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Supplement to Nineteenth Century Geometry

(a) An n-manifoldIt is the pair <Mis a set of points that can be pieced together from partially overlapping patches, such that every point ofMlies in at least one patch.(b)

Mis endowed with a neighborhood structure (a topology) such that, if U is a patch ofM, there is a continuous one-one mappingfof U onto some region ofR^{n}, with continuous inversef^{-1}. (R^{n}denotes here the collection of all real number n-tuples, with the standard topology generated by the open balls.)fis a coordinate system orchartofM; the k-th number in the n-tuple assigned by a chartfto a point P inf's patch is called the k-th coordinate of P byf; the k-th coordinate function of chartfis the real-valued function that assigns to each point of the patch its k-th coordinate byf.(c) There is a collection

Aof charts ofM, which contains at least one chart defined on each patch ofMand is such that, if g and h belong toA, the composite mappings h g^{-1}and g h^{-1}--- known ascoordinate transformations--- are differentiable to every order wherever they are well defined. (Denote the real number n-tuple <a_{1}, ... , a_{n}> bya. The mapping h g^{-1}is well defined ataifais the valued assigned by g to some point P ofMto which h also assigns a value. Suppose that the latter value h(P) = <b_{1}, ... ,b_{n}> =b; then,b= h g^{-1}(a). Since h g^{-1}maps a region ofR^{n}intoR^{n}, it makes sense to say that h g^{-1}is differentiable.) Such a collectionAis called anatlas.^{[*]}

Let
<**M**,**A**>
be an n-manifold. To each point P of
**M**
one associates a vector space, which is known as the *tangent
space at P* and is denoted by
T_{P}**M**.
The idea is based on the intuitive notion of a plane tangent to a
surface at a given point. It can be constructed as follows. Let
be a one-one differentiable mapping of a real open interval **I**
into
**M**.
We can think of the successive values of
as
forming the path of a point that moves through
**M**
during a time interval represented by **I**. We call
a *curve* in **M**
(parametrized by u **I**). Put
(t_{0}) = P
for a fixed number t_{0} in
**I**. Consider the collection **F**(P) of all differentiable
real-valued functions defined on some neighborhood of P. With the
ordinary operations of function addition and multiplication by a
constant, **F**(P) has the structure of a vector space. Each
function
*f* in **F**(P) varies smoothly
with u, along the path of
,
in some neighborhood of P. Its rate of variation at P =
(t_{0})
is properly expressed by the derivative
d(*f*)/du at
u = t_{0}. As
*f* ranges over **F**(P), the
value of
d(*f*)/du
at u =
t_{0} is apt to vary in **R**. So we
have here a mapping of **F**(P) into **R**, which we denote by
(u). It is in fact a
linear function and therefore a vector in the dual space **F***(P)
of real-valued linear functions on **F**(P). Call it the
*tangent* to
at P. The tangents at P to all the curves whose paths go through P
span an n-dimensional subspace of **F***(P). This subspace is, by
definition, the tangent space
T_{P}**M**.
The tangent spaces at all points of an n-manifold
**M**
can be bundled together in a natural way into a 2n-manifold
T**M**.
The projection mapping
of
T**M** onto
**M** assigns to
each tangent vector **v** in
T_{P}**M**
the point (**v**)
at which **v** is tangent to
**M**. The structure
<T**M**,**M**,>
is the tangent bundle over
**M**.
A vector field on **M** is a section of
T**M**, i.e., a differentiable mapping
** f** of

Any vector space **V** is automatically associated with other
vector spaces, such as the dual space **V*** of linear functions
on **V**, and the diverse spaces of multilinear functions on
**V**, on **V***, and on any possible combination of **V**
and **V***. This holds, of course, for each tangent space of an
n-manifold
**M**. The dual of
T_{P}**M**
is known as the cotangent space at P. There is a natural way of
bundling together the cotangent spaces of **M**
into a 2n-manifold, the cotangent bundle. Generally speaking, all the
vector spaces of a definite type associated with the tangent and
cotangent spaces of
**M**
can be naturally bundled together into a k-manifolds (for suitable
integers k, depending on the nature of the bundled items). A section
of any of these bundles is a *tensor field* on
**M**
(of rank r, if the bundled objects are r-linear functions).

A *Riemannian metric* **g** on the n-manifold
<**M**,**A**>
is a tensor field of rank 2 on
**M**.
Thus, **g** assigns to each P in
**M** a bilinear function
**g**_{P} on
T_{P}**M**. For any P in
**M** and any vectors **v**, **w**, in
T_{P}**M**,
**g**_{P} must meet these requirements:

(i)It is worth noting that the so-called Lorentzian metrics defined by relativity theory on its spacetime models meet requirements (i) and (ii), but not (iii), and are therefore usually said to beg_{P}(v,w) =g_{P}(w,v) (symmetry)(ii)

g_{P}(v,w) = 0 for all vectorswin T_{P}Mif and only ifvis the 0-vector (non-degeneracy)(iii)

g_{P}(v,v) > 0 unlessvis the 0-vector (positive definiteness).

The length
(**v**) of a vector **v** in
T_{P}**M** is defined by
|(**v**)|^{2} =
**g**_{P}(**v**,**v**). Let
be a curve in
**M**. Let
(u) be the tangent to
at
the point (u). The length of
's path from
(*a*) to
(*b*) is measured by the integral

Thus, in Riemannian geometry, the length of the tangent vector (u) bears witness to the advance of curve g as it passes through the point (u). The definition of the length of a curve leads at once to the notion of a geodesic (or straightest) curve, which is characterized by the fact that its length is extremal; in other words, a geodesic is either the greatest or the shortest among all the curves that trace out neighboring paths between the same two points._{}((u))du

In his study of curved surfaces, Gauss introduced a real-valued
function, the *Gaussian curvature*, which measures a surface's
local deviation from flatness in terms of the surface's intrinsic
geometry. Riemann extended this concept of curvature to Riemannian
n-manifolds. He observed that each geodesic through a point in such a
manifold is fully determined by its tangent vector at that
point. Consider a point P in a Riemannian n-manifold
<**M**,**A**,**g**>
and two linearly independent vectors **v** and **w** in
T_{P}**M**. The geodesics
determined by all linear combinations of **v** and **w** form a
2-manifold about P, with a definite Gaussian curvature
K_{P}(**v**,**w**) at P. The real number
K_{P}(**v**,**w**) measures the curvature of
**M** at P in the ‘surface direction’ (Riemann 1854,
p. 145) fixed by **v** and **w**. Riemann (1861) thought up a
global mapping, depending on the metric **g**, that yields the
said values
K_{P}(**v**,**w**) on appropriate
arguments P, **v** and **w**. Nowadays this object is conceived
as a tensor field of rank 4, which assigns to each point P in a
Riemannian n-manifold
<**M**,**A**,**g**>
a 4-linear function on the tangent space
T_{P}**M**.
It is therefore known as the *Riemann tensor*. Given the above
definition of
K_{P}(**v**,**w**) it is clear
that, if n = 2, the Riemann tensor reduces to the Gaussian
curvature function.

Roberto Torretti

Universidad de Chile

Return to Nineteenth Century Geometry

*First published: July 26, 1999*

*Content last modified: July 26, 1999*