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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege’s Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

## Proof that 0 Falls Under *Q*

The proof that 0 falls under *Q* is relatively
straightforward. We want to show:
[*y* *Precedes*(*y*,#[*z* *Precedes*^{+}(*z*,*y*)])]0

By -Conversion, it suffices to show:
*Precedes*(0, #[*z*
*Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)])

So, by the definition of Predecessor, we have to show that there is a
concept *F* and object *x* such that:
(1) *Fx*

(2) #[*z* *Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)] = #*F*

(3) 0 = #[*u* *Fu* &
*u**x*]

We can demonstrate that there is an *F* and *x* for which
(1), (2) and (3) hold if we pick *F* to be
[*z*
*Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)] and pick *x* to be 0.
We now establish (1), (2), and (3) for these choices.
To show that (1) holds, we have to show:

[*z*
*Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)]0

But we know, from the definition of *Precedes*^{+}, that
*Precedes*^{+}(0,0), So by abstraction using
-Conversion, we are done.
To show that (2) holds, we need do no work, since our choice of *F* requires us to show:

#[*z* *Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)] =
#[*z* *Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)],

which we know by the logic of identity.
To show (3) holds, we need to show:

(A) 0 = #[*u*
*Precedes*^{+}(*u*,0) &
*u*0]

[Note that the -expression in (A) has been
simplified by applying
-Conversion to the following (which, strictly
speaking, is what results when you substitute our choice for *F*
in (3)):
[*u* [*z*
*Precedes*^{+}(*z*,0)]*u*
& *u*0]

In what follows, we use the simplified version of this
-expression.]
To show (A), it suffices to show the following, in virtue
of the Lemma Concerning Zero (in our subsection on The Concept
*Natural Number* in §4):

*x*
([*u*
*Precedes*^{+}(*u*,0) &
*u*0]*x*)

And by -Conversion, it suffices to show:
(B) *x*
(*Precedes*^{+}(*x*,0) &
*x*0)

We establish (B) as follows.
When we established Theorem 2 (i.e., the fact that 0 is not the
successor of any number), we proved that nothing precedes 0:

*x* *Precedes*(*x*,0)

From this, and Fact (3) about *R** (in the subsection on the Ancestral of *R*, in §4), it follows that nothing ancestrally precedes 0:
*x* *Precedes**(*x*,0)

Now suppose (for *reductio*) the negation of (B); i.e, that there
is some object, say *a*, such that
*Precedes*^{+}(*a*,0) and
*a*0. Then, by definition of
*Precedes*^{+}, it follows that either
*Precedes**(*a*,0) or *a* = 0. But since
our reductio hypthesis includes that
*a*0, it must be that
*Precedes**(*a*,0), which contradicts the fact
displayed immediately above.
Return to Frege’s Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Copyright © 1998 by

Edward N. Zalta

*zalta@stanford.edu*
*First published: June 10, 1998*

*Content last modified: June 10, 1998*