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The 17th Century English philosopher Thomas Hobbes is now widely regarded as one of a handful of truly great political philosophers, whose masterwork Leviathan rivals in significance the political writings of Plato, Aristotle, Locke, Rousseau, Kant, and Rawls. Hobbes is famous for his early and elaborate development of what has come to be known as social contract theory, the method of justifying political principles or arrangements by appeal to the agreement that would be made among suitably situated rational, free, and equal persons. He is infamous for having used the social contract method to arrive at the astonishing conclusion that we ought to submit to the authority of an absolute -- undivided and unlimited -- sovereign power. While his methodological innovation had a profound constructive impact on subsequent work in political philosophy, his substantive conclusions have served mostly as a foil for the development of more palatable philosophical positions. Hobbes's moral philosophy has been less influential than his political philosophy, in part because that theory is too ambiguous to have garnered any general consensus as to its content. Most scholars have taken Hobbes to have affirmed some sort of personal relativism or subjectivism; but views that Hobbes espoused divine command theory, virtue ethics, rule egoism, or a form of projectivism also find support in Hobbes's texts and among scholars. Because Hobbes held that the true doctrine of the Lawes of Nature is the true Morall philosophie, differences in interpretation of Hobbes's moral philosophy can be traced to differing understandings of the status and operation of Hobbes's laws of nature, which laws will be discussed below. The formerly dominant view that Hobbes espoused psychological egoism as the foundation of his moral theory is currently widely rejected, and there has been to date no fully systematic study of Hobbes's moral psychology.
Hobbes wrote several versions of his political philosophy, including The Elements of Law, Natural and Politic (also under the titles Human Nature and De Corpore Politico) published in 1650, De Cive (1642) published in English as Philosophical Rudiments Concerning Government and Society in 1651, the English Leviathan published in 1651, and its Latin revision in 1668. Others of his works are also important in understanding his political philosophy, especially his history of the English Civil War, Behemoth (published 1679), De Corpore (1655), De Homine (1658), Dialogue Between a Philosopher and a Student of the Common Laws of England (1681), and The Questions Concerning Liberty, Necessity, and Chance (1656). All of Hobbes's major writings are collected in The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, edited by Sir William Molesworth (11 volumes, London 1839-45), and Thomae Hobbes Opera Philosophica Quae Latina Scripsit Omnia, also edited by Molesworth (5 volumes; London, 1839-45). Readers new to Hobbes should begin with Leviathan, being sure to read Parts Three and Four, as well as the more familiar and often excerpted Parts One and Two. There are many fine overviews of Hobbes's normative philosophy, some of which are listed in the following selected bibliography of secondary works.
Hobbes sought to discover rational principles for the construction of a civil polity that would not be subject to destruction from within. Having lived through the period of political disintegration culminating in the English Civil War, he came to the view that the burdens of even the most oppressive government are scarce sensible, in respect of the miseries, and horrible calamities, that accompany a Civill Warre. Because virtually any government would be better than a civil war, and, according to Hobbes's analysis, all but absolute governments are systematically prone to dissolution into civil war, people ought to submit themselves to an absolute political authority. Continued stability will require that they also refrain from the sorts of actions that might undermine such a regime. In particular, Hobbes aimed to demonstrate the reciprocal relationship between political obedience and peace.
To establish these conclusions, Hobbes invites us to consider what life would be like in a state of nature, that is, a condition without government. Perhaps we would imagine that people might fare best in such a state, where each decides for himself how to act, and is judge, jury and executioner in his own case whenever disputes arise-- and that at any rate, this state is the appropriate baseline against which to judge the justifiability of political arrangements. Hobbes terms this situation the condition of mere nature, a state of perfectly private judgment, in which there is no agency with recognized authority to arbitrate disputes and effective power to enforce its decisions.
Hobbes's near descendant, John Locke, insisted in his Second Treatise of Government that the state of nature was indeed to be preferred to subjection to the arbitrary power of an absolute sovereign. But Hobbes famously argued that such a dissolute condition of masterlesse men, without subjection to Lawes, and a coercive Power to tye their hands from rapine, and revenge would make impossible all of the basic security upon which comfortable, sociable, civilized life depends. There would be no place for industry, because the fruit thereof is uncertain; and consequently no culture of the earth; no navigation, nor use of the commodities that may be imported by Sea; no commodious Building; no Instruments of moving and removing such things as require much force; no Knowledge of the face of the Earth; no account of Time; no Arts; no Letters; and which is worst of all, continuall feare, and danger of violent death; And the life of man, solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short. If this is the state of nature, men have strong reasons to avoid it, which can be done only by submitting to some mutually recognized public authority, for so long a man is in the condition of mere nature, (which is a condition of war,) as private appetite is the measure of good and evill.
Although many readers have criticized Hobbes's state of nature as unduly pessimistic, he constructs it from a number of individually plausible empirical and normative assumptions. He assumes that people are sufficiently similar in their mental and physical attributes that no one is invulnerable nor can expect to be able to dominate the others. Hobbes assumes that people generally shun death, and that the desire to preserve their own lives is very strong in most people. While people have local affections, their benevolence is limited, and they have a tendency to partiality. Concerned that others should agree with their own high opinions of themselves, people are sensitive to slights. They make evaluative judgments, but often use seemingly impersonal terms like good and bad to stand for their own personal preferences. They are curious about the causes of events, and anxious about their futures; according to Hobbes, these characteristics incline people to adopt religious beliefs, although the content of those beliefs will differ depending upon the sort of religious education one has happened to receive.
With respect to normative assumptions, Hobbes ascribes to each person in the state of nature a liberty right to preserve herself, which he terms the right of nature. This is the right to do whatever one sincerely judges needful for one's preservation; yet because it is at least possible that virtually anything might be judged necessary for one's preservation, this theoretically limited right of nature becomes in practice an unlimited right to potentially anything, or, as Hobbes puts it, a right to all things. Hobbes further assumes as a principle of practical rationality, that people should adopt what they see to be the necessary means to their most important ends.
Taken together, these plausible descriptive and normative assumptions yield a state of nature potentially fraught with divisive struggle. The right of each to all things invites serious conflict, especially if there is competition for resources, as there will surely be over at least scarce goods such as the most desirable lands, spouses, etc. People will quite naturally fear that others may (citing the right of nature) invade them, and may rationally plan to strike first as an anticipatory defense. Moreover, that minority of prideful or vain-glorious persons who take pleasure in exercising power over others will naturally illicit preemptive defensive responses from others. Conflict will be further fueled by disagreement in religious views, in moral judgments, and over matters as mundane as what goods one actually needs, and what respect one properly merits. Hobbes imagines a state of nature in which each person is free to decide for himself what he needs, what he's owed, what's respectful, right, pious, prudent, and also free to decide all of these questions for the behavior of everyone else as well, and to act on his judgments as he thinks best, enforcing his views where he can. In this situation where there is no common authority to resolve these many and serious disputes, we can easily imagine with Hobbes that the state of nature would become a state of war, even worse, a war of all against all.
In response to the natural question whether humanity ever was generally in any such state of nature, Hobbes notes that all sovereigns are in this state with respect to one another. He opined that many now civilized peoples were formerly in that state, and some few peoples -- the savages of 17th C. America, for instance -- were still to his day in the state of nature. Most significantly, Hobbes asserts that the state of nature will be easily recognized by those whose formerly peaceful states have collapsed into civil war. While the state of nature's condition of perfectly private judgment is an abstraction, something resembling it too closely for comfort remains a perpetually present possibility, to be feared, and avoided.
Do the other assumptions of Hobbes's philosophy license the existence of this imagined state of isolated individuals pursuing their private judgments? Probably not, since, as feminist critics among others have noted, children are by Hobbes's theory assumed to have undertaken an obligation of obedience to their parents in exchange for nurturing, and so the primitive units in the state of nature will include families ordered by internal obligations, as well as individuals. The bonds of affection, sexual affinity, and friendship -- as well as of clan membership and shared religious belief -- may further decrease the accuracy of any purely individualistic model of the state of nature. This concession need not impugn Hobbes's analysis of conflict in the state of nature, since it may turn out that competition, diffidence and glory-seeking are disastrous sources of conflicts among small groups just as much as they are among individuals. Still, commentators seeking to answer the question how precisely we should understand Hobbes's state of nature are investigating the degree to which Hobbes imagines that to be a condition of interaction among isolated individuals.
Another important open question is that of what, exactly, it is about human beings that makes it the case (supposing Hobbes is right) that our communal life is prone to disaster when we are left to interact according only to our own individual judgments. Perhaps, while people do wish to act for their own best long-term interest, they are shortsighted, and so indulge their current interests without properly considering the effects of their current behavior on their long-term interest. This would be a type of failure of rationality. Alternative, it may be that people in the state of nature are fully rational, but are trapped in a situation that makes it individually rational for each to act in a way that is sub-optimal for all, perhaps finding themselves in the familiar prisoner's dilemma of game theory. Or again, it may be that Hobbes's state of nature would be peaceful but for the presence of persons (just a few, or perhaps all, to some degree) whose passions overrule their calmer judgments; who are prideful, spiteful, partial, envious, jealous, and in other ways prone to behave in ways that lead to war. Such an account would understand irrational human passions to be the source of conflict. Which, if any, of these accounts adequately answers to Hobbes's text is a matter of continuing debate among Hobbes scholars.
Hobbes argues that the state of nature is a miserable state of war in which none of our important human ends are reliably realizable. Happily, human nature also provides resources to escape this miserable condition. Hobbes argues that each of us, as a rational being, can see that a war of all against all is inimical to the satisfaction of her interests, and so can agree that peace is good, and therefore also the way or means of peace are good. Humans will recognize as imperatives the injunction to seek peace, and to do those things necessary to secure it, when they can do so safely. Hobbes calls these practical imperatives Lawes of Nature, the sum of which is not to treat others in ways we would not have them treat us. These precepts, conclusions or theorems of reason are eternal and immutable, always commanding our assent even when they may not safely be acted upon. They forbid many familiar vices such as iniquity, cruelty, and ingratitude. Although commentators do not agree on whether these laws should be regarded as mere precepts of prudence, or rather as divine commands, or moral imperatives of some other sort, all agree that Hobbes understands them to direct people to submit to political authority. They tell us to seek peace with willing others by laying down part of our right to all things, by mutually covenanting to submit to the authority of a sovereign, and further direct us to keep that covenant establishing sovereignty.
When people mutually covenant each to the others to obey a common authority, they have established what Hobbes calls sovereignty by institution. When, threatened by a conqueror, they covenant for protection by promising obedience, they have established sovereignty by acquisition. These are equally legitimate ways of establishing sovereignty, according to Hobbes, and their underlying motivation is the same-- namely fear-- whether of one's fellows or of a conqueror. Political legitimacy depends not on how a government came to power, but only on whether it can effectively protect those who have consented to obey it; political obligation ends when protection ceases.
Although Hobbes offered some mild pragmatic grounds for preferring monarchy to other forms of government, his main concern was to argue that effective government -- whatever its form -- must have absolute authority. Its powers must be neither divided nor limited. The powers of legislation, adjudication, enforcement, taxation, war-making (and the less familiar right of control of normative doctrine) are connected in such a way that a loss of one may thwart effective exercise of the rest; for example, legislation without interpretation and enforcement will not serve to regulate conduct. Only a government that possesses all of what Hobbes terms the essential rights of sovereignty can be reliably effective, since where partial sets of these rights are held by different bodies that disagree in their judgments as to what is to be done, paralysis of effective government, or degeneration into a civil war to settle their dispute, may occur.
Similarly, to impose limitation on the authority of the government is to invite irresoluble disputes over whether it has overstepped those limits. If each person is to decide for herself whether the government should be obeyed, factional disagreement -- and war to settle the issue, or at least paralysis of effective government -- are quite possible. To refer resolution of the question to some further authority, itself also limited and so open to challenge for overstepping its bounds, would be to initiate an infinite regress of non-authoritative authorities (where the buck never stops). To refer it to a further authority itself unlimited, would be just to relocate the seat of absolute sovereignty, a position entirely consistent with Hobbes's insistence on absolutism. To avoid the horrible prospect of governmental collapse and return to the state of nature, people should treat their sovereign as having absolute authority.
While Hobbes insists that we should regard our governments as having absolute authority, he reserves to subjects the liberty of disobeying those of their government's commands that would require them to sacrifice their lives or honor, at least when the commonwealth's survival does not depend on their doing so. This exception has understandably intrigued those who study Hobbes. His ascription of apparently inalienable rights -- what he calls the true liberties of subjects -- seems incompatible with his defense of absolute sovereignty. Moreover, if the sovereign's failure to provide adequate protection to subjects extinguishes their obligation to obey, and if it is left to each subject to judge for herself the adequacy of that protection, it seems that people have never really exited the fearsome state of nature.
The last crucial aspect of Hobbes's political philosophy is his treatment of religion. Hobbes progressively expands his discussion of Christian religion in each revision of his political philosophy, until it comes in Leviathan to comprise roughly half the book. There is no settled consensus on how Hobbes understands the significance of religion within his political theory. Some commentators have argued that Hobbes is trying to demonstrate to his readers the compatibility of his political theory with core Christian commitments, since it may seem that Christians' religious duties forbid their affording the sort of absolute obedience to their governors which Hobbes's theory requires of them. Others have doubted the sincerity of his professed Christianity, arguing that by the use of irony or other subtle rhetorical devices, Hobbes sought to undermine his readers' religious beliefs. Howsoever his intentions are properly understood, Hobbes's obvious concern with the power of religious belief is a fact that interpreters of his political philosophy must seek to explain.
The secondary literature on Hobbes's moral and political philosophy (not to speak of his entire body of work) is vast, appearing across many disciplines and in many languages. The following is a narrow selection of fairly recent works by philosophers, political theorists, and intellectual historians, available in English, on main areas of inquiry in Hobbes's moral and political thought. Very helpful for further reference is the critical bibliography of Hobbes scholarship to 1990 contained in Perez Zagorin, Hobbes on Our Mind, Journal of the History of Ideas, vol. 51, no. 2 (1990).
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First published: February 12, 2002
Content last modified: February 12, 2002