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- 1. Historical Development
- 2. Two Approaches to Evolutionary Game Theory
- 3. Why Evolutionary Game Theory?
- 4. Philosophical Problems of Evolutionary Game Theory
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Evolutionary game theory was first developed by R. A. Fisher [see
*The Genetic Theory of Natural Selection* (1930)] in his
attempt to explain the approximate equality of the sex ratio in
mammals. The puzzle Fisher faced was this: why is it that the sex
ratio is approximately equal in many species where the majority of
males never mate? In these species, the non-mating males would seem
to be excess baggage carried around by the rest of the population,
having no real use. Fisher realized that if we measure individual
fitness in terms of the expected number of *grandchildren*,
then individual fitness depends on the distribution of males and
females in the population. When there is a greater number of females
in the population, males have a higher individual fitness; when there
are more males in the population, females have a higher individual
fitness. Fisher pointed out that, in such a situation, the
evolutionary dynamics lead to the sex ratio becoming fixed at equal
numbers of males and females. The fact that individual fitness
depends upon the relative frequency of males and females in the
population introduces a strategic element into evolutions.

Fisher's argument can be understood game theoretically, but he did
not state it in those terms. In 1961, R. C. Lewontin made the
first explicit application of
game theory
to evolutionary biology in "Evolution and the Theory of Games" (not
to be confused with the Maynard Smith work of the same name). In
1972, Maynard Smith defined the concept of an *evolutionarily
stable strategy* (hereafter ESS) in the article "Game Theory and
the Evolution of Fighting." However, it was the publication of "The
Logic of Animal Conflict," by Maynard Smith and Price in 1973 that
introduced the concept of an ESS into widespread circulation. In
1982, Maynard Smith's seminal text *Evolution and the Theory of
Games* appeared, followed shortly thereafter by Robert Axelrod's
famous work *The Evolution of Cooperation* in 1984. Since
then, there has been a veritable explosion of interest by economists
and social scientists in evolutionary game theory (see the
bibliography below).

There are two approaches to evolutionary game theory. The first approach derives from the work of Maynard Smith and Price and employs the concept of an evolutionarily stable strategy as the principal tool of analysis. The second approach constructs an explicit model of the process by which the frequency of strategies change in the population and studies properties of the evolutionary dynamics within that model.

As an example of the first approach, consider the problem of the
Hawk-Dove game, analyzed by Maynard Smith and Price in "The Logic of
Animal Conflict." In this game, two individuals compete for a
resource of a fixed value *V*. (In biological contexts, the
value *V* of the resource corresponds to an increase in the
Darwinian fitness of the individual who obtains the resource; in a
cultural context, the value *V* of the resource would need to
be given an alternate interpretation more appropriate to the specific
model at hand.) Each individual follows exactly one of two
strategies described below:

HawkInitiate aggressive behaviour, not stopping until injured or until one's opponent backs down. DoveRetreat immediately if one's opponent initiates aggressive behaviour.

If we assume that (1) whenever two individuals both initiate
aggressive behaviour, conflict eventually results and the two
individuals are equally likely to be injured, (2) the cost of the
conflict reduces individual fitness by some constant value
*C*, (3) when a Hawk meets a Dove, the Dove immediately
retreats and the Hawk obtains the resource, and (4) when two Doves
meet the resource is shared equally between them, the fitness payoffs
for the Hawk-Dove game can be summarized according to the following
matrix:

HawkDoveHawk½( V-C)VDove0 V/2

Figure 1:The Hawk-Dove Game

(The payoffs listed in the matrix are for that of a player
*using* the strategy in the appropriate row, playing against
someone using the strategy in the appropriate column. For example,
if you play the strategy Hawk against an opponent who plays the
strategy Dove, your payoff is *V*; if you play the strategy
Dove against an opponent who plays the strategy Hawk, your payoff is
0.)

In order for a strategy to be evolutionarily stable, it must have
the property that if almost every member of the population follows
it, no mutant (that is, an individual who adopts a novel strategy)
can successfully invade. This idea can be given a precise
characterization as follows: Let
*F*(*s*_{1},*s*_{2})
denote the change in fitness for an individual following strategy
*s*_{1}
against an opponent following strategy
*s*_{2},
and let *F*(*s*) denote the total fitness of an
individual following strategy *s*; furthermore, suppose that
each individual in the population has an initial fitness of
*F*_{0}.
If
is an evolutionarily stable strategy and
a mutant attempting to invade the population, then

F() =F_{0}+ (1-p)F(,) +pF(,)

F() =F_{0}+ (1-p)F(,) +pF(,)

where *p* is the proportion of the population following the
mutant strategy
.

Since
is evolutionarily stable, the fitness of an individual following
must be greater than the fitness of an individual following
(otherwise the mutant following
would be able to invade), and so
*F*()
>
*F*().
Now, as *p* is very close to 0, this requires that
*either* that

F(,) >F(,)

(This is the definition of an ESS that Maynard Smith and Price give.) In other words, what this means is that a strategy is an ESS if one of two conditions holds: (1) does better playing against than any mutant does playing against , or (2) some mutant does just as well playing against as , but does better playing against the mutant than the mutant does.F(,) =F(,) andF(,) >F(,)

Given this characterization of an evolutionarily stable strategy, one
can readily confirm that, for the Hawk-Dove game, the strategy Dove
is not evolutionarily stable because a pure population of Doves can
be invaded by a Hawk mutant. If the value *V* of the resource
is greater than the cost *C* of injury (so that it is worth
risking injury in order to obtain the resource), then the strategy
Hawk is evolutionarily stable. In the case where the value of the
resource is *less* than the cost of injury, there is no
evolutionarily stable strategy if individuals are restricted to
following pure strategies, although there is an evolutionarily stable
strategy if players may use mixed
strategies.^{[1]}

As an example of the second approach, consider the well-known Prisoner's Dilemma. In this game, individuals choose one of two strategies, typically called "Cooperate" and "Defect." Here is the general form of the payoff matrix for the prisoner's dilemma:

where

CooperateDefectCooperate( R,R)( S,T)Defect( T,S)( P,P)

Figure 2:Payoff Matrix for the Prisoner's Dilemma.

Payoffs listed as (row, column).

How will a population of individuals that repeatedly plays the
Prisoner's Dilemma evolve? We cannot answer that question without
introducing a few assumptions concerning the nature of the
population. First, let us assume that the population is quite large.
In this case, we can represent the state of the population by simply
keeping track of what proportion follow the strategies Cooperate and
Defect. Let *p _{c}* and

Second, let us assume that the proportion of the population following the strategies Cooperate and Defect in the next generation is related to the proportion of the population following the strategies Cooperate and Defect in the current generation according to the rule:W_{D}=F_{0}+p_{c}F(C,C) +p_{d}F(C,D)

W_{D}=F_{0}+p_{c}F(D,C) +p_{d}F(D,D)

=p_{c}W_{C}+p_{d}W_{D}

We can rewrite these expressions in the following form:

If we assume that the change in the strategy frequency from one generation to the next are small, these difference equations may be approximated by the differential equations:

These equations were offered by Taylor and Jonker (1978) and Zeeman
(1979) to provide continuous dynamics for evolutionary game theory
and are known as the *replicator dynamics*.

The replicator dynamics may be used to model a population of individuals playing the Prisoner's Dilemma. For the Prisoner's Dilemma, the expected fitness of Cooperating and Defecting are:

and

W_{C}= F_{0}+p_{c}F(C,C) +p_{d}F(C,D)= F_{0}+p_{c}R+p_{d}S

Since

W_{D}= F_{0}+p_{c}F(D,C) +p_{d}F(D,D)= F_{0}+p_{c}T+p_{d}P.

and

Since the strategy frequencies for Defect and Cooperate in the next generation are given by

and

respectively, we see that over time the proportion of the population choosing the strategy Cooperate eventually becomes extinct. Figure 3 illustrates one way of representing the replicator dynamical model of the prisoner's dilemma, known as a state-space diagram.

Figure 3:The Replicator Dynamical Model of the Prisoner's Dilemma

We interpret this diagram as follows: the leftmost point represents
the state of the population where everyone defects, the rightmost
point represents the state where everyone cooperates, and
intermediate points represent states where some proportion of the
population defects and the remainder cooperates. (One maps states of
the population onto points in the diagram by mapping the state when
*N*% of the population defects onto the point of the line
*N*% of the way to the leftmost point.) Arrows on the line
represent the evolutionary trajectory followed by the population over
time. The open circle at the rightmost point indicates that the
state where everybody cooperates is an unstable equilibrium, in the
sense that if a small portion of the population deviates from the
strategy Cooperate, then the evolutionary dynamics will drive the
population away from that equilibrium. The solid circle at the
leftmost point indicates that the state where everybody Defects is a
stable equilibrium, in the sense that if a small portion of the
population deviates from the strategy Defect, then the evolutionary
dynamics will drive the population back to the original equilibrium
state.

At this point, one may see little difference between the two
approaches to evolutionary game theory. One can confirm that, for
the Prisoner's Dilemma, the state where everybody defects is the only
ESS. Since this state is the only stable equilibrium under the
replicator dynamics, the two notions fit together quite neatly: the
only stable equilibrium under the replicator dynamics occurs when
everyone in the population follows the only ESS. In general, though,
the relationship between ESSs and stable states of the replicator
dynamics is more complex than this example suggests. Taylor and
Jonker (1978), as well as Zeeman (1979), establish conditions under
which one may infer the existence of a stable state under the
replicator dynamics given an evolutionarily stable strategy.
Roughly, if only two pure strategies exist, then given a (possibly
mixed) evolutionarily stable strategy, the corresponding state of the
population is a stable state under the replicator dynamics. (If the
evolutionarily stable strategy is a mixed strategy *S*, the
corresponding state of the population is the state in which the
proportion of the population following the first strategy equals the
probability assigned to the first strategy by *S*, and the
remainder follow the second strategy.) However, this can fail to be
true if more than two pure strategies exist.

The connection between ESSs and stable states under an evolutionary
dynamical model is weakened further if we do not model the dynamics
by the replicator dynamics. For example, suppose we use a local
interaction model in which each individual plays the prisoner's
dilemma with his or her neighbors. Nowak and May (1992, 1993), using
a spatial model in which local interactions occur between individuals
occupying neighboring nodes on a square lattice, show that stable
population states for the prisoner's dilemma depend upon the specific
form of the payoff
matrix.^{[2]}

When the payoff matrix for the population has the values *T*
= 2.8, *R* = 1.1, *P* = 0.1, and *S* = 0, the
evolutionary dynamics of the local interaction model agree with those
of the replicator dynamics, and lead to a state where each individual
follows the strategy Defect--which is, as noted before, the only
evolutionarily stable strategy in the prisoner's dilemma. The figure
below illustrates how rapidly one such population converges to a
state where everyone defects.

However, when the payoff matrix has values of

Generation 1 Generation 2 Generation 3 Generation 4 Generation 5 Generation 6

Figure 4:Prisoner's Dilemma: All Defect

[view a movie of this model]

Notice that with these particular settings of payoff values, the evolutionary dynamics of the local interaction model differ significantly from those of the replicator dynamics. Under these payoffs, the stable states have no corresponding analogue in either the replicator dynamics nor in the analysis of evolutionarily stable strategies.

Generation 1 Generation 2 Generation 19 Generation 20

Figure 5:Prisoner's Dilemma: Cooperate

[view a movie of this model]

A phenomenon of greater interest occurs when we choose payoff values
of *T* = 1.61, *R* = 1.01, *P* = 0.01, and
*S* = 0. Here, the dynamics of local interaction lead to
a world constantly in flux: under these values regions occupied
predominantly by Cooperators may be successfully invaded by
Defectors, and regions occupied predominantly by Defectors may be
successfully invaded by Cooperators. In this model, there is no
"stable strategy" in the traditional dynamical
sense.^{[3]}

Generation 1 Generation 3 Generation 5 Generation 7 Generation 9 Generation 11 Generation 13 Generation 15

Figure 6:Prisoner's Dilemma: Chaotic

[view a movie of this model]

These models demonstrate that, although numerous cases exist in which both approaches to evolutionary game theory arrive at the same conclusion regarding which strategies one would expect to find present in a population, there are enough differences in the outcomes of the two modes of analysis to justify the development of each program.

Yet a difficulty arises with the use of Nash equilibrium as a solution concept for games: if we restrict players to using pure strategies, not every game has a Nash equilbrium. The game "Matching Pennies" illustrates this problem.

HeadsTailsHeads(0,1) (1,0) Tails(1,0) (0,1)

Figure 7:Payoff matrix for the game of Matching Pennies

(Row wins if the two coins do not match, whereas Column wins if the two coins match).

While it is true that every noncooperative game in which players may use mixed strategies has a Nash equilibrium, some have questioned the significance of this for real agents. If it seems appropriate to require rational agents to adopt only pure strategies (perhaps because the cost of implementing a mixed strategy runs too high), then the game theorist must admit that certain games lack solutions.

A more significant problem with invoking the Nash equilibrium as the
appropriate solution concept arises because games exist which have multiple
Nash equilibria (see Section 2.5,
Solution Concepts and Equilibria, in the entry on game theory).
When there are several different Nash equilibria, how is a rational
agent to decide which of the several equilibria is the "right one" to
settle
upon?^{[5]}
Attempts to resolve this problem have produced a number of possible
refinements to the concept of a Nash equilibrium, each refinement
having some intuitive purchase. Unfortunately, so many refinements
of the notion of a Nash equilibrium have been developed that, in many
games which have multiple Nash equilibria, each equilibrium could be
justified by some refinement present in the literature. The problem
has thus shifted from choosing among multiple Nash equilibria to
choosing among the various refinements. Some (see Samuelson (1997),
*Evolutionary Games and Equilibrium Selection*) hope that
further development of evolutionary game theory can be of service in
addressing this issue.

Numerous results from experimental economics have shown that these
strong rationality assumptions do not describe the behavior of real
human subjects. Humans are rarely (if ever) the hyperrational agents
described by traditional game theory. For example, it is not
uncommon for people, in experimental situations, to indicate that
they prefer *A* to *B*, *B* to *C*, and
*C* to *A*. These "failures of the transitivity of
preference" would not occur if people had a well-defined consistent
set of preferences. Furthermore, experiments with a class of games
known as a "beauty pageant" show, quite dramatically, the failure of
common knowledge assumptions typically invoked to solve
games.^{6]}
Since evolutionary game theory successfully explains the
predominance of certain behaviors of insects and animals, where
strong rationality assumptions clearly fail, this suggests that
rationality is not as central to game theoretic analyses as
previously thought. The hope, then, is that evolutionary game theory
may meet with greater success in describing and predicting the
choices of human subjects, since it is better equipped to handle the
appropriate weaker rationality assumptions.

We repeat most emphatically that our theory is thoroughly static. A dynamic theory would unquestionably be more complete and therefore preferable. But there is ample evidence from other branches of science that it is futile to try to build one as long as the static side is not thoroughly understood. (Von Neumann and Morgenstern, 1953, p. 44)The theory of evolution is a dynamical theory, and the second approach to evolutionary game theory sketched above explicitly models the dynamics present in interactions among individuals in the population. Since the traditional theory of games lacks an explicit treatment of the dynamics of rational deliberation, evolutionary game theory can be seen, in part, as filling an important lacuna of traditional game theory.

One may seek to capture some of the dynamics of the decision-making process in traditional game theory by modeling the game in its extensive form, rather than its normal form. However, for most games of reasonable complexity (and hence interest), the extensive form of the game quickly becomes unmanageable. Moreover, even in the extensive form of a game, traditional game theory represents an individual's strategy as a specification of what choice that individual would make at each information set in the game. A selection of strategy, then, corresponds to a selection, prior to game play, of what that individual will do at any possible stage of the game. This representation of strategy selection clearly presupposes hyperrational players and fails to represent the process by which one player observes his opponent's behavior, learns from these observations, and makes the best move in response to what he has learned (as one might expect, for there is no need to model learning in hyperrational individuals). The inability to model the dynamical element of game play in traditional game theory, and the extent to which evolutionary game theory naturally incorporates dynamical considerations, reveals an important virtue of evolutionary game theory.

As noted previously, evolutionary game theoretic models may often be
given both a biological and a cultural evolutionary interpretation.
In the biological interpretation, the numeric quantities which play a
role analogous to "utility" in traditional game theory correspond to
the fitness (typically Darwinian fitness) of
individuals.^{[7]}
How does one interpret "fitness" in the cultural evolutionary
interpretation?

In many cases, fitness in cultural evolutionary interpretations of evolutionary game theoretic models directly measures some objective quantity of which it can be safely assumed that (1) individuals always want more rather than less and (2) interpersonal comparisons are meaningful. Depending on the particular problem modeled, money, slices of cake, or amount of land would be appropriate cultural evolutionary interpretations of fitness. Requiring that fitness in cultural evolutionary game theoretic models conform to this interpretative constraint severely limits the kinds of problems that one can address. A more useful cultural evolutionary framework would provide a more general theory which did not require that individual fitness be a linear (or strictly increasing) function of the amount of some real quantity, like amount of food.

In traditional game theory, a strategy's fitness was measured by the expected utility it had for the individual in question. Yet evolutionary game theory seeks to describe individuals of limited rationality (commonly known as "boundedly rational" individuals), and the utility theory employed in traditional game theory assumes highly rational individuals. Consequently, the utility theory used in traditional game theory cannot simply be carried over to evolutionary game theory. One must develop an alternate theory of utility/fitness, one compatible with the bounded rationality of individuals, that is sufficient to define a utility measure adequate for the application of evolutionary game theory to cultural evolution.

Another question facing evolutionary game theoretic explanations of social phenomena concerns the kind of explanation it seeks to give. Depending on the type of explanation it seeks to provide, are evolutionary game theoretic explanations of social phenomena irrelevant or mere vehicles for the promulgation of pre-existing values and biases? To understand this question, recognize that one must ask whether evolutionary game theoretic explanations target the etiology of the phenomenon in question, the persistence of the phenomenon, or various aspects of the normativity attached to the phenomenon. The latter two questions seem deeply connected, for population members typically enforce social behaviors and rules having normative force by sanctions placed on those failing to comply with the relevant norm; and the presence of sanctions, if suitably strong, explains the persistence of the norm. The question regarding a phenomenon's etiology, on the other hand, can be considered independent of the latter questions.

If one wishes to explain how some currently existing social
phenomenon came to be, it is unclear why approaching it from the
point of view of evolutionary game theory would be particularily
illuminating. The etiology of any phenomenon is a unique historical
event and, as such, can only be discovered empirically, relying on
the work of sociologists, anthropologists, archaeologists, and the
like. Although an evolutionary game theoretic model may exclude
certain historical sequences as possible histories (since one may be
able to show that the cultural evolutionary dynamics preclude one
sequence from generating the phenomenon in question), it seems
unlikely that an evolutionary game theoretic model would indicate a
unique historical sequence suffices to bring about the phenomenon.
An empirical inquiry would then still need to be conducted to rule
out the extraneous historical sequences admitted by the model, which
raises the question of what, if anything, was gained by the
construction of an evolutionary game theoretic model in the
intermediate stage. Moreover, even if an evolutionary game theoretic
model indicated that a single historical sequence was capable of
producing a given social phenomenon, there remains the important
question of why we ought to take this result seriously. One may
point out that since nearly any result can be produced by a model by
suitable adjusting of the dynamics and initial conditions, all that
the evolutionary game theorist has done is provide one such model.
Additional work needs to be done to show that the underlying
assumptions of the model (both the cultural evolutionary dynamics and
the initial conditions) are empirically supported. Again, one may
wonder what has been gained by the evolutionary model--would it not
have been just as easy to determine the cultural dynamics and initial
conditions beforehand, constructing the model afterwards? If so, it
would seem that the contributions made by evolutionary game theory in
this context simply are a proper part of the parent social
science--sociology, anthropology, economics, and so on. If so, then
there is nothing *particular* about evolutionary game theory
employed in the explanation, and this means that, contrary to
appearances, evolutionary game theory is really irrelevant to the
given explanation.

If evolutionary game theoretic models do not explain the etiology of a social phenomenon, presumably they explain the persistence of the phenomenon or the normativity attached to it. Yet we rarely need an evolutionary game theoretic model to identify a particular social phenomenon as stable or persistent as that can be done by observation of present conditions and examination of the historical records; hence the charge of irrelevancy is raised again. Moreover, most of the evolutionary game theoretic models developed to date have provided the crudest approximations of the real cultural dynamics driving the social phenomenon in question. One may well wonder why, in these cases, we should take seriously the stability analysis given by the model; answering this question would require one engage in an empirical study as previously discussed, ultimately leading to the charge of irrelevance again.

This criticism seems less serious than the charge of irrelevancy.
Cultural evolutionary game theoretic explanations of norms need not
"smuggle in" normative claims in order to draw normative conclusions.
The theory already contains, in its core, a proper subtheory having
normative content--namely a theory of rational choice in which
boundedly rational agents act in order to maximize, as best as they
can, their own self-interest. One may challenge the suitability of
this as a foundation for the normative content of certain claims, but
this is a different criticism from the above charge. Although
cultural evolutionary game theoretic models do act as vehicles for
promulgating certain values, they wear those minimal value
commitments on their sleeve. Evolutionary explanations of social
norms have the virtue of making their value commitments explicit and
also of showing how other normative commitments (such as fair
division in certain bargaining situations, or cooperation in the
prisoner's dilemma) may be derived from the principled action of
boundedly rational, self-interested agents.

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*First published: January 14, 2002*

*Content last modified: September 4, 2002*