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Were I but capable of interpreting to the world one half the great thoughts and noble feelings which are buried in her grave, I should be the medium of a greater benefit to it, than is ever likely to arise from anything that I can write, unprompted and unassisted by her all but unrivalled wisdom.- John Stuart Mill
Harriet Taylor Mill (1807-1858) wrote primarily in the area of social-political philosophy, and had a particular interest in women's rights, buther essay, The Enfranchisement of Women notwithstandingthe body of work that she penned is probably not substantial enough for her to be judged a major figure in the history of philosophy on the basis of it alone. However, John Stuart Mill, her second husband, not only lavished praise on her intellect, emotional depth, and moral character, but also credited her with exerting a tremendous influence on his thought, with making major intellectual contributions to many of the works published in his name, and even with having been intimately involved in the composition of some of his most important works. Today scholars debate how much of a difference she really made to his corpus, whether whatever effect she had on it was an improving one, and whether she even came close to meriting the lavish praise that he heaped on her in passages such as the one quoted above from the dedication to On Liberty (J. S. Mill 1977, p. 216).
HTM and JSM met for the first time in 1830. Their meeting was arranged by the leader of HTM's Unitarian congregation, the Reverend W. J. Fox, to whom she had complained about John Taylor's lack of interest in philosophy and the arts. Of course there is no way to know if Fox anticipated that passionate feelings would spring up between JSM and HTM, although Josephine Kamm speculates that Fox, who was already married, might have sought to eliminate JSM as a competitor for the attentions of his soon-to-be mistress Eliza Flower (1977, 29f.). Whether this was Fox's intention or not, the two young people did very quickly fall in love.
Their conduct during the long period in which HTM was Mrs. John Taylor was quite scandalous by Victorian standards. Early on JSM would frequently, indeed almost nightly, visit the Taylors' home; John Taylor would usually facilitate these visits by going to his club. On the whole, John Taylor was remarkably tolerant of the fact that his wife, to whom he was utterly devoted, was on the most intimate of terms with another man, but his tolerance did have some limits. In 1833, at his insistence, HTM established a separate residence, and she lived apart from John Taylor for most of the rest of his life, seeing Mill at her convenience (Helen lived with her, Herbert and Haji with their father). In 1848 Taylor refused to allow JSM to dedicate The Principles of Political Economy to HTM, although the dedication was inserted into copies of the book that they distributed to friends. In 1849 John Taylor began to suffer from the cancer that would eventually take his life, and he asked HTM to return home to care for him. She declined, on the grounds that her first duty was to JSM, who at the time was suffering himself from an injured hip and temporary near-blindness. While JSM eventually mended John Taylor's condition only worsened, and at the end HTM did dedicate herself to caring for her husband. In fact, she rebuked JSM very sharply for having failed, while paying her a short visit, to ask about John Taylor's condition. She upbraided him even more severely for having suggested that she might write to him during an odd time when she might find a change of subject of thought a relief: Good God, sh[oul]d you think it a relief to think of something else some acquaintance or what not while I was dying? (H. T. Mill 1998, 360).
After John Taylor's death in 1849, JSM and HTM waited nearly two years before marrying. They had already largely withdrawn from society, due perhaps to the gossip that their relationship generated. After their marriage they spent much of their time in their Blackheath Park home with just Haji and Helen Taylor for company (although JSM did still go to work each day at the India House). JSM was so excessively sensitive to any perceived slight of his wife that he never forgave his mother and sisters for their failure to call on her immediately after being told of his impending nuptials. (When one bears in mind that he had not allowed his family to make any mention of HTM to that point one can understand why, out of their eagerness to please him, they had waited for instructions before doing anything.) The Mills did sometimes interrupt their reclusion to travel, separately or together, to the south of England or to the Continent in pursuit of a more healthful climate. In the Fall of 1858 they set out for Montpellier, but HTM's fragile health gave out in Avignon. JSM bought a small house there, next to the cemetery in which she was buried, where he spent a considerable portion of the remainder of his life. He died and was buried in Avignon in May 1873.
There have always been questions about the sexual dimension of the Mills' relationship, or rather about whether it had such a dimension. The most interesting question to many of their contemporaries was no doubt that of whether they were sexually involved prior to the death of John Taylor. They adamantly denied this. In his Autobiography JSM wrote that:
our relation to each other at that time was one of strong affection and confidential intimacy only. For though we did not consider the ordinances of society binding on a subject so entirely personal, we did feel bound that our conduct should be such as in no degree to bring discredit on her husband, nor therefore on herself. (J. S. Mill 1981, 237.)
Their private correspondence seems to bear this out (see for example H. T. Mill 1998, 375).
Today there is probably more interest in whether the Mills had a sexual relationship after their marriage, a question thathowever sordid and trivial it may appearcould bear on the serious matter of their views about sexuality. Some of their comments could be taken to suggest that the sex act is inherently degrading and that sexual gratification has no value (see for example J. S. Mill 1984, 285Mill is writing specifically about rape in this passage, but he seems to imply that in every instance the animal function of coitus is abjectiveand H. T. Mill 1998, 18, 226). Of course, they could have had non-philosophical reasons for failing to consummate their marriage. Sheer lack of interest is one obvious explanation; additionally, commentators have speculated both that JSM might have been impotent (Kamm 1977, 41) and that HTM might have contracted syphilis from her first husband (Jacobs 1998, xxx-xxxii). This is, in any case, a question to which we are unlikely to find a definitive answer.
HTM's contemporaries offer radically different impressions of her as a person. JSM's view is already fairly clear from the lines from the dedication to On Liberty that were quoted above, but in a venue free from the normal restrictions on length his description of her in his Autobiography really is worth quoting in full:
Although it was years after my introduction to Mrs. Taylor before my acquaintance with her became at all intimate or confidential, I very soon felt her to be the most admirable person I had ever known. It is not to be supposed that she was, or that any one, at the age at which I first saw her, could be, all that she afterwards became. Least of all could this be true of her, with whom self-improvement, progress in the highest and in all senses, was a law of her nature; a necessity equally from the ardour with which she sought it, and from the spontaneous tendency of faculties which could not receive an impression or an experience without making it the source or the occasion of an accession of wisdom. Up to the time when I first saw her, her rich and powerful nature had chiefly unfolded itself according to the received type of feminine genius. To her outer circle she was a beauty and a wit, with an air of natural distinction, felt by all who approached her: to the inner, a woman of deep and strong feeling, of penetrating and intuitive intelligence, and of an eminently meditative and poetic nature. Married at a very early age, to a most upright, brave, and honourable man, of liberal opinions and good education, but without the intellectual or artistic tastes which would have made him a companion for her, though a steady and affectionate friend, for whom she had true esteem and the strongest affection through life, and whom she most deeply lamented when dead; shut out by the social disabilities of women from any adequate exercise of her highest faculties in action on the world without; her life was one of inward meditation, varied by familiar intercourse with a small circle of friends, of whom one only (long since deceased) was a person of genius, or of capacities of feeling or intellect kindred with her own, but all had more or less of alliance with her in sentiments and opinions. Into this circle I had the good fortune to be admitted, and I soon perceived that she possessed in combination, the qualities which in all other persons whom I had known I had been only too happy to find singly. In her, complete emancipation from every kind of superstition (including that which attributes a pretended perfection to the order of nature and the universe), and an earnest protest against many things which are still part of the established constitution of society, resulted not from the hard intellect, but from strength of noble and elevated feeling, and co-existed with a highly reverential nature. In general spiritual characteristics, as well as in temperament and organisation, I have often compared her, as she was at this time, to Shelley: but in thought and intellect, Shelley, so far as his powers were developed in his short life, was but a child compared with what she ultimately became. Alike in the highest regions of speculation and in the smaller practical concerns of daily life, her mind was the same perfect instrument, piercing to the very heart and marrow of the matter; always seizing the essential idea or principle. The same exactness and rapidity of operation, pervading as it did her sensitive as well as her mental faculties, would, with her gifts of feeling and imagination, have fitted her to be a consummate artist, as her fiery and tender soul and her vigorous eloquence would certainly have made her a great orator, and her profound knowledge of human nature and discernment and sagacity in practical life, would, in the times when such a carriére was open to women, have made her eminent among the rulers of mankind. Her intellectual gifts did but minister to a moral character at once the noblest and the best balanced which I have ever met with in life. Her unselfishness was not that of a taught system of duties, but of a heart which thoroughly identified itself with the feelings of others, and often went to excess in consideration for them by imaginatively investing their feelings with the intensity of its own. The passion of justice might have been thought to be her strongest feeling, but for her boundless generosity, and a lovingness ever ready to pour itself forth upon any or all human beings who were capable of giving the smallest feeling in return. The rest of her moral characteristics were such as naturally accompany these qualities of mind and heart: the most genuine modesty combined with the loftiest pride; a simplicity and sincerity which were absolute, towards all who were fit to receive them; the utmost scorn of whatever was mean and cowardly, and a burning indignation at everything brutal or tyrannical, faithless or dishonourable in conduct and character, while making the broadest distinction between mala in se and mere mala prohibitabetween acts giving evidence of intrinsic badness in feeling and character, and those which are only violations of conventions either good or bad, violations which whether in themselves right or wrong, are capable of being committed by persons in every other respect lovable or admirable (J. S. Mill 1981, 193-7).
No one else who knew HTM personally spoke of her in anything like these terms, as far as we know, and indeed several of her contemporaries held her in low estimation. The Carlyles were admirers initially, but soon had changes of heart. Jane said that HTM was a peculiarly affected body who was not easy unless she startled you with unexpected sayings, and was in fact somewhat of a humbug (quoted in Packe 1954, 325f). Thomas said that She was full of unwise intellect, asking and re-asking stupid questions (quoted in Packe 1954, 315). Harold Laski related that Morley told me that Louis Blanc told him that he once sat for an hour with her and that she repeated to him what afterwards turned out to be an article that Mill had just finished for the Edinburgh. If she was what he thought, someone at least should have given us indications (quoted in Stillinger 1961, 24f).
There is, of course, a vast middle territory between these extremes, and it seems highly plausible that the truth about HTM lies somewhere within it. We certainly do not want to make the mistake of uncritically accepting the reports of the notoriously catty Carlyles. But at the same time we have clear evidence that JSM was unable to be absolutely objective where HTM was concerned. His description of her character, for example, leaves absolutely no room for vanity, yet HTM clearly was vain, if not, as Diana Trilling adds, also prideful and mean-spirited (1952, 120). Although it is important not to make this fault seem any more significant than it would in reference to a male philosopher, only a vain person would have allowed her husband to write a passage about her like the one that appeared in JSM's Autobiography (this passage was drafted in HTM's lifetime and she did help to edit the manuscripton this see JSM 1981, xix). Of course, because JSM's praise for HTM is so hyperbolic, to say that she was a little less gifted or marvelous than he took her to be is not necessarily to denigrate her; it is perfectly consistent with her being a singular person in every respect. She was not often described in judicious or balanced terms, but JSM's brother George, who knew her reasonably well, did relate to JSM's disciple and biographer Alexander Bain that Mrs. Taylor was a clever and remarkable woman, but nothing like what John took her to be (Bain 1882, 166).
When two persons have their thoughts and speculations completely in common; when all subjects of intellectual or moral interest are discussed between them in daily life, and probed to much greater depths than are usually or conveniently sounded in writings intended for general readers; when they set out from the same principles, and arrive at their conclusions by processes pursued jointly, it is of little consequence in respect to the question of originality, which of them holds the pen; the one who contributes least to the composition may contribute most to the thought; the writings which result are the joint product of both, and it must often be impossible to disentangle their respective parts, and affirm that this belongs to one and that to the other (J. S. Mill 1981, 251).
So while JSM implicitly acknowledged that his hand held the pen most often, when he and HTM collaborated, he also suggested that she contributed ideas to works that he was solely or primarily responsible for composing. In this wide sense, he continues, not only during the years of our married life, but during many of the years of confidential friendship which preceded it, all my published writings were as much my wife's work as mine; her share in them constantly increasing as years advanced (1981, 251). (Of course, this point cuts both ways. It also entails that we cannot uncritically assume that HTM was the source of all of the ideas in anything she penned, including The Enfranchisement of Women.)
JSM related that most of the ideas that HTM contributed to their joint work were at either the highest or the lowest levels of abstraction, where she particularly excelled as a thinker:
With those who, like all the best and wisest of mankind, are dissatisfied with human life as it is, and whose feelings are wholly identified with its radical amendment, there are two main regions of thought. One is the region of ultimate aims; the constituent elements of the highest realizable ideal of human life. The other is that of the immediately useful and practically attainable. In both these departments, I have acquired more from her teaching, than from all other sources taken together (1981, 197).
While HTM's strengths were in the most abstract and practical realms of thought, JSM took his own strength to lie in the uncertain and slippery intermediate region, that of theory, or moral and political science, including political economy, analytic psychology, logic, philosophy of history, etc. He acknowledged that HTM had very little to do with his first major work, A System of Logic (first published in 1843), or with his discussions of the more technical aspects of political economy. But much of his philosophical output, he suggested, conveyed her thoughts:
During the greater part of my literary life I have performed the office in relation to her, which from a rather early period I had considered as the most useful part that I was qualified to take in the domain of thought, that of an interpreter of original thinkers, and mediator between them and the public; for I had always a humble opinion of my own powers as an original thinker, except in abstract science but thought myself much superior to most of my contemporaries in willingness and ability to learn from everybody . I had, in consequence, marked out this as a sphere of usefulness in which I was under a special obligation to make myself active: the more so, as the acquaintance I had formed with the ideas of the Coleridgians, of the German thinkers, and of Carlyle, all of them fiercely opposed to the mode of thought in which I had been brought up, had convinced me that along with much error they possessed much truth . Thus prepared, it will easily be believed that when I came into close intellectual communion with a person of the most eminent faculties, whose genius, as it grew and unfolded itself in thought, continually struck out truths far in advance of me, but in which I could not, as I had done in those others, detect any mixture of error, the greatest part of my mental growth consisted in the assimilation of those truths, and the most valuable part of my intellectual work was in building the bridges and clearing the paths which connected them with my general system of thought (1981, pp. 251ff).
Moreover, there are two major works published in JSM's name of which he said that HTM was a co-author in the narrower sense of having been heavily involved in their actual composition. One is the Principles of Political Economy. The full title of this book is The Principles of Political Economy, With Some of Their Applications to Social Philosophy, and it was the portion of the book dealing with social philosophy that HTM helped to shape. This is especially true with respect to one chapter in particular, the one titled On the Probable Futurity of the Working Classes. This chapter argues that when they have made enough moral and intellectual progress the working classes can be expected to refuse to settle for mere wages; they will instead insist on arrangements in which they cooperatively own the firms for which they labor, and will at least experiment with Socialist and Communist communities of the sorts depicted by Saint-Simon, Fourier, Blanc, and Owen. JSM wrote that:
In the first draft of the book, that chapter did not exist. She pointed out the need of such a chapter, and the extreme imperfection of the book without it: she was the cause of my writing it; and the more general part of the chapter, the statement and discussion of the two opposite theories respecting the proper condition of the labouring classes, was wholly an exposition of her thoughts, often in words taken from her own lips. The purely scientific part of the Political Economy I did not learn from her; but it was chiefly her influence that gave to the book that general tone by which it is distinguished from all previous expositions of Political Economy that had any pretension to being scientific, and which has made it so useful in conciliating minds which those previous expositions had repelled . The economic generalizations which depend, not on necessities of nature but on those combined with the existing arrangements of society, it deals with only as provisional, and as liable to be much altered by the progress of social improvement. I had indeed partially learnt this view of things from the thoughts awakened in me by the speculations of the St. Simonians; but it was made a living principle pervading and animating the book by my wife's promptings (1981, 255ff).
HTM also played an active role in the process of revising later editions of the Principles. For example, the second (1849) edition was considerably more favorable to Socialism and even Communism, and this largely seems to reflect a change in HTM's thinking that JSM came to share as a result of her persuasion. In a letter written to HTM early in 1849, JSM pointed out that she now had marked dissent from a passage in the first edition raising an objection to Communism that was inserted on your proposition & very nearly in your own words. He continued:
This is probably only the progress we have always been making, & by thinking sufficiently I should probably come to think the sameas is almost always the case, I believe always when we think long enough (Hayek 1951, pp. 134f).
The other major work of which JSM says that HTM ought to be considered a co-author in the narrow sense is the essay On Liberty, which was published in the year after her death. The dedication of this essay, a portion of which has already been quoted, says that Like all that I have written for many years, it belongs as much to her as to me, and Mill later elaborated on HTM's role in the essay's production:
The Liberty was more directly and literally our joint production than anything else which bears my name, for there was not a sentence of it that was not several times gone through by us together, turned over in many ways, and carefully weeded of any faults, either in thought or expression, that we detected in it . With regard to the thoughts, it is difficult to identify any particular part or element as being more hers than all the rest. The whole mode of thinking of which the book was the expression, was emphatically hers . The Liberty is likely to survive longer than anything else that I have written (with the possible exception of the Logic), because the conjunction of her mind with mine has rendered it a kind of philosophic text-book of a single truth (1981, 257ff).
[Harriet's] early writings evince her dependence on Mill. For the later period of their partnership we have no valid evidence to show that Harriet turned Mill's mind toward new horizons or gave an unexpected significance to his thought . Mill without Harriet would still have been Mill. Mill married to George Eliot (or to Mary Wollstonecraftpermitting the anachronism) might have been transformed. Mary Ann Evans might have given him something new by way of independent thought and deeper feeling. Yet, considering her equality of stature, there would have been no need for him in masochistic guilt to magnify her contribution (1960, 47f).
Similarly, Francis Mineka says that Neither he [JSM] nor his recent biographers have convinced us that she was the originating mind behind his work . (1963, 306). Other commentators are willing to concede that HTM did exert a considerable influence over the direction of JSM's thought, but allege that her impact was decidedly for the worse, i.e., that she persuaded him to adopt positions that are rather obviously weaker than contrary ones that would otherwise have heldor, indeed, worse than positions he did hold during the periods at the beginning and/or end of his intellectual career when she was not in a position of ascendancy over him. Gertrude Himmelfarb makes this claim explicitly in her characterization of HTM's influence on JSM's views on liberty (1974), and it may be implicit in the celebrated free market economist Friedrich Hayek's account of her influence on his views on Socialism (1951).
Those who argue that HTM was something less than what JSM took her to be, and that he was even mistaken about her role in their intellectual partnership, must explain how he was so misled. There is a tradition of stating that, in essence, he fell victim to her feminine wiles. It was commonly held among their contemporaries that, as Bain observes, she imbibed all his views, and gave them back in her own form, by which he was flattered and pleased (1882, 173). Ruth Borchard says that Accustomed by training and experience to the acceptance of ascetic, masculine values, he was completely overpowered by her intensely feminine atmosphere (1957, 46). And Laski speculates: I should guess that she was a comfortable and sympathetic person and that Mill, brought up to fight Austin, Praed, Macaulay and Grote, had never met a really soft cushion before. (op. cit.). Some writers have even advanced the idea that after the death of his domineering father James Mill, JSM felt a need to invent another parental authority in order that he might submit to it (e.g., Trilling 1952, 118; Mazlish 1975, 286ff). Recently, Jo Ellen Jacobs has been outspoken in denying both that HTM lacked influence over Mill and that this influence had any other basis than his appreciation of her superb intellect. She writes that JSM was a big boy and could evaluate her reasoning (1998, xv), and claims that the failure of HTM's critics to recognize that she possessed a first-rate mind and that she engaged in genuine collaboration with JSM on roughly equal terms is largely due to sexism.
But even if this was her role, she must have been able to talk about those positions in an intelligent manner, to make them seem reasonable; otherwise JSM would never have been moved to try and make a case for them. At the very least, HTM surely did more than simply declare herself a Socialist, a radical (for the time) feminist, etc. Bain knew JSM extremely well, and even though he says that his friend was under an extraordinary hallucination as to the personal qualities of his wife, and outraged all reasonable credibility in describing her matchless genius, he is also adamant not only that JSM was not such an egoist as to be captivated by the echo of his own opinions but also that he would only have been stimulated by someone with independent resources who had a good mutual understanding as to the proper conditions of the problem at issue (1882, 173f). If HTM's primary contribution was that of stimulating JSM by suggestive talk, then her suggestive talk very likely included the idea that the social and political reforms she favored could help to foster the improvement of mankind. John Robson, the editor of JSM's Collected Works and author of a book on JSM titled The Improvement of Mankind, comments that [I]n what we have of her writings, Harriet constantly has her eye on the future, even when criticizing the present; she was a woman of dreams and aspirations, and she must constantly have breathed into Mill a hopeful and expansive view of human possibilities (1966, 178). JSM's defenses of Socialism, women's rights, and liberty were progressive not only in the sense that were in advance of Victorian opinion, but also in the sense of being grounded on a conception of man as a progressive being (1977, 224). Each was presented as a way of securing the necessary conditions for the moral and intellectual development of humanity, and JSM continually asserted that in the absence of this development the species would enjoy only a small fraction of the happiness of which it is capable. HTM's encouragement may have been largely responsible for the fact that the proposition that human improvement is desirable, and that in the right social and political context it is possible, loomed so large in his thought. If this is correct, then even if HTM bears little responsibility for the specifics of JSM's arguments for the social and political institutions and practices that she advocatedarguments on which much of his philosophical reputation restsshe would still be responsible not only for inspiring him to make those arguments but also for the fact that they have the general character they do.
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First published: March 11, 2002
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