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Robert Holkot was from the village of Holcot (or "cot in the rock" as he glossed it) near Northampton, and apparently a commoner: he spoke of how the most capable men seemed to come from humbler backgrounds. He joined the Dominican order, and if he received the usual training, obtained his initial education in arts, logic, Aristotelian philosophy, and theology within the Dominican schools. He studied at Oxford, commenting on Peter Lombard's Sentences in the years 1331-1333. Once he obtained his doctorate in theology, he served as Dominican regent master there. Subsequently, Richard of Bury, the Bishop of Durham, chose Holkot as one of his clerks to work with him in London. Tradition also places Holkot at Cambridge, where he may have served as a Dominican lecturer or regent master in theology prior to 1343, when he is known to have returned to the Dominican priory of Northampton. He remained at Northampton, teaching and writing, until his death of the plague in 1349, acquired, as the story has it, while ministering to the sick.
Holkot produced a number of works over his lifetime. While he was at Oxford, he lectured on Peter Lombard's Sentences, on Matthew and the Book of the Twelve Prophets, and engaged in ordinary and quodlibetal debates. He also engaged in a dispute with his fellow students about epistemology, published as the Sex articuli, and probably wrote another work, De imputabilitate peccati or On the imputability of sin. A text, De stellis, On the stars, a rough commentary on Aristotle's De caelo was probably originally intended as part of his commentary on the Sentences, but circulated as a separate tract. His Sermo finalis, the final sermon given at the time of passing on the lectureship on the Sentences to the next Dominican, also survives. While in London, Holkot helped Richard of Bury with the book, the Philobiblon. Two works for preachers, the Moralitates and the Convertimini, date from his later years. His most famous Biblical lectures, on the book of Wisdom, are associated with Cambridge, and survive as the Postilla super librum Sapientiae. Portions of lectures on Ecclesiastes also survive, most likely from his time in Northampton, and he was known to be giving lectures on Ecclesiasticus when he died. A sermon collection, spanning his career, has also been preserved. Most of these texts exist (if they have come down to us) only in manuscript or early sixteenth century editions. Modern editions are available, however, of selected portions, sermons and questions, and of the Sex articuli.
Although Holkot was a Dominican, well versed in the texts of Aquinas, his philosophy and theology owe much more to the scholastics of the fourteenth century than to the thirteenth. William Ockham exercised the most important influence. The hallmarks of Ockham's philosophy are: his reduction of Aristotle's ten categories of being to substance and quality; his analysis of the other eight categories and many other terms of philosophical art as connotative terms, best understood as exponible into more fundamental absolute terms denoting substances and qualities; his rejection of Aristotle's final, formal and material causes as properly causal, keeping only efficient causality; his conception of mental language as a logical thought structure existing independently of spoken language; his reformulation of the prevailing views about reference (supposition theory) to accommodate his spare metaphysics; his rejection of species as necessary for knowledge in favor of intuitive cognition or the direct intellectual cognition of objects; and his view that the ethical precepts of the Ten Commandments are not absolute but subject to divine will, such that God could, without contradiction, have created a system in which moral good involves obeying the opposite of each of the traditional commands. Holkot assumed most of Ockham's philosophical positions as foundational, taking them for granted in the development of his theology.
Holkot was not much concerned with defending or exploring his Ockhamist philosophical presumptions. They appear as premises, scattered throughout his texts, rather than subjects of extended analysis.
Holkot did differ with Ockham in the details of his epistemology. Holkot, like Ockham, adopted the terms "intuitive" and "abstractive" cognition to designate the basic forms of human understanding. But Holkot's treatment of intuitive cognition differed from Ockham's on the question of the possibility of intuitive cognition of non-existents. For Ockham, intuitive cognition was the direct intellectual cognition of the presence and existence of an object. Holkot used Ockham's own style of analysis to develop his critique. He noted that "intuitive cognition" was a connotative term, connoting both a kind of quality, which is cognition, and the cognized object as it exists and is present in itself. The term stands for the co-presence of cognition with its object. This led Holkot to argue against Ockham's contention that God's omnipotent power to cause directly whatever is ordinarily caused through secondary causes would enable God to conserve the intuitive cognition of an object even after the object has been destroyed. Holkot objected that given the meaning of the term "intuitive cognition," if God were to conserve cognition of an object after destroying it, that cognition by definition could no longer be an intuitive cognition. It would be an abstractive cognition, the kind of cognition present in the absence of an object.
Holkot also differed with Ockham about the nature of abstractive cognition. He argued in favor of retaining species as part of natural and cognitive processes. In De stellis he refers to the sun propagating the natural species of light through the medium of the air. He did not consider the species operative in cognition to be such natural species, however. The term species when used to refer to the whiteness in one external object and to the whiteness in another could be called univocal, having the same meaning in each case, but the term species used to refer to the whiteness in an object as a quality and to the whiteness representing the object in the intellect was equivocal. The intellectual species is only a likeness of the thing in the sense of representing it (like a statue of Hercules in relation to Hercules), and we experience it in ourselves as it enables us to think about an external object in the absence of that object. Holkot was not much concerned whether such "spiritual qualities" were called "species," "idols," "images," or "exemplars" as long as they were understood to serve as representatives of things or even "knowledge habits" and not as the natural qualities that exist in extramental reality. Holkot's opponent was not Ockham, here, however, but his Dominican contemporary William Crathorn, who had argued for the view that natural and cognitive species were the same in kind. Holkot ridiculed Crathorn's position at length in the Sex articuli, on the grounds that if Crathorn were right, our minds would become white or black, hot or cold, depending on what we were thinking about. Crathorn was arguing in line with a long tradition stretching back to Roger Bacon. Holkot's sharp disjunction between natural and spiritual "likenesses," natural and spiritual qualities, went beyond the traditional distinction between sensible and intelligible species and seems to show the effects of the Ockhamist critique, even while he retained remnants of the Aristotelian vocabulary.
Ockham had argued for stringent limits on the ability of reason to establish the existence of God. While an argument for the existence of God as "first conserver" of things could be made, Ockham had argued against the ability of natural reason to prove there was only one divine being. Holkot developed such strictures, arguing that unaided human reason could not prove through a strict demonstration that any incorporeal being like an angel or God existed. The consequence for Holkot was that any reference to such incorporeal beings found in the texts of ancient philosophers must have come down to them from their predecessors passing on a vestige of knowledge about God acquired ultimately from Adam and Eve. Holkot also contended that some pagans, who lacked the law of Moses, still received faith and grace from God outside the Mosaic Law because they did their best to live according to the principles of natural law. Holkot's sanguine view of pagan philosophers like Hermes Trismegistus and Aristotle rested not on their ability to use natural reason to discern theological truths, but on his confidence that God had accorded a measure of revelation to more than those who had the texts of scripture.
If basic theological premises require revelation for human beings to know them, then the arena of human reason in theology is restricted to reasoning about what is revealed. Some of the tenets of Christian doctrine, like the doctrines of the Trinity, Incarnation and Eucharist, offer particular challenges to logic. There was a general belief among medieval scholastics that Aristotelian logic exemplified natural reason at its best and was universally applicable to all domains because its rules held through formal relation to the principle of non-contradiction. If key Christian doctrines were not amenable to Aristotelian logical principles, however, it would seem to imply that God is not subject to the principle of non-contradiction and that Aristotelian logic is not universal. Holkot took up these issues in his discussion of the doctrine of the Trinity.
Difficulty arises in the doctrine of the Trinity over doctrinally true premises that seem to give rise to doctrinally false conclusions:
The divine Essence is the Father,
The divine Essence is the Son,
Therefore, the Father is the Son.
Prior to Holkot, a variety of distinctions had been proposed to modify the identity relation of the copula in such premises and to block the conclusion. But Holkot objected that the divine Essence was in no way "really," "modally," "formally," "rationally," "convertibly," nor in any other way distinguished from the divine Persons or the divine relations of paternity, filiation and spiration. This put him back face to face with the dilemma.
Holkot responded in a passage for which he is perhaps best known, that there must be two systems of logic, a logic appropriate to the natural order, exemplified in Aristotle's works, and a logic appropriate to the supernatural order, a logic of faith, whose rules are supplementary to those of Aristotle. He concluded that Aristotelian logic did not hold universally, but only for the natural order unless additions were made to take into account theological cases. This did not mean that he abandoned the principle of non-contradiction in matters of faith. Rather the nature of the divine being meant that syllogisms involving Trinitarian terms functioned like expository syllogisms about particulars when unquantified universal terms are substituted for particular ones:
Human being is running,
Human being is bald.
Therefore, bald human being is running.
The conclusion is invalid because the subject term in each premise might stand for different people, like Plato and Socrates.
Holkot argued that since Aristotle could not have known about God as three Persons and one divine Essence, he could not have foreseen the need to adjust his logic for such cases, but with some supplementary rules taken from religious authority, like: "every absolute is predicated in the singular and not in the plural about the three persons," and "unity holds its consequent where the opposition of relation does not stand in the way" (Sent. I, q. 5, f. f2ra), Holkot believed the Trinitarian cases could be covered. The logic of faith does not have a large number of additional principles, and it, like Aristotelian logic, is rational because it is subject to the principle of non-contradiction.
Holcot's view of the relation between faith and reason was very much in the tradition of Anselm, of faith seeking understanding. His adherence to the principle of non-contradiction was uncompromising: "no intellect can assent to the opposite of the first principle or believe that contradictories are true at the same time" (Quod. I, q. 2, in Exploring, 38, ll. 165-166). Faith required that reason believe that all of the truths of the faith are compatible, even when at times they could not be demonstrated or shown to be so.
The Condemnations of 1277 and John Duns Scotus impelled the view that the world could be other than it is. The idea that God's omnipotent power provides him with an infinity of choices out of which he chooses to create only one set of possibilities became a governing idea among subsequent English schoolmen. Scotus also argued forcefully for the idea that each moment was open to contingent possibility, such that for any time t, the events at t were possible not to be the events at t. Contingency, traditionally assigned to the future, in Scotus' view superceded or governed even the hypothetical necessity of the present. Ockham retreated from Scotus' view, reassigning contingency to future events and reasserting the full force of hypothetical necessity for events in the present. However, working out the implications for philosophy and theology of a contingent world order was the central intellectual challenge for Holkot's generation.
Divine omnipotence involves the absolute power to enact anything that does not involve a contradiction. But among the multitude of possibilities open to divine enactment, God chooses or ordains a subset of compatible possibilities that constitute the world and its history as we know it. The relationship between God's absolute power and the ordained system in place at any given time provided a fault line for exploring questions of necessity and contingency. Thirteenth century theologians formulated the relationship as one between what God has done and what he could have done otherwise, safely relegating contingency to a now foreclosed past. Canon lawyers, however, appropriated the distinction to describe the powers of the pope to set aside "ordained" or enacted Church law through the "plenitude" or "absolute" power of his office. Because papal power transcended enacted law, and popes (and monarchs) who enacted laws were in some sense not subject to those laws, they could provide for exceptions or change enacted laws without contradiction. Such application of the distinction between absolute and ordained power raised the possibility that God might intervene in the ordained system through his absolute power. Beginning with Scotus, the formulation of the canonists began to enter into discussions of God's exercise of absolute power. The appropriation of the legal tradition did not lead to the conclusion (at least for Scotus, Ockham and Holkot) that God uses his absolute power to act inordinately in the ordained system, but rather it enables God (as it did in the change from the Old to the New Law) to set aside one ordained system and replace it with another. Several different and incompatible systems of divine legislation have operated at different times during human history. God's absolute capacity to transcend any given ordained system and replace it with another has made such a switch possible without involving God in a contradiction of his nature. Holkot also invoked this dialectical relationship between God's absolute and ordained power to explain how God provides for dispensations from his laws in particular cases. God never acts inordinately, but the system of divine ordinations is complex and involves multiple incompatible subsets capable of being in place at any given time.
Holkot analyzed God's power in terms of sets of compatible propositions.
If all the propositions that can exist, were to exist, God cannot do what would entail contradictory propositions being true at the same time, and He can do all those things that, having posed them perfectly instantiated in being, entail no contradictory propositions being true at the same time. (Sent. II, q. 2, art. 6, f. i4va)
He then argued that talk of God's absolute and ordained power was not about a two-fold power, but two ways of modifying the proposition: "God can produce A." The proposition "God can produce A from his ordained power," means that it is possible for God to produce A, and A will be compatible with his existing statutes. The proposition "God can produce A from his absolute power," means that it is possible for God to produce A (because A in itself entails no contradictory propositions being simultaneously true), and A is not compatible with his existing statutes. God has only one power, which is God himself, and which human beings can understand in two different ways: ordinately and absolutely. (The stricture on propositional existence results from his view, which he shared with Ockham and a number of his contemporaries, that only propositional tokens counted as real propositions capable of producing a logical contradiction.)
The principle of non-contradiction served as the ultimate safeguard of rationality and certainty in Holkot's system. The role of the principle was particularly important because Holkot, more than perhaps any other late medieval theologian, underscored God's freedom to set aside ordained laws without incurring any fault or obstacle.
God can be obliged to no law but that without its observance he can be morally good, because otherwise the divine goodness would depend on creatures, and God would be less good than he is if he were to destroy every creature; and similarly God would begin to be better than he was before the observance of the law. Whence, just as a prince who is above the law can perform some act without sin or evil, which those existing under the law in no way can do without sin, so God in not fulfilling what he promised acts without the evil of falsity or perjury, which someone existing under the law could in no way do. (Quodl. III, q. 8, in Seeing the Future, 103, ll. 537-546)
Divine promises, revelations, and enactments were all in Holkot's view ungrounded in divine goodness in the sense that God was not under obligation because of his goodness to fulfill them or keep them in being. The contingency of the ordained system was a fact of the human condition. So what reassurance could human beings have that keeping faith with God's precepts would result in their salvation? What would happen if God were to set aside the current law and enact some incompatible alternative, as it would clearly seem to be in God's power to do? If God did not inform people about such a change, then invincible ignorance would protect them from being held accountable for not following the new laws. Holkot did not believe that God could ask people to obey laws of which they were ignorant because that would require them to do what is impossible and contradictory. And if God did inform people of the new laws, then these laws would supercede the incompatible old set, and the faithful could obey God without being held to contradictory commands.
In a system of divine command ethics, human beings are obliged to do what God asks them to do because God commands it, not because there is some underlying system of absolute goodness that ethical precepts should ideally mirror. William Ockham had subscribed to such a view. He had argued that no contradiction would arise if God were to command that the Ten Commandments, the precepts fundamental to both the Old and New Laws, were no longer in effect and that from then on people would be obliged to obey their opposites. Most of Ockham's sympathizers backed away from the idea that God could command people to hate him, on the grounds that that command, at least, would be contradictory. But Holkot followed Ockham in subscribing to the ultimate contingency of the decalogue.
With no act having intrinsic worth, the meritoriousness of human behavior was grounded in a covenant between God and the human faithful. Within the terms of the New Law, God would not deny salvation to all those who did their best to obey his commands and adhere to the Articles of the Faith. The causal effect of meritorious acts in effecting salvation was a secondary form of causality, functioning like money, as an agreed upon medium of exchange in the economy of salvation. Because God's goodness was not a guarantee of covenant, however, Holkot stressed that human adherence to the terms of the covenant constituted an act of faith that God would indeed uphold his promises, even knowing that nothing compels God to do so.
Where the fact of command matters more than the substance of what is commanded, human intention to obey has greater significance than the substantive enactments of obedience. Holkot perceived the connection between divine command and the human intention to obey as at the heart of the relationship between human beings and God. For instance, Holkot posed the case of a simple old woman, who in good faith comes to church to hear a new church doctrine from her bishop. If the bishop gets the doctrine backwards, explaining to his congregation that they should believe just the opposite of what the new article of belief contains, is the elderly laywoman required to accept the words of her bishop as true? One of Holkot's fellow scholars had argued that she would only be in this position if she were being punished for sin, but Holkot responded that it was not the substance of her belief that mattered, but her intention to do what was right and to obey God. Her intention to do her best to conform her will to God would be sufficient under the covenant to ensure her salvation if she were to persevere in that intention. God would not deny her salvation because those on whom she necessarily depended for knowledge about God's will were misinformed or confused.
Debates over the place of deception in terms of both the absolute and ordained systems of possibility involved Holkot and a number of his immediate contemporaries. If the world is a contingent place that can be other than it is, then do God's revelations constrain the scope of his possible future actions? If not, can what God says be deceptive or false? Discussion took up scriptural instances in which God seemed to deceive. Holkot, against a number of his contemporaries, argued that God can deceive human beings even in the ordained system, has deceived them as shown in scripture, and has deceived them for no redeeming good apparent to human beings. If God's words to human beings might be deceptive, such that it is not just the bishop who may impart false information, but even God, then the human intention to believe God's words as true and to obey them takes on even more importance. Holkot did not believe that God was playing the role of Descartes' deceiving demon, but Holkot also did not know how to rule out the possibility that he might be deceived about any given thing he believed. The important thing was that even if he were deceived, God had promised that his intention to believe what was revealed and to do what he understood God wanted him to do provided security under the covenant. Faith in the covenant was the source of certainty, not rational demonstration.
The place of intentionality in Holkot's theology and his generous view of divine graciousness provide the context for his use of a version of what has come to be called "Pascal's wager." Holkot passed on a story about a learned heretic who was converted to a belief in immortality by a challenge from a Dominican lay brother: if you believe in immortality and it is true, you will have gained a great deal, and if you believe in immortality and it is not true, you will lose nothing. Forming an intention to believe could constitute doing his best on the part of the heretic, and God would reward such an intention with the grace necessary for conversion to the belief.
Discussions about the contingency of the created order and the various ways necessity might impinge on that contingency tended to focus on the challenge God's foreknowledge of future events posed to the contingency of events.
In his commentary on Peter Lombard's Sentences, Holkot put forward an elaborate argument:
If a is a sin that Socrates will freely commit tomorrow.
Then it is argued: God knows that a will be, therefore from eternity He knew that a will be or he began to know that a will be.
It cannot be said that He began to know that a will be, because then He could know or foreknow something anew and as a result of time. . . .
If He knew a from eternity, I pose that "a will be" was written on a wall yesterday. Therefore, the proposition "that written on the wall was true" is true, and . . . consequently necessary because it is a true proposition about the past. Therefore, it is necessary that it be the case as the proposition denotes, i. e., it is necessary that Socrates sin. (Sent. II, q. 2, in Seeing the Future, 126, ll. 307-317.)
Holkot contended that the common response of his era to such an argument, was to pose the possibility of a counterfactual past: to say that the proposition "a will be" is true, yet contingently true, and therefore, although it is true, it can never have been true. Holkot argued, the possibility of a counterfactual past differentiated propositions about the future on contingent matters and their equivalents--whether set in the past or present--from propositions about the past and present that are not about such contingent matters. The propositions "a was known by God," and "a is known by God," although set in the past and present, are true and yet can never have been true, just like other propositions about the future, because they are about a, and a, as a future contingent, may still not happen. Holkot's response is recognizable as a version of what in modern discussions is called the Ockhamist solution (although the argument traces back at least to Bonaventure).
What Holkot added to the discussion was an elaborate analysis of such puzzles using the rules and structure of obligational debates to explore counterfactual possibility. Debates de obligatione were a commonplace in the medieval university curriculum and involved one person, the "opponent" posing a proposition to another, the "respondent," that, if accepted, would form the basis for a continuing exchange. The posed proposition was usually a counterfactual or a proposition whose truth status was uncertain. The opponent then proposed further propositions to the respondent, each of which might follow from, contradict or be irrelevant to the first. The respondent was to take the first proposition as true for the time of the debate (understood in Holkot's version to take place in a single hypothetical instant of time), and to respond with agreement or rejection depending on whether the succeeding propositions followed from what had been agreed on before or contradicted the preceding concessions. If a proposed proposition was unconnected with any of the preceding propositions, the respondent would respond with agreement, rejection or doubt depending on what he understood the actual state of affairs in the world to be. The forms and rules of obligational debate suggested a rigorous format for exploring the contingent possibilities, which Holkot adopted.
A simple form of the puzzle might proceed as follows:
Opponent: Let it be the case that God knows a will be, where a is a future contingent.
Respondent: I accept.
Opponent: Everything that is possible to be is also possible not to be (by the definition of contingency).
Respondent: I accept.
Opponent: As a future contingent, a is possible to be and possible not to be.
Respondent: I accept.
Opponent (from the Aristotelian rule that the impossible does not follow from the possible): Let it be the case that a will not be.
Respondent: I accept.
Opponent: Then God is deceived.
In resolving such puzzles, Holkot invoked a series of rules, one of which has significance for his moral philosophy, as well. Holkot argued that when the opponent proposed the initial proposition, he was also implicitly posing the rejection of its contradictory. The Aristotelian rule that the impossible does not follow from the possible, seems to allow the contradictory of the initial proposition to enter the debate. But Holkot argued that such a move in effect amounted to starting the debate all over again with a new starting point, a proposition contradictory to the first. The respondent would now be obliged, if he continued with the debate, to answer in accordance with the new contradictory proposition, and would refuse to concede that "God is deceived."
Holkot viewed the human relationship to divine revelation as equivalent to engaging in an obligational debate. The faithful obligated themselves to accept divine revelations as true for the time of this life (even though as contingents it was possible that they might not be true), and if God commanded them to act in a way contrary to previous commands, the new commandment would supercede the old, just if a new obligational debate had begun. Those who accepted the obligation to obey, would also be obligated to live in a way that was consistent with the obligations incurred, even if God did not reveal the details. Human reason was required to discern how to act in uncertain cases.
In dealing with the problem of God's knowledge of future contingents, Ockham had proposed thinking about time as the modal feature of language. Propositions in the past tense are necessary per accidens: they refer to events that could have been otherwise before they happened, but that now could not have been other than they were because of the necessity of the past. Propositions in the present tense are hypothetically necessary: they refer to events that could be otherwise, but given that they are what they are, if they are, cannot not be what they are. Propositions in the future tense are contingent: they refer to events that are possible to be and also possible not to be. Ockham argued that God's knowledge of events tracked this modal arrow just as human knowledge of events does, reintroducing an arrow of "time" for God as well as human beings.
In the ensuing years, Ockham's modal view of "time" was joined to a way of speaking about truth traceable to Richard of Campsall, an Oxford master of arts and theology teaching in the years just before Ockham. Holkot exemplifies this way of thinking.
In De Interpretatione, chapter 9, Aristotle had bequeathed a difficult problem to the medieval debate about divine foreknowledge. His contention that in order to avoid attaching necessity to all events, propositions about future events were not yet true or false seemed to deny to God the possibility of knowing the future or to rule out the contingency of events. Boethius had provided a response that held until the fourteenth century, but after Scotus subjected his response to a severe critique, new discussion of the Aristotelian three-valued logic appeared. Campsall distinguished between propositions about the past and present that were "determinately true or false" and propositions about the future that were "indeterminately true or false." Holkot adopted this way of modally dividing up determinations of truth and falsity:
. . . future contingents are said to be propositions about the future of which there is no determinate truth or falsity, because although they are true or false, yet those which are true can never have been true and those which are false can never have been false. (Quod. III, q. 1, in Seeing the Future, 63, ll. 93-96.)
By the time of Holcot, the analysis of future contingency in terms of a possible counterfactual past, and the identification of such an analysis with a multi-valued logic, had attained the status of an identifiable tradition. Ockham had not adopted the terminology of "indeterminately true or false" and "contingently true or false" to speak of the truth status of future contingent propositions. He had insisted on a two-valued system in which all propositions are determinately true or false. But Holkot departed from him in this. Holkot's position reflects a view of modality as primary. Necessity and contingency are fundamental, and judgments of truth mean something different in each modal context, rather than truth being primary, and necessity and contingency providing a different valence to otherwise true propositions. The efforts to grapple with the implications of contingency had come a long way.
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First published: July 23, 2001
Content last modified: July 23, 2001