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Holes are an interesting case-study for ontologists and epistemologists. Naive, untutored descriptions of the world and explanations of facts in the world often make essential reference to holes. A hole explains why water flowed out of the reservoir. A colander wouldn't be what it is, without all those holes in it. It is because there is a hole that somebody has the impression of seeing a hole. Yet it might be argued that commitment to these entities is only illusory:

Problems with Holes

1. For any explanation of a physical interaction that might be offered in terms of holes, there must be some accompanying explanations that invoke material objects; but then, it seems that these explanations alone could be enough. That water flowed out of the reservoir is explained by a number of facts about water flow and the way it can be confined, and at no point in these explanations need the concept of a hole appear; instead, one might happen to talk of the shape of the reservoir.

2. Locke implied that a causal theory of perception is incompatible with the perception of holes; since holes are not material they cannot be the source of any causal flow. (This might be considered an instance of the argument ad 1.) That we do have the impression of perceiving holes should then be considered a sort of systematic illusion. (Unless one rejects causal accounts of perception.)

Theories of Holes

If, on account of such concerns, holes are not taken at face value, a number of options are available.
(a) Holes do not exist. This requires at least a systematic way of paraphrasing every hole-committing sentence by means of a sentence that does not refer to or quantify over holes. (The donut is holed, but there is no hole in it). Provided the language contains all the necessary shape-predicates, this might well be a favourable strategy: after all, holes are a paradigm example of nothings.

(b) Holes exist, but they are something else. For instance, they are (parts of) material objects, say, hole-linings or hole-surrounds. This calls for an account of the altered meaning of certain predicates or prepositions. (What would ‘inside’ and ‘outside’ mean? What would it mean to ‘enlarge’ a hole?)
Or holes are negative, missing parts. On this account, a donut would be a sort of mereological sum of a pie and a mysterious missing bit in the middle. Or again, holes are not categorically homogeneous with their hosts. They are not particulars, but relations between a material object and a volume of space. (But now how can we account for the shape and size of holes? Relations do not have shapes and sizes.)

On the other hand, the possibility remains that holes be taken for what they are. They are full-fledged countable entities, like stones and chunks of cheese. But unlike stones and chunks of cheese, holes are ontologically parasitic: they are always in or through something else, and cannot be detached from their hosts. Holes are immaterial; localized at --but not identical with-- regions of space; fillable; and somehow causally liable. They are subject to part/whole structures. Yet holes are always in one piece--there is no such thing as half a hole.

Holes are topologically assorted: superficial hollows are distinguished from internal cavities; straight perforations are distinguished from knotted tunnels. But the hole realist will not fail to notice the unity of this assortment. These are all species of the same genus. Thus the underlying topology must depart from the basic account of handlebodies and calls for a direct analysis of their topological complements. Look at the donut, but keep an eye on the hole--or on what could fill it.


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Copyright © 1996 by
Roberto Casati
Achille C. Varzi

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First published: December 5, 1996
Content last modified: December 5, 1996