Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Folk Psychology as Mental Simulation
The simulation (or, "mental simulation") theory maintains
that human beings are able to use the resources of their own minds to
simulate the psychological causes of the behavior of others, typically
by making decisions within a "pretend" context. The theory
is usually, though not always, taken to present a serious challenge to
the assumption that a theory underlies everyday human
competence in predicting and explaining behavior, including the
capacity to ascribe mental states to others. Unlike earlier
controversies concerning the role of empathetic understanding and
historical reenactment in the human sciences, the current debate
between the simulation theory and the "theory" theory
appeals to empirical findings, particularly experimental results
concerning children's development of psychological competence. These
are detailed in what follows.
Like the term theory, simulation has come to
be used broadly and in a variety of ways. Simulation is sometimes
equated with role-taking, or "putting oneself in the
other's place." However, it is often taken to include mere
"projection," or reliance on a shared world of facts and
emotive and motivational charges, without adjustments in imagination;
e.g., where there is no need to put oneself in the
other's place, as one is, in all relevant respects, already
there. (Gordon calls this the default mode of simulation.) Sometimes
it is taken to include as well automatic responses such as the
subliminal mimicry of facial expressions and bodily
movements. Stephen Stich and Shaun Nichols, whose critical papers
have clarified the issues and helped refine the theory, urge that the
term be dropped in favor of a finer-grained terminology.
Simulation is often conceived in cognitive-scientific terms: one's
own behavior control system is employed as a manipulable model
of other such systems. The system is first taken off-line, so
that the output is not actual behavior but only predictions or
anticipations of behavior, and inputs and system parameters are
accordingly not limited to those that would regulate one's own
behavior. Many proponents hold that, because one human behavior
control system is being used to model others, general information
about such systems is unnecessary. The simulation is thus said
to be process-driven rather than theory-driven (Goldman).
The simulation theory is often thought to require that, to anticipate
or to explain another's behavior, one has to make decisions in
the role of the other--something we are not frequently aware of
doing. However, decision-making, insofar as it results in a decision
to perform a definite action, would always yield a definite prediction.
Something short of decision-making would better account for our
actual capacity to anticipate behavior, limited as it is. For
people commonly allow a range of indeterminacy in their expectations
of what others will do: some actions are seen as unsurprising
given the person and the situation, and others as very surprising.
Even if one does not make a decision in the role of the other,
one can, by making adjustments in imagination, make some possible
actions appear attractive (and thus unsurprising) and others unattractive
(and thus surprising).
Alvin Goldman and the psychologist Paul Harris conceive simulation
differently from Robert Gordon and Jane Heal, the philosophers who,
working independently, introduced the theory in 1986. According to
Goldman and (less clearly) Harris, to ascribe mental states to others
by simulation, one must already be able to ascribe mental states to
oneself by introspection, and thus must already possess the relevant
mental state concepts. Gordon holds a contrary view suggested by both
Kant and Quine: Only those who can simulate can understand an
ascription of, e.g., belief--that to S it is the case that
p. While no simulation theorist claims that all our everyday
explanations and predictions of the actions of other people are based
on role-taking, Heal in particular has been a moderating influence,
arguing for a hybrid simulation-and-theory account that reserves
simulation primarily for items with rationally linked content, such as
beliefs, desires, and actions.
The introspectionist account of simulation may suggest that simulation
is just an application of the argument from analogy. According
to one version of this argument,
I am conscious in myself of a series of facts connected by an
uniform sequence, of which the beginning is modifications of my
body, the middle is feelings, the end is outward demeanour. In
the case of other human beings I have the evidence of my senses
for the first and last links of the series, but not for the intermediate
link....by supposing the link to be of the same nature as in the
case of which I have experience,...I bring other human beings,
as phenomena, under the same generalizations which I know by experience
to be the true theory of my own existence. -- J.S. Mill, An
Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. 6th edition.
Likewise, the "one system modeling another"account may
suggest that simulation is a device for discerning what goes on
"inside" another, based on an assumption of the internal
similarity of the simulating system and the target system. However,
where one explains or predicts another's behavior in terms of
a shared, jointly known world, there is no question of internal
resemblance between simulator and target, only one of what
it is about the world that moves the other to action. What
is presumed is not similarity but access, not that the other believes
as one does but that the other has access to (what one presumes
to be) the world.
Three main areas of empirical investigation have been thought
especially relevant to the debate:
The numerous other empirical questions of possible relevance to
the debate include the following:
- False belief. Taking into account another's
ignorance or false belief when predicting or explaining their
behavior requires imaginative modifications of one's own beliefs,
according to the simulation theory. Thus the theory offers an
explanation of the results of numerous experiments showing that
younger children fail to take such factors into account. It would
also explain the correlation, in autism, of failure to take into
account ignorance or false belief and failure to engage in spontaneous
pretend-play, particularly role play. Although these results can
also be explained by certain versions of theory theory (and were
so interpreted by the experimenters themselves), the simulation
theory offers a new interpretation.
- Priority of self- or other-ascription. A second
area of developmental research asks whether children ascribe mental
states to themselves before they ascribe them to others. Versions
of the simulation theory committed to the view that we recognize
our own mental states as such and make analogical inferences to
others' mental states seem to require an affirmative answer to
this question; other versions of the theory seem to require a
negative answer. Some experiments suggest a negative answer, but
debate continues on this question.
- Cognitive impenetrability. Stich and Nichols
suppose simulation to be "cognitively impenetrable"
in that it operates independently of any general knowledge the
simulator may have about human psychology. Yet they point to results
suggesting that when subjects lack certain psychological information,
they sometimes make incorrect predictions, and therefore must
not be simulating. Because of problems of methodology and interpretation,
as noted by a number of philosophers and psychologists, the cogency
of this line of criticism is unclear.
Does brain imaging reveal that systems and processes employed
in decision-making are reemployed in the explanation and prediction
of others' behavior?
Does narrative (including film narrative) create emotional and
motivational effects by the same processes that create them in
Some philosophers think the simulation theory may shed light on
issues in traditional philosophy of mind and language concerning
intentionality, referential opacity, broad and narrow content,
the nature of mental causation, Twin Earth problems, the problem
of other minds, and the peculiarities of self-knowledge. Several
philosophers have applied the theory to aesthetics, ethics, and
philosophy of the social sciences. Success or failure of these
efforts to answer philosophical problems may be considered empirical
tests of the theory, in a suitably broad sense of "empirical."
- Goldman, A., 1989, "Interpretation Psychologized." Mind
and Language 4, 161-185; reprinted in Davies, M. and Stone T.,
eds., 1995, Folk Psychology: The Theory of Mind Debate. Oxford:
- Gordon, Robert M., 1986, "Folk Psychology as Simulation", Mind
and Language 1, 158-171; reprinted in Davies, M. and Stone T., eds.,
1995, Folk Psychology: The Theory of Mind Debate. Oxford: Blackwell
- Harris, P., 1989, Children and Emotion, Oxford: Blackwell
- Heal, J., 1986, "Replication and Functionalism", in Language,
Mind, and Logic, J. Butterfield (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge
University Press; reprinted in Davies, M. and Stone T., eds., 1995,
Folk Psychology: The Theory of Mind Debate. Oxford: Blackwell
- Carruthers, P. & Smith, P., eds., 1996, Theories of
Theories of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Davies, M. and Stone T., eds., 1995, Folk Psychology: The
Theory of Mind Debate. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers. (The
introductory chapter offers an excellent overview and analysis
of the initial debate.)
- Davies, M. and Stone T., eds., 1995, Mental Simulation:
Evaluations and Applications. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
folk psychology: as a theory |
- Goldman, A., 1993, The Psychology of Folk Psychology, The
Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 16: 15-28.
- Gordon, R. M., and J. Barker, 1994, Autism and the "theory
of mind" debate. In Philosophical Psychopathology: A
Book of Readings, G. Graham and L. Stephens, eds. MIT Press,
- Gordon, R.M., 1995, Sympathy, Simulation, and the Impartial
Spectator, Ethics 105:727-742. Reprinted in Mind and
Morals: Essays on Ethics and Cognitive Science, L. May, M.
Friedman, & A. Clark, eds. MIT Press, 1996.
- Harris, P., 1989, Children and Emotion. Oxford: Blackwell
- Peacocke, C., ed., 1994, Objectivity, Simulation, and the
Unity of Consciousness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Perner, J., 1991, Understanding the Representational Mind.
Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Wellman, H. M., 1990, The Child's Theory of Mind. Cambridge,
MA: MIT Press.
A large portion of this entry is excerpted, with permission, from
"Simulation vs Theory Theory", MIT Encyclopedia of
Cognitive Science (MIT Press, 1999
Copyright © 1997, 2001 by
Robert M. Gordon
Table of Contents
First published: December 8, 1997
Content last modified: March 8, 2001