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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

## Proof of Fact 5 Concerning the Weak Ancestral

Fact 5 concerning the weak ancestral *R*^{+} of *R*asserts:
**Fact 5 (***R*^{+}):

*R**(*x*,*y*)
*z*[*Rzy* & *R*^{+}(*x*,*z*)]

To prove this, we shall appeal to Fact 5 concerning
the ancestral *R** of *R*:
**Fact 5 (***R**):

[*R**(*x*,*y*) &
*u*(*Rxu*
*Fu*) & Her(*F*,*R*)]
*Fy*,

for any concept *F* and objects *x* and *y*:
Now to prove Fact 5 (*R*^{+}), assume
*R**(*a*,*b*). We want to show:

*z*[*Rzb* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*)]

Notice that by -Conversion, it suffices
to show:
[*w*
*z*[*Rzw* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*)]*b*

Let us use ‘*P*’ to denote this concept under which (we have to
show) *b* falls. Notice that we could prove *Pb* by
instantiating Fact 5 (*R**) to *P*, *a*, and *b*
and establishing the antecedent of the result. In other words,
by Fact (*R**), we know:
[*R**(*a*,*b*) &
*u*(*Rau*
*Pu*) & Her(*P*,*R*)]
*Pb*

So if we can show the conjuncts of the antecedent, we are done.
The first conjunct is already established, by hypothesis. So we have
to show:
(1) *u*(*Rau*
*Pu*)

(2) Her(*P*,*R*)

To see what we have to show for (1), we expand our defined notation
and simplify by using -Conversion. Thus, we
have to show:
(1) *u*[*Rau*
*z*(*Rzu* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*))]

So assume *Rau*, to show the consequent of (1). But it is an
immediate consequence of the definition of the weak ancestral
*R*^{+} that *R*^{+} is reflexive. (This
is Fact 8 concerning the weak ancestral, in Section 4, "The Weak
Ancestral of *R*".) So we may conjoin and conclude *Rau*
& *R*^{+}(*a*,*a*). From this, we may
infer consequent of (1), by existential generalization, which is what
we had to show.
To show (2), we have to show that *P* is hereditary on *R*.
If we expand our defined notation and simplify by using
-Conversion), then we have to show:

(2) *Rxy*
[*z*(*Rzx*
& *R*^{+}(*a*,*z*))
*z*(*Rzy* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*))]

So assume
(A) *Rxy* & *z*(*Rzx*
& *R*^{+}(*a*,*z*))

to show: *z*(*Rzy* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*)). From the second conjunct
of (A), we know that there is some object, say *d*, such that:
*Rdx* & *R*^{+}(*a*,*d*); i.e.,

*R*^{+}(*a*,*d*) & *Rdx*

So, by Fact 2 about the weak ancestral (Section 4, "The Weak
Ancestral of *R*"), it follows that
*R**(*a*,*x*), from which it immediately follows that
*R*^{+}(*a*,*x*), by definition of
*R*^{+}. So, by appealing to the first conjunct of (A),
we have:
*Rxy* & *R*^{+}(*a*,*x*),

from which it follows that:
*z*(*Rzy* &
*R*^{+}(*a*,*z*)),

which is what we had to show.
Return to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Copyright © 1999 by

Edward N. Zalta

*zalta@stanford.edu*
*First published: November 22, 1999*

*Content last modified: November 22, 1999*