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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Indexicals


1. Smith 1989 says that some uses of ‘now’ do not refer to a time interval that includes the moment of utterance. For instance, when narrating the life of George Washington, one might say ‘Washington now needed to get across the Delaware River’.

2. Kaplan 1989a attributes to Michael Bennett the observation that some uses of ‘here’ are demonstrative, as when a person points at a map and says ‘Next week, I'll be here’.

3. Kaplan's manuscript "Demonstratives" (Kaplan 1989a) was written in the 1970's and circulated informally for many years before being published. Kaplan's "Afterthoughts" (Kaplan 1989b) was written considerably later, even though it has the same official publication date as "Demonstratives."

4. Strictly speaking, Kaplan (1989a) associates a circumstance of evaluation with each context, rather than just a possible world. A circumstance of evaluation is a pair of a possible world and a time. We shall ignore this refinement in the presentation that follows.

5. In his informal presentations of his theory, Kaplan (1989a, 1989b) identifies contents with individuals, properties, relations, and structured propositions, as we have done here. But when he turns to technical matters, these contents are identified with (or represented by) intensions, which are functions from circumstances of evaluation to extensions. For details, see Kaplan 1989a and Forbes 1989, forthcoming. We shall concentrate here on the less formal aspects of Kaplan's theory.

6. Sometimes Kaplan describes the character of an expression as being a rule for associating contents of the expression with contexts. In his more technical presentations, Kaplan (1989a) seems to identify the character of an expression with a function different from that described in the main text. See Braun 1995.

7. More accurately, a logical truth is a sentence that is true in every context in every structure (or model). From here on, we ignore this qualification.

8. Three points: (i) Kaplan tends to restrict application of the term ‘directly referential’ to singular terms. (ii) Kaplan (1989a) holds that the notion of direct reference can be defined without appeal to the notion of a singular proposition, but he does not explicitly provide any such definition. (iii) In the preceding paragraph, we used the notion of the referent of an expression with respect to a (Kaplanian) context. See the next two paragraphs, and note 10, for a discussion of this notion.

9. In fact, it is somewhat difficult to determine exactly how Kripke (1980) wishes to define ‘rigid designator’. For discussion, see Kaplan 1989a, 1989b and Salmon 1981.

10. When we speak of the referent of a term with respect to context C, we mean its referent with respect to C and the world of C.

11. We can say more precisely what it means for an indexical to be a rigid designator, but we must first modify Kripke's original definition of ‘rigid designator’ so that it can be extended to context-sensitive expressions. We first need to assume (or define) the notion of the referent of a singular term with respect to a context C and world W. Then the following definition of rigid designation may do the trick, if we restrict our attention to singular terms. If C is a context, then expression D is a rigid designator with respect to C iff: D is a singular term, and for all worlds W and W*, the referent of D with respect to C and W is identical with the referent of D with respect to C and W*. Kaplan could then be construed as saying that all (simple, singular term) indexicals are rigid designators with respect to all contexts.

12. Not all criticisms of Kaplan's theory concern belief and cognitive significance. As mentioned in section 2, various philosophers disagree with Kaplan's account of reference-fixing for demonstratives. Salmon 1989 criticizes the theory's assumption that propositions can vary in truth value from time to time. Braun 1995 criticizes the theory's (apparent) identification of character with an extensional function. Braun 1996 criticizes the theory's handling of multiple occurrences of demonstratives (see section 5.2 below).

13. We are assuming here that Kaplan's theory assigns contents to utterances. So, strictly speaking, we are considering the natural extension of Kaplan's theory to utterances that was presented in section 3.2.

14. Stalnaker's theory of indexical belief (Stalnaker 1981) relies heavily on a technical apparatus that is too elaborate to present here. But it is similar to Schiffer's, Chisholm's and Lewis's theories in one respect: it tries to "reduce" indexical belief to a more restricted class of "singular belief". In particular, Stalnaker tries to reduce indexical belief to belief in propositions about particular utterances or thinking-events. If u is Fred's utterance of (11), then Stalnaker would say that Fred's utterance expresses his belief in (very roughly) the proposition that the person who utters u is addressing exactly one person, who is wearing a business suit, and viewing exactly one person through a mirror, who is not. See Stalnaker 1981 for details, and Austin 1990 for critical discussion.

15. We are ignoring here any difficulties raised by contexts in which ‘that’ fails to refer.

16. Kaplan 1989a presents a second theory of demonstratives that does not use subscripted thats. On this theory (which he seems to prefer), occurrences of ‘that’ in English are represented by dthat-terms of the form "dthat[the F]". For details, see Kaplan 1989a. It turns out, however, that two dthat-terms can have different contents in a single context only if they have different characters. So the same problem arises for the dthat-term theory as for the subscripted ‘that’ theory.

Copyright © 2001 by
David Braun

First published: September 14, 2001
Content last modified: September 14, 2001