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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Frege’s Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof that 0 Falls Under Q

The proof that 0 falls under Q is relatively straightforward. We want to show:
[y Precedes(y,#[z Precedes+(z,y)])]0
By -Conversion, it suffices to show:
Precedes(0, #[z Precedes+(z,0)])
So, by the definition of Predecessor, we have to show that there is a concept F and object x such that:
(1)   Fx
(2)   #[z Precedes+(z,0)] = #F
(3)   0 = #[u Fu & ux]
We can demonstrate that there is an F and x for which (1), (2) and (3) hold if we pick F to be [z Precedes+(z,0)] and pick x to be 0. We now establish (1), (2), and (3) for these choices.

To show that (1) holds, we have to show:

[z Precedes+(z,0)]0
But we know, from the definition of Precedes+, that Precedes+(0,0), So by abstraction using -Conversion, we are done.

To show that (2) holds, we need do no work, since our choice of F requires us to show:

#[z Precedes+(z,0)] = #[z Precedes+(z,0)],
which we know by the logic of identity.

To show (3) holds, we need to show:

(A)   0 = #[u Precedes+(u,0) & u0]
[Note that the -expression in (A) has been simplified by applying -Conversion to the following (which, strictly speaking, is what results when you substitute our choice for F in (3)):
[u [z Precedes+(z,0)]u & u0]
In what follows, we use the simplified version of this -expression.]

To show (A), it suffices to show the following, in virtue of the Lemma Concerning Zero (in our subsection on The Concept Natural Number in §4):

x ([u Precedes+(u,0) & u0]x)
And by -Conversion, it suffices to show:
(B)   x (Precedes+(x,0) & x0)
We establish (B) as follows.

When we established Theorem 2 (i.e., the fact that 0 is not the successor of any number), we proved that nothing precedes 0:

x Precedes(x,0)
From this, and Fact (3) about R* (in the subsection on the Ancestral of R, in §4), it follows that nothing ancestrally precedes 0:
x Precedes*(x,0)
Now suppose (for reductio) the negation of (B); i.e, that there is some object, say a, such that Precedes+(a,0) and a0. Then, by definition of Precedes+, it follows that either Precedes*(a,0) or a = 0. But since our reductio hypthesis includes that a0, it must be that Precedes*(a,0), which contradicts the fact displayed immediately above.

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Copyright © 1998 by
Edward N. Zalta

First published: June 10, 1998
Content last modified: June 10, 1998