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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic


1. These models of second-order logic with a Comprehension Principle for Concepts are called ‘general models’ (as opposed to ‘standard’ models in which the domain of concepts is taken to be the power set of domain of objects). These general models exploit the fact that there are only a denumerably infinite number of conditions on objects expressible in the language and hence, only a denumerably infinite number of instances of comprehension. These general models include in the domain of concepts only enough concepts to make these instances of comprehension true. Thus, only a denumerably infinite number of concepts are required, even if the domain of objects is denumerably infinite. So we emphasize that it is the interaction of the Comprehension Principle for Concepts with Vb that engenders the paradox.

2. It is important to note here that Frege's definitions of the membership relation and the notion of equinumerosity require a second-order language, since both definitions involve quantification over concepts.

3. Frege doesn't call this principle ‘Hume's Principle’ in his own writings. The label was instead introduced in Boolos (1987). Frege did cite Hume when he introduced this principle in Gl. In Gl, §63, he quotes Hume's Treatise (I, iii, 1):

When two numbers are so combined as that one has always an unite answering to every unite of the other, we pronounce them equal.
The idea in Hume does bear some resemblance to the principle Frege constructs, and so we shall continue to use Boolos' label for this principle.

4. We call this an implicit or contextual definition rather than an explicit definition because the notation #F can only be eliminated when it appears in a context of the form ‘#F = #G’. By contrast, an explicit definition would take the form:

#F   =df   the object x such that (x,F),
where (x,F) is some condition on x and F. This would allow us to eliminate the #F no matter in which context it appears. We shall examine Frege's attempt to give such a definition momentarily.

The reader might also find the following observation by Demopoulos useful:

Moreover, Frege's contextual definition (i.e., Hume's Principle) is not ‘conservative’ over the language L = {0, S, N} of second order arithmetic. (It is not conservative because it allows one to prove statements that are otherwise unprovable using this language and second-order logic alone. A proper, explicit definition only introduces simplifying notation --- the new theorems formulable with the new notation introduced by an explicit definition would still have been provable had the new notation been eliminated in terms of primitive notation. As such, explicit definitions are conservative.) Indeed, the contextual definition allows for the proof both of the infinity of the sequence of natural numbers and of the existence of an infinite cardinal (which Frege called ‘endlos’ in Gl).
[from Demopoulos (forthcoming-a)]

5. The reader might find the following observation by Demopoulos useful.

The characterization "Frege-Russell", nearly universal and certainly well-established, actually slurs over the fact that, from the point of view of Russell's Simple Theory of Types, the number associated with a set (the analogue, in this setting, of a concept of first level) is an entity of higher type than the set itself. Beginning with individuals -- entities of lowest type -- Russell proceeds first to sets of individuals (corresponding to Frege's first-level concepts) and thence to classes of such sets (corresponding to Frege's concepts of second level). For Russell, since numbers are classes of equinumerous sets, they are of higher type than sets. But for Frege, extensions, and therefore numbers, belong to the totality of objects whatever the level of concept with which they are associated. Thus, while Russell and Frege both subscribe to some version of Hume's Principle, their conceptions of the logical form of the cardinality operator, and therefore, that of the principle itself, are quite different: the operator is "type-raising" for Russell, since it takes us from a set to a class; while for Frege it is "type-lowering", since it takes a concept (set) to an object (individual). This difference is fundamental, since it enables Frege to establish -- on the basis of Hume's principle -- those of the Peano-Dedekind axioms of arithmetic which assert that the system of natural numbers is, in Dedekind's phrase, "simply infinite" (Dedekind infinite). By contrast, when the cardinality operator is type raising, Hume's principle is rather weak, allowing for models of every finite power. (See Bell (1996) and Boolos (1994) for further discussion of these matters.)
[from Demopoulos (forthcoming-a)]

6. The higher-order version of the Law of Extensions asserts that a concept G is a member of the extension of the second-order concept concept equinumerous to F iff G is equinumerous to F. If we temporarily suppose that the variable can be used a variable ranging over concepts, then we could represent the extension of the second-order concept just described as:

( F)
Then, the higher-order law of extensions would be formalizable as follows:
G ( F)     G F
This principle is used implicitly on several occasions in the derivation of Hume's Principle in Gl. Those readers who read the material on the derivation of Hume's Principle in Gg will see that this principle gets reformulated as the Lemma to the Proof of Hume's Principle.

7. Strictly speaking, we should represent this concept as follows:

[z [y Ayp]z & zr]
But we have applied the following instance of -Conversion to the first conjunct within the matrix of the -expression:
[y Ayp]z Azp
We thereby simplify the entire expression to:
[z Azp & zr]

8. The Facts numbered 3, 4, 5, and 6 correspond to Theorems 124, 129, 123, and 128, respectively, in Gg I. Facts 1, 6, and 7 correspond to Propositions 91, 84, and 98, respectively, in Part III of Begr.

9. Facts 2, 3, 5, and 6 correspond to Theorems 134, 132, 141, and 144, respectively, in Gg I.

10. A relation R is one-to-one ("R is 1-1") just in case it satisfies the following condition:

Rxz & Ryz x=y
So Fact 7 in the text is a fact about the weak ancestral whenever the relation R in question is 1-1. We shall prove that the Predecessor relation is 1-1 in the third subsection of Section 5. Then Fact 7 and the fact that Predecessor is 1-1 will both play a crucial role in the proof that every number has a successor.

To prove Fact 7, assume that R*(a,b), Rcb and that R is 1-1. We want to show R+(a,c). Now by Fact 5 concerning the weak ancestral, we know that it follows from R*(a,b) that z[Rzb & R+(a,z)]. So call an arbitrary such object "d". So we know Rdb & R+(a,d). Now since R is 1-1, it follows from Rdb and Rcb, that c=d. So, R+(a,c), which is what we had to show.

11. See the work by Wright cited in the Bibliography for a defense of something like this position. Wright justifies this position on Fregean grounds by appealing to Frege's Context Principle, which asserts that a word has no meaning (reference) except in the context of a proposition (truth).

12. See the paper by Rosen in the Bibliography for a full discussion of how someone might claim that the right-hand condition of an instance might imply its corresponding left-hand condition.

13. Again, see the work by Wright cited in the Bibliography.

14. In the long footnote to §10, Frege seems to suggest that the idea of replacing the truth values with their unit classes cannot be extended to the case of every object in the domain without conflicting with his earlier stipulations (in Gg I, §§3, 9 and 20), and in particular, with Basic Law V.

15. Wehmeier (1999) also shows that Frege could not have had much luck restricting the quantifiers of Gg to extensions. Wehmeier considers two consistent subsytems that Frege might have adopted to avoid the contradiction, namely, the system H described in Heck (1996) and the system Wehmeier himself describes and labels TDelta. Both of these systems retain Basic Law V but place restrictions on the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. However, Wehmeier shows that both systems imply the existence of objects which are not extensions (or courses-of-values), and indeed, they imply an infinite number of such objects.

Copyright © 2001 by
Edward N. Zalta

First published: May 7, 2001
Content last modified: May 7, 2001