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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of Fact 5 Concerning the Weak Ancestral

Fact 5 concerning the weak ancestral R+ of Rasserts:
Fact 5 (R+):
R*(x,y) z[Rzy & R+(x,z)]
To prove this, we shall appeal to Fact 5 concerning the ancestral R* of R:
Fact 5 (R*):
[R*(x,y) & u(Rxu Fu) & Her(F,R)] Fy,
for any concept F and objects x and y:

Now to prove Fact 5 (R+), assume R*(a,b). We want to show:

z[Rzb & R+(a,z)]
Notice that by -Conversion, it suffices to show:
[w  z[Rzw & R+(a,z)]b
Let us use ‘P’ to denote this concept under which (we have to show) b falls. Notice that we could prove Pb by instantiating Fact 5 (R*) to P, a, and b and establishing the antecedent of the result. In other words, by Fact (R*), we know:
[R*(a,b) & u(Rau Pu) & Her(P,R)] Pb
So if we can show the conjuncts of the antecedent, we are done. The first conjunct is already established, by hypothesis. So we have to show:
(1)   u(Rau Pu)
(2)   Her(P,R)
To see what we have to show for (1), we expand our defined notation and simplify by using -Conversion. Thus, we have to show:
(1)   u[Rau z(Rzu & R+(a,z))]
So assume Rau, to show the consequent of (1). But it is an immediate consequence of the definition of the weak ancestral R+ that R+ is reflexive. (This is Fact 8 concerning the weak ancestral, in Section 4, "The Weak Ancestral of R".) So we may conjoin and conclude Rau & R+(a,a). From this, we may infer consequent of (1), by existential generalization, which is what we had to show.

To show (2), we have to show that P is hereditary on R. If we expand our defined notation and simplify by using -Conversion), then we have to show:

(2)   Rxy [z(Rzx & R+(a,z)) z(Rzy & R+(a,z))]
So assume
(A)   Rxy & z(Rzx & R+(a,z))
to show: z(Rzy & R+(a,z)). From the second conjunct of (A), we know that there is some object, say d, such that:
Rdx & R+(a,d); i.e.,
R+(a,d) & Rdx
So, by Fact 2 about the weak ancestral (Section 4, "The Weak Ancestral of R"), it follows that R*(a,x), from which it immediately follows that R+(a,x), by definition of R+. So, by appealing to the first conjunct of (A), we have:
Rxy & R+(a,x),
from which it follows that:
z(Rzy & R+(a,z)),
which is what we had to show.

Return to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Copyright © 1999 by
Edward N. Zalta

First published: November 22, 1999
Content last modified: November 22, 1999