesley College in 1905, and at the Lowell Institute and Columbia University in 1906 and 1907. Pragmatism emerges in James's book as five things: a philosophical temperament, a theory of truth, a theory of meaning, a holistic account of knowledge, and a method of resolving philosophical disputes.
The pragmatic temperament appears in the book's opening chapter, where James classifies philosophers according to their tough-or tender-mindedness. The pragmatist is a mediator like James himself, someone with "scientific loyalty to facts" as well as "the old confidence in human values and the resultant spontaneity, whether of the religious or romantic type" (P, 17). The method of resolving disputes and the theory of meaning are on display in James's discussion of an argument about whether a man chasing a squirrel around a tree goes around the squirrel too. Taking meaning as the "conceivable effects of a practical kind the object may involve," the pragmatist philosopher finds that two "practical" meanings of "go around" are in play: either the man goes North, East, South, and West of the squirrel, or he faces first the squirrel's head, then one of his sides, then his tail, then his other side. "Make the distinction," James writes, "and there is no occasion for any further dispute."
The pragmatic theory of truth is the subject of the book's sixth (and to some degree its second) chapter. Truth, James holds, is "a species of the good," like health. Truths are goods because we can "ride" on them into the future without being unpleasantly surprised. They "lead us into useful verbal and conceptual quarters as well as directly up to useful sensible termini. They lead to consistency, stability and flowing human intercourse. They lead away from excentricity and isolation, from foiled and barren thinking" (103). James holds that truths are "made" (104) in the course of human experience; yet although they live for the most part "on a credit system" in that they are not currently being verified by most of those who have them, "beliefs verified concretely by somebody are the posts of the whole superstructure" (P, 100).
James's chapter on "Pragmatism and Humanism" sets out James's voluntaristic epistemology. "We carve out everything," he states, "just as we carve out constellations, to serve our human purposes" (P, 100). Nevertheless, he recognizes "resisting factors in every experience of truth-making" (P, 117), including not only our present sensations or experiences but the whole body of our prior beliefs. James holds neither that we create our truths out of nothing, nor that truth is entirely independent of humanity. He embraces "the humanistic principle: you can't weed out the human contribution" (P, 122). Pragmatism's final chapter on "Pragmatism and Religion" follows James's line in Varieties in attacking "transcendental absolutism" for its unverifiable account of God, and in defending a "pluralistic and moralistic religion" (144) based on human experience. "On pragmatistic principles," James writes, "if the hypothesis of God works satisfactorily in the widest sense of the word, it is true" (143).
A Pluralistic Universe (1909)
Originally delivered in Oxford as a set of lectures "On the Present Situation in Philosophy," James's book begin with a discussion of philosophic temperament. He condemns the "over-technicality and consequent dreariness of the younger disciples at our American universities..." (PU 13), and holds that a philosopher's "vision" is "the important thing" about him (PU 3). Passing from critical discussions of Royce's idealism and the "vicious intellectualism" of Hegel, James comes, in chapters four through six, to philosophers whose vision he admires. He praises Gustav Fechner for holding that "the whole universe in its different spans and wave-lengths, exclusions and developments, is everywhere alive and conscious" (PU, 70), and he seeks to refine and justify Fechner's idea that separate human, animal and vegetable consciousnesses meet or merge in a "consciousness of still wider scope" (72). James employs Henri Bergson's critique of "intellectualism" in this project, for Bergson shows that the "concrete pulses of experience appear pent in by no such definite limits as our conceptual substitutes are confined by. They run into one another continuously and seem to interpenetrate" (PU 127). James concludes by embracing a position that he had more tentatively set forth in The Varieties of Religious Experience: that religious experiences "point with reasonable probability to the continuity of our consciousness with a wider spiritual environment from which the ordinary prudential man (who is the only man that scientific psychology, so called, takes cognizance of) is shut off" (PU, 135). Whereas in Pragmatism James subsumes the religious within the pragmatic (as yet another way of successfully making one's way through the world), in A Pluralistic Universe, James distinguishes the religious from the "prudential" or "practical."
Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912)
James's radical empiricism, which is basically an epistemological doctrine, has been confused with the metaphysical doctrine of "pure experience," largely because the latter is set forth in most of the essays collected after James's death in Essays in Radical Empiricism. Radical empiricism is never precisely defined in the Essays, being best explicated by a passage from The Meaning of Truth in which James states that it consists of a postulate, a statement of fact, and a conclusion. The postulate is that "the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience," the fact is that relations are just as directly experienced as the things they relate, and the conclusion is that "the parts of experience hold together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience" (MT, 6-7).
James's "pure experience" doctrine is the view that Bertrand Russell -- giving full credit to James in The Analysis of Mind -- calls "neutral monism." James holds that mind and matter are both aspects of, or structures formed from, a more fundamental stuff -- pure experience -- that (despite being called "experience") is neither mental nor physical. Pure experience, James explains, is "the immediate flux of life which furnishes the material to our later reflection with its conceptual categories... a that which is not yet any definite what, tho' ready to be all sorts of whats..." (ERE, 46). That "whats" pure experience may be include minds and bodies, people and material objects. The "what" of pure experience depends not on a fundamental ontological difference among experiences, but on the relations into which pure experiences enter. Certain sequences of pure experiences constitute physical objects, and others constitute persons; but one pure experience (say the perception of a chair) may be part both of the sequence constituting the chair and of the sequence constituting a person.
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First published: September 7, 2000
Content last modified: September 7, 2000