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When used as a virtue term, integrity refers to a quality of a person's character, however, there are other uses of the term. One may speak of the integrity of a wilderness region or an ecosystem, a computerized database, a defense system, a work of art, and so on. When it is applied to objects, integrity refers to the wholeness, intactness or purity of a thing -- meanings that are sometimes carried over when it is applied to people. A wilderness region has integrity when it has not been corrupted by development or by the side-effects of development, when it remains intact as wilderness. A database maintains its integrity as long as it remains uncorrupted by error; a defense system as long as it is not breached. A musical work might be said to have integrity when its musical structure has a certain completeness that is not intruded upon by uncoordinated, unrelated musical ideas, that is, when it possesses a kind of musical wholeness, intactness and purity.
Integrity is also attributed to various parts or aspects of a person's life. We speak of attributes such as professional, intellectual and artistic integrity. However, the most philosophically important sense of the term integrity relates to general character. Philosophers have been particularly concerned to understand what it is for a person to exhibit integrity throughout their life. Acting with integrity on some particularly important occasion will, philosophically speaking, always be explained in terms of broader features of a person's character and life. What is it to be a person of integrity? Ordinary discourse about integrity involves two fundamental intuitions: first, that integrity is primarily a formal relation one has to oneself, or between parts or aspects of one's self; and second, that integrity is connected in an important way to acting morally, in other words, there are some substantive or normative constraints on what it is to act with integrity. How these two intuitions can be incorporated into a consistent theory of integrity is not obvious, and most accounts of integrity tend to focus on one of these intuitions to the detriment of the other. A number of accounts have been advanced, the most important of them being: (i) integrity as the integration of self; (ii) integrity as maintenance of identity; (iii) integrity as standing for something; and (iv) integrity as moral purpose. These accounts are reviewed below. We then examine an issue that has been of central concern to philosophers exploring the concept of integrity: the relation between integrity and moral theory. Do moral theories such as utilitarianism allow room for people to live with integrity?
One instructive attempt to describe the fully integrated self is Harry Frankfurt's. (Frankfurt 1987, pp. 33-34) Frankfurt does not explicitly address himself to the problem of defining integrity, nonetheless he does describe an important and influential account of self-integration. According to Frankfurt, desires and volitions (acts of will) are arranged in a hierarchy. First-order desires are desires for various goods; second-order desires are desires that one desire certain goods, or that one act on one first-order desire rather than another. Similarly, one may will a particular action (first-order volition) or one may will that one's first order volitions are of a particular sort (second-order volition). Second-order desires and volitions pave the way for third-order desires and volitions, and so on. According to Frankfurt, wholly integrated persons bring these various levels of volition and desire into harmony and fully identify with them at the highest level. There are various ideas as to what it means to fully identify with higher-level desires and volitions. However, such identification appears to involve knowing them; not deceiving oneself about them; and acting on them (usually).
A person is subject to many conflicting desires. If one simply acted at each moment out of the strongest current desire, with no deliberation or discrimination between more or less worthwhile desires, then one clearly acts without integrity. Frankfurt calls such a person a wanton (Frankfurt 1971). Integrity thus requires that one discriminate between first-order desires. One may do this by endorsing certain first-order desires and outlawing others. For instance, one may endorse a desire to study and outlaw a desire to party, and do so by reference to a higher order desire ranking success over fun. Second-order desires may conflict. One may value success over fun, but also both fear that a ruthless pursuit of success will make one boring and value being fun over being boring. Fully integrated persons will not fall victim to such conflict; they will either avoid it altogether (if they can) or resolve the conflict in some way. Resolution of self-conflict may be achieved by appeal to yet higher level desires or volitions, or by deciding to endorse one set of desires and outlawing others. At some point the full integration of one's self will require that one decide upon a certain structure of higher level desires and order one's lower level desires and volitions in light of it. As Frankfurt puts it, when a person unreservedly decides to endorse a particular desire:
the person no longer holds himself at all apart from the desire to which he has committed himself. It is no longer unsettled or uncertain whether the object of that desire -- that is, what he wants -- is what he really wants: The decision determines what the person really wants by making the desires upon which he decides fully his own. To this extent the person, in making a decision by which he identifies with a desire, constitutes himself. (Frankfurt 1987, p. 38)When agents thus constitute themselves without ambivalence (that is, unresolved desire for a thing and against it) or inconsistency (that is, unresolved desire for incompatible things), then the agent has what Frankfurt calls wholeheartedness. On one way of developing the integrated-self view of integrity, wholeheartedness is equated with integrity. It should be noted that self-conflict is not limited to desire. Conflict also ranges over commitments, principles, values, and wishes. Furthermore, all of these things -- desires, commitments, values, and so on -- are in flux. They change over time so that achieving the kind of wholeheartedness that Frankfurt describes is a never-ending process and task. Self-knowledge is crucial to this process in so far as one must know what one's values, for example, are if one is to order them.
Frankfurt's account illustrates one way of describing the fully-integrated self. (See Taylor 1981 for a different approach.) The key question, however, is whether the idea of a fully-integrated self adequately captures the quality we ascribe when we say of someone that they are a person of integrity. There have been a number of criticisms of the integrated-self view of integrity. First, it places only formal limits on the kind of person who may be said to have integrity. People of integrity, however, are plausibly thought to be generally honest and genuine in their dealings with others. (See Halfon 1989, pp. 7-8.) Imagine a person who sells used-cars for a living and is wholeheartedly dedicated to selling cars for as much money as possible. Such a person will be prepared to blatantly lie in order to set up a deal. The person may well be perfectly integrated in Frankfurt's sense, but we should feel no temptation at all to describe them as having exemplary integrity.
Second, a person of integrity is plausibly said to make reasonable judgements about the relative importance of various desires and commitments. Yet, again, the self-integration view places only formal limits on the kind of desires that constitute a self. (See McFall 1987 pp. 9-11, Calhoun 1995 pp. 237-38). As McFall notes, one cannot say with a straight face something like: Harold demonstrates great integrity in his single-minded pursuit of approval. (McFall 1987 p.9.) If integrity is nothing more than the perfect integration of self, however, it is hard to see how one can automatically deny Harold's integrity.
Third, on some accounts, the fully and perfectly integrated person is not able to experience genuine temptation. Temptation requires that the full force of an outlaw desire be experienced, but successful integration of the self may mean that such desires are fully subordinated to wholeheartedly endorsed desires and this may preclude an agent fully experiencing them. (See Taylor 1981 p.151 for an example of a view like this.) That a person experiences, and overcomes, temptation would count against their integrity on such a view. One might think, however, that a capacity to overcome temptation and display strength of character is in fact a sign of a person's integrity, not its lack. (Halfon 1989 pp. 44-7 urges this criticism.)
Fourth, Cheshire Calhoun argues that agents may find themselves in situations in which wholeheartedness tends to undermine their integrity rather than constitute it. (Calhoun 1995 pp.238-41. Analogously, Victoria Davion 1991 pp.180-192 argues that a person may change radically and yet maintain integrity.) In the midst of a complex and multifaceted life one may have compelling reasons to avoid neatly resolving incompatible desires. The cost of the resolution of all self-conflict may be a withdrawal from aspects of life that make genuine claims upon us. Resolving self-conflict at the expense of fully engaging with different parts of one's life does not seem to contribute to one's integrity. It seems rather like the sort of cop-out that undermines integrity. (One should not confuse integrity with neatness.)
Because we find ourselves with so many commitments, of so many different kinds, and because commitments inevitably clash and change over time, it will not do to define integrity merely in terms of remaining steadfastly true to one's commitments. It matters which commitments we expect a person of integrity to remain true to. Philosophers have developed different accounts of integrity in response to this need to specify the kind of commitments that are centrally important to a person's integrity.
One option here is to define integrity in terms of the commitments that a person identifies with most deeply, as constituting what they consider their life is fundamentally about. Commitments of this kind are called identity-conferring commitments or sometimes ground projects. This view of integrity, the identity view, is associated most closely with Bernard Williams. It is implicit in his discussion of integrity and utilitarianism (Williams 1973; we examine this discussion below) and also features in his criticism of Kantian moral theory (1981b). The idea is that for a person to abandon an identity-conferring commitment is for them to lose grip on what gives their life its identity, or individual character. An identity-conferring commitment, according to Williams, is the condition of my existence, in the sense that unless I am propelled forward by the conatus of desire, project and interest, it is unclear why I should go on at all. (Williams 1981b p.12).
One apparent consequence of defining integrity as maintenance of identity-conferring commitments is that integrity cannot really be a virtue. This is Williams's view. He argues that although it is an admirable quality, integrity is not related to motivation as virtues are. A virtue either motivates a person to act in desirable ways (as benevolence moves a person to act for another's good), or it enables a person to act in desirable ways (as courage enables a person to act well). If integrity is no more than maintenance of identity, however, it can play neither of these roles. On the identity view of integrity, to act with integrity is just to act in a way that accurately reflects your sense of who you are; to act from motives, interests and commitments that are most deeply your own. (Williams 1981a p.49) A further consequence of this view of integrity as maintenance of identity-conferring commitments is that there appears to be no normative constraints either on what such commitments may be, or on what the person of integrity can do in the pursuit of those commitments. The person of integrity can do horrific things and maintain their integrity so long as they are acting accordance with their core commitments.
A number of criticisms of the identity view of integrity have been made. First, integrity is usually regarded as something worth striving for and the identity account of integrity fails to make sense of this. (See Cox, La Caze, Levine 1999.) It disconnects integrity from the prevalent view that it is a virtue of some kind and generally praiseworthy. Second, the identity theory of integrity ties integrity to commitments with which an agent identifies, but acts of identification can be ill-informed, superficial and foolish. A person may, through ignorance or self-deception, fail to understand or properly acknowledge the source of their deepest commitments and convictions and we are unlikely to attribute integrity to a person who held true to a false and unrealistic picture of themselves. (On the other hand, this view of integrity as maintenance of identify-conferring commitments, recognizes the relevance of self-knowledge to acting with integrity. If a person fails to act on their core commitments, through self-deception, weakness of will, cowardice, or even ignorance, then they lack integrity.)
Third, on the identity view of integrity, a person's integrity is only at issue when their deepest, most characteristic, or core convictions and aspirations are brought into play. However, we expect persons of integrity to behave with integrity in many different contexts, not only those of central importance to them. (See Calhoun 1995, p.245.)
Fourth, as noted above, the identity view of integrity places only formal conditions upon the kind of person that might be said to possess integrity. The identity view of integrity shares this feature with the self-integration view of integrity and similar criticism can be made of it on this ground. It seems plausible to observe certain substantive limits on the kinds of commitments had by a person of integrity.
Persons of integrity treat their own endorsements as ones that matter, or ought to matter, to fellow deliberators. Absent a special sort of story, lying about one's views, concealing them, recanting them under pressure, selling them out for rewards or to avoid penalties, and pandering to what one regards as the bad views of others, all indicate a failure to regard one's own judgment as one that should matter to others. (Calhoun 1995 p. 258)On Calhoun's view, integrity is a matter of having proper regard for one's role in a community process of deliberation over what is valuable and what is worth doing. This, she claims, entails not only that one stand up, unhypocritically, for one's best judgement, but also that one have proper respect for the judgement of others.
Calhoun's account of integrity promises to explain why it is that the fanatic lacks integrity. It seems intuitively very plausible to distinguish between fanatical zeal and integrity, but the self-integration and identity views of integrity threaten to make the fanatic a paradigm case of a person of integrity. Fanatics integrate desires and volitions of various orders in an intimidatingly coherent package; they remain steadfastly true to their deepest commitments like no others. On Calhoun's view of integrity, however, we can locate a distinction between integrity and fanaticism. Fanatics lack one very important quality that, on Calhoun's view, is centrally important to integrity: they lack proper respect for the deliberations of others. What is not clear in Calhoun's account, and is in fact very hard to get clear on in any case, is what the proper respect for other's views in the end amounts to. Exemplary figures of integrity often stand by their judgement in the face of enormous pressure to recant. How, then, is one to understand the difference between standing up for one's views under great pressure and fanatically standing by them? Calhoun's claim that the fanatic lacks integrity because they fail to properly respect the social character of judgement and deliberation sounds right, but most of the work is done by the idea of proper respect -- and it is not clear what this in the end comes to. Her view appears to allow for the possibility that integrity can accommodate the very kind of fanaticism (for example, the virtuous Nazi) that she wishes her account of integrity to eschew.
Calhoun's account of integrity places no conceptual constraints on the kinds of commitments that a person of integrity may endorse. It does not seem necessary on her view that a person of integrity have a special concern with acting morally. Although they have a special concern to understand what in life is worth doing, the person of integrity is not constrained to give moral, other-regarding answers to this question. The following account of integrity is explicitly concerned with attitudes towards morality.
Mark Halfon offers a different way of defining integrity in terms of moral purpose. Halfon describes integrity in terms of a person's dedication to the pursuit of a moral life and their intellectual responsibility in seeking to understand the demands of such a life. He writes that persons of integrity:
embrace a moral point of view that urges them to be conceptually clear, logically consistent, apprised of relevant empirical evidence, and careful about acknowledging as well as weighing relevant moral considerations. Persons of integrity impose these restrictions on themselves since they are concerned, not simply with taking any moral position, but with pursuing a commitment to do what is best. (Halfon 1989, p. 37.)Halfon's view allows that integrity is not necessarily objective, as Ashford claims, and is similar in a number of respects to Calhoun's. Both see integrity as centrally concerned with deliberation about how to live. However, Halfon conceives this task in more narrowly moral terms and ties integrity to personal intellectual virtues exercised in pursuit of a morally good life. Halfon speaks of a person confronting all relevant moral considerations, but this turns out to be quite a formal constraint. What counts as a relevant moral consideration, on Halfon's view, depends upon the moral point of view of the agent. Persons of integrity may thus be responsible for acts others would regard as grossly immoral. What is important is that they act with moral purpose and display intellectual integrity in moral deliberation. This leads Halfon to admit that, on his conception of integrity, it is possible for a Nazi bent on genocide of the entire Jewish people to be a person of moral integrity. Halfon thinks it possible, but not at all likely. (Halfon 1989 pp. 134-36)
Other philosophers object to this consequence. If the genocidal Nazi is a possible object of ascriptions of moral integrity, then we can properly ascribe integrity to people whose moral viewpoint is bizarrely remote from any we find intelligible or defensible. (See McFall 1987. Putnam 1996 draws on the work of Carol Gilligan 1982 to suggest a different way of overcoming the problem of the Nazi of integrity.) Moral constraints upon attributions of integrity need not take the form of Ashford's moralized view or Halfon's more limited formal view. One might say instead that attributions of integrity involve the judgement that an agent acts from a moral point of view those attributing integrity find intelligible and defensible (though not necessarily right) -- and that this formal constraint does have substantive implications. It prohibits attributing integrity to, for example, those who advocate genocide, or deny the moral standing of people on, for example, sex-based or racial grounds. There are things which a person of integrity cannot do. The Nazis and other perpetrators of great evil were either committed to what they were doing, in which case they were immoral (or not moral agents at all) and lacked integrity; or else they lacked integrity because they were self-deceived or dissembling and never had the Nazi commitments they alleged to have, and acted upon, at all. Judgements of integrity would thus involve judgement about the reasonableness of other's moral points of view, rather than the absolute correctness of their view (Ashford) or the intellectual responsibility with which they generally approach the task of thinking about moral questions (Halfon).
Defining integrity in terms of moral purpose has the advantage of capturing intuitions of the moral seriousness of questions of integrity. However, the approach appears too narrow. Halfon's identification of integrity and moral integrity appears to leave out important personal aspects of integrity, aspects better captured by the other views of integrity we have examined. Integrity does not seem to be exclusively a matter of how people approach plainly moral concerns. Other matters like love, friendship and personal projects seem to be centrally important. Imagine a person who sets great store in writing a novel, but who postpones the writing of it for years on one excuse or another and then abandons the idea of novel-writing after one difficult experience with a first chapter. We would think this person's integrity diminished by their failure to make a serious attempt to see the project through, yet the writing of a novel need not be a moral project. (See McFall 1987 on the difficulty of bringing together personal and moral aspects of integrity.)
All of the accounts of integrity we have examined have a certain intuitive appeal and capture some important feature of our concept of integrity. There is, however, no philosophical consensus on the best account. It may be that the concept of integrity does not lend itself to a single coherent description. Integrity may be a cluster concept, tying together different, overlapping qualities of character under the one term. On the other hand, it may be that a fully adequate account of integrity is simply yet to emerge.
Modern moral theories, the most representative of which are utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory, do not concern themselves directly with virtue and character. Instead, they are primarily concerned to describe morally correct action. Theories of morally correct action generally aspire to develop criteria by which to categorize actions as morally obligatory, morally permissible, or morally impermissible. Some theories of morally correct action also introduce the category of the supererogatory: an action is supererogatory if and only if it is morally praiseworthy, but not obligatory. The two theories of primary concern to Williams are utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory, and both of these are usually interpreted as eschewing the category of the supererogatory. (See Baron 1995 for an argument that Kantian moral theory has no need for the category of the supererogatory.) Williams maintains that both utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory are deeply implausible because of their integrity undermining effects. His argument against utilitarianism makes the more transparent appeal to the concept of integrity and it is this argument that we examine here. (But see Herman 1983, Rogerson 1983, Jensen 1989, and Baron 1995, chapter four, for critical discussion of the Williams's argument against Kantian moral theory.)
Williams's argument against utilitarianism is directed against a particular version of utilitarianism -- act-utilitarianism. This is, very roughly, the view that an agent is to regard as morally obligatory all and only actions that maximize general well-being. The act-utilitarian theory that Williams criticizes has an important feature: it aspires to describe the correct form of moral deliberation. It does more than specify what it is for an action to be morally correct, it specifies how an agent should think about moral decisions. Agents should think about which of the actions available to them will maximize general well-being and decide to act accordingly. Notice that this theory is completely impartial and that it makes no room for an agent to give special weight to personal commitments, causes, projects, and the like. Act-utilitarianism recognizes no personal sphere of activity in which moral reflection operates merely as a side-constraint.
According to Williams, an agent who adopted this version of utilitarianism would find themselves unable to live with integrity. As he puts it, to become genuinely committed to act-utilitarianism is for a person to become alienated:
in a real sense from his actions and the source of his actions in his own convictions. It is to make him into a channel between the input of everyone's projects, including his own, and an output of optimific decision; but this is to neglect the extent to which his actions and his decisions have to be seen as the actions and decisions which flow from the projects and attitudes with which he is most closely identified. It is thus, in the most literal sense, an attack on his integrity. [Williams (1973, p.117)]Williams's argument is based on the identity theory of integrity, discussed above. Integrity, on this view, requires that persons act out of their own convictions, that is, out of commitments with which they deeply identify. Act-utilitarianism seeks to replace personal motivations of this kind with impartial utilitarian reasoning. Williams's argument appears to make acting with integrity incompatible with acting in accordance with act-utilitarianism.
Williams develops the point with two famous and much discussed examples. (1972, pp.97-99). The example which best illustrates his argument involves the figure of George, a recent doctoral graduate in chemistry who is having difficulty finding work. George has young children. He also has poor health, limiting his job opportunities. George's (unnamed) wife must work to support the family and on Williams's story this causes a great deal of strain on the family. George has a strong commitment to pacifism, a conviction amounting to an identity-conferring commitment. A dilemma arises for George when more senior colleague tells him about a decently paid job in a laboratory doing work on biological and chemical warfare. If George does not take up the job, it will almost certainly go to another chemist, one without George's pacifist commitment, who will pursue the development of biological and chemical weapons more vigorously than George. Should George take the job or not?
The most likely act-utilitarian conclusion here is that George should accept the job. This would contribute greatly to the well-being of his family as well as probably contributing to general welfare by forestalling some relatively zealous development of weapons of mass destruction. Weighed in the balance are George's feelings in the matter. The utilitarian calculation, if it really does come out this way, is demanding a sacrifice of George: that he put aside his opposition to, and distaste for, biological and chemical weapons development and deal with the anguish and alienation that may result from working in the laboratory.
According to Williams, however, act-utilitarianism in fact demands a different kind of sacrifice from George. It demands that he act without integrity, abandoning or ignoring a longstanding, identity-conferring commitment to pacifism simply because maximum general well-being is to be found elsewhere. This is just one, particularly acute, example of the tendency of impartial utilitarian deliberation to run roughshod over identity-conferring commitments, treating them as no more than one source of utility among others. In general, Williams concludes, identity-conferring commitments cannot play the kind of role in act-utilitarian moral deliberation that is required for an agent to act with integrity, that is, for an agent to act with genuine conviction in matters of grave, identity-determining importance to them.
Williams's critique of utilitarianism has spawned a large and important literature in which the argument has been interpreted and reinterpreted, redrafted, and much criticized. There are, nonetheless, three main lines of response to the Williams's critique of utilitarianism. We consider them in turn. The first reply essentially concedes the point and offers in response a development of utilitarian moral theory, one aimed at avoiding the flaws that Williams sought to demonstrate. One way to do this is by watering down the impartiality of utilitarian theory, explicitly factoring in the permissibility of giving extra weight to one's own personal projects, commitments, and so on. (See Scheffler 1993 for a development of this view, and Harris 1989a and 1989b for criticism of the adequacy of this response.)
Another way to try and improve utilitarianism in response to Williams's argument is to advance a less ambitious form of utilitarian moral theory. Recall that Williams criticizes a version of act-utilitarian moral deliberation, so one may respond to it by describing a version of act-utilitarianism that does not dictate the form of moral deliberation. A moral theory, on this view, primarily describes morally correct action and does not automatically entail a theory of correct moral deliberation. Thus one might subscribe to an act-utilitarian account of morally correct action whilst not demanding that someone like George approach life by deliberating in strictly utilitarian ways. There are however, a number of difficulties with separating out theories of morally correct action and correct moral deliberation in this way. For one thing, it appears to deprive a theory of morally correct action of much point. What is the point, one might ask, of subscribing to a moral theory if it offers no clear practical guidance on how one should act? (See Williams 1981a for a discussion of this point.) Nonetheless, there have been attempts to develop and to motivate versions of utilitarianism not prescribing methods of moral deliberation. (See Railton 1986 for development of such a view and Harcourt 1998 for criticism of it.)
A second possible line of response to the argument is to deny the presupposition of Williams's argument that it is absurd for a moral theory to undermine integrity. It may just be that moral demands upon us really are very stringent, and identity-conferring commitments must sometimes (perhaps often) be sacrificed in the interests of, say, our acting to ameliorate preventable suffering. One might even consider it a virtue of utilitarianism that it demonstrates how genuinely difficult it is to preserve one's integrity when confronting a world of massive and easily preventable suffering. (See Ashford 2000 for an argument along these lines.)
The third, and most influential, line of response argues directly against the idea that utilitarianism demands that agents act against their convictions. Utilitarianism demands that agents adopt utilitarian ideals; that agents give utilitarian ideals the kind of priority that would have them function as the central identity-conferring commitments of their life. Thus utilitarianism does not demand that one live without identity-conferring commitments at all, but that one live with utilitarian identity-conferring commitments. Were George a utilitarian, he would not have been acting against his convictions by taking a job in the chemical weapons factory. He does not lose his integrity simply in virtue of his commitment to utilitarianism. Williams appears to confuse the case in which a utilitarian George acts against his personal interests (in which case his integrity would be preserved) with the case in which a non-utilitarian George is somehow persuaded to act as a utilitarian (in which case his integrity would not be preserved). Acting as a utilitarian when one has no sympathy with utilitarianism may well diminish one's integrity, but such a loss of integrity is not attributable to utilitarianism and has no bearing on utilitarianism's plausibility as a moral theory. (See Carr 1976, Trianosky 1986 and Blustein 1991 for versions of this criticism.)
The matter is not finally settled, however, for notice that Williams's critique is premised on a version of the identity theory of integrity. As we have seen, there are other plausible candidates for an account of integrity and the critique of utilitarianism may well succeed better in their terms. The key issues are whether utilitarian commitment is compatible with a fully satisfactory account of integrity, and if so, whether integrity is of such value and importance that the clash between integrity and utilitarian commitment undermines the plausibility of utilitarian moral theory. An adequate account of integrity needs to deal with these issues and to capture basic intuitions about the nature of integrity: that persons of integrity may differ about what is right but a moral monster cannot have integrity.
|Damian Cox||Marguerite La Caze||Michael P. Levine|
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First published: April 9, 2001
Content last modified: April 9, 2001