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+ is closed: x,yz(x + y = z) + is associative: x,y,z(x + (y + z) = (x + y) + z) there is a neutral element: x(x + 0 = x) every element has an inverse: xy(x + y = y + x = 0)
x,y,z(x (y + z) = (x y) + (y z))
x,y,z((x + y) z) = (x z) + (y z))
It is straightforward to see that the real numbers with the usual addition and multiplication is a field. In this case the set F is infinite, but F can be finite as well. Then we have a finite field or a Galois field. There is however one very important distinction between a field such as and a Galois field. In the latter, given the multiplicative neutral element 1, there is a prime number p such that p1 = 0. p is called the characteristic of the field. It can be shown that if p is the characteristic of a field, then it must have pn elements, for some natural number n. In addition Galois fields are the only finite fields.
Example: the Galois field with characteristic 3 and number of elements 3, GF(3) for short.
The tables for addition and multiplication tell the whole story:
+ 0 1 2 0 0 1 2 1 1 2 0 2 2 0 1
0 1 2 0 0 0 0 1 0 1 2 2 0 2 1
In the first case, 1 + 1 + 1 = 0.
It is easy to see that the above tables correspond to addition and multiplication modulo p. In other words, in the field a = b if and only if a b (mod p).
To see how a finite field can be a model, I will take the incidence relation. The axioms for the incidence relation are:
In case we take GF(3) as a possible model, then to a point p corresponds to a couple (x,y), such that 0x,y2. A line corresponds to a triple (a,b,c), such that 0a,b,c2 and at most one of a = 0 or b = 0, or, equivalently, at most one of a0 or b0 (mod 3). The incidence relation is translated as follows: a point p lies on a line A iff if (x,y) corresponds to p and (a,b,c) corresponds to A, then the equation ax+by+c = 0 is satisfied, or, equivalently, ax+by+c0 (mod 3) is satisfied. Some facts are now straightforward to check:
A graphical representation could look like this:
The line indicated by A corresponds to x = y. This seems to correspond nicely to the classical Euclidean case. However something strange happens with the linear equation x + y = 0. In the drawing the 3 points that are on this line have been circled. As must be clear these lines are “bad” and should be "ignored" in the model.
In order to satisfy the remaining axioms further restrictions are required on the size of the domain. These will just be mentioned without details:
The second condition that is needed to guarantee the existence of the Euclidean "kernel" is a non-trivial statement. It actually requires some essential parts of number theory to prove that there are prime numbers of that form. There are, classically speaking, an infinite number of them. By choosing p large enough, one can make the kernel as large as one desires to have the Euclidean approximation as close as one wants.
Note: As Ernst Welti points out, it would be a rather annoying situation for a finitist if the proof that shows that there are an infinite number of primes of the right form were not finitistically acceptable. Although the original proof of Dirichlet was in fact unacceptable, fortunately there does now exist a finitistically acceptable proof of the theorem.
Return to Finitism in Geometry
First published: April 3, 2002
Content last modified: April 3, 2002