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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

## Frege's ‘Derivation’ of Hume's Principle in **Gg**

In **Gg**, Fregean extensions do *not* contain concepts as
members but rather objects. So Frege had to find another way to
express the explicit definition of #*F*. His technique was to
let extensions go proxy for their corresponding concepts. We may
describe Frege's technique as follows. (What follows is an adaptation
and simplification of the strategy Frege outlines in **Gg** I,
§34ff.) Instead of defining the number of *F*s as the
extension consisting of all those first-order concepts that are
equinumerous to *F*, he defined it as the extension consisting of
all the extensions of concepts equinumerous to *F*. Here is a
formula which says: *x is an extension of a concept that is
equinumerous to F*:
*H*(*x* =
*H*
& H
*F*)

We can name this concept using our
-notation as follows:
[*x*
*H*(*x* =
*H*
& H
*F*)]

Instead of writing out this lengthy expression *being an x which is
an extension of a concept equinumerous to F*, let us abbreviate our
-notation for this concept as
‘*F*^{#}’. Note that the extension of this concept,
*F*^{#}(), contains only extensions as members.
Now Frege's explicit definition of ‘the number of *F*s’
can be given as follows:

#*F* =_{df}
*F*^{#}()

This definition identifies the number of *F*s as the
extension that contains all and only those extensions of concepts that
are equinumerous to *F*.
We can complete our preliminary work for the proof of Hume's
Principle by formulating and proving the following Lemma (derived from
Basic Law V), which simplifies the proof of Hume's Principle:

**Lemma for Hume's Principle**:

G
#*F*
*G* *F*
(Proof of the Lemma for Hume's Principle)

This Lemma tells us that an extension such as
G will be a
member of #*F* just in case *G* is equinumerous to *F*.
Clearly, since *F* is equinumerous to itself, it follows that
#*F* contains
F as a member.
From these facts, one can get a sense of how Frege derived Hume's
Principle Basic Law V in **Gg**. Here is a reconstruction of the
argument.
Proof of Hume's Principle from Basic Law V

Return to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Copyright © 1998 by

Edward N. Zalta

*zalta@stanford.edu*
*First published: June 10, 1998*

*Content last modified: June 10, 1998*