Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Computer Ethics: Basic Concepts and Historical Overview
Computer ethics is a new branch of ethics that is growing and
changing rapidly as computer technology also grows and develops. The
term "computer ethics" is open to
interpretations both broad and narrow. On the one hand, for example,
computer ethics might be understood very narrowly as the efforts of
professional philosophers to apply traditional ethical theories like
utilitarianism, Kantianism, or virtue ethics to issues regarding the
use of computer technology. On the other hand, it is possible to
construe computer ethics in a very broad way to include, as well,
standards of professional practice, codes of conduct, aspects of
computer law, public policy, corporate ethics--even certain topics in
the sociology and psychology of computing.
In the industrialized nations of the world, the "information
revolution" already has significantly altered many aspects of life --
in banking and commerce, work and employment, medical care, national
defense, transportation and entertainment. Consequently, information
technology has begun to affect (in both good and bad ways) community
life, family life, human relationships, education, freedom,
democracy, and so on (to name a few examples). Computer ethics in the
broadest sense can be understood as that branch of applied ethics
which studies and analyzes such social and ethical impacts of
In recent years, this robust new field has led to new university
courses, conferences, workshops, professional organizations,
curriculum materials, books, articles, journals, and research
centers. And in the age of the world-wide-web, computer ethics is
quickly being transformed into "global information ethics".
1940s and 1950s
Computer ethics as a field of study has its roots in the work of MIT
professor Norbert Wiener during World War II (early 1940s), in which
he helped to develop an antiaircraft cannon capable of shooting down
fast warplanes. The engineering challenge of this project caused
Wiener and some colleagues to create a new field of research that
Wiener called "cybernetics" -- the science of information feedback
systems. The concepts of cybernetics, when combined with digital
computers under development at that time, led Wiener to draw some
remarkably insightful ethical conclusions about the technology that
we now call ICT (information and communication technology). He
perceptively foresaw revolutionary social and ethical
consequences. In 1948, for example, in his book Cybernetics: or
control and communication in the animal and the machine, he said
It has long been clear to me that the modern ultra-rapid
computing machine was in principle an ideal central nervous system to
an apparatus for automatic control; and that its input and output need
not be in the form of numbers or diagrams. It might very well be,
respectively, the readings of artificial sense organs, such as
photoelectric cells or thermometers, and the performance of motors or
solenoids ... . we are already in a position to construct artificial
machines of almost any degree of elaborateness of performance. Long
before Nagasaki and the public awareness of the atomic bomb, it had
occurred to me that we were here in the presence of another social
potentiality of unheard-of importance for good and for evil. (pp.
In 1950 Wiener published his monumental book, The Human Use of
Human Beings. Although Wiener did not use the term "computer
ethics" (which came into common use more than two decades later), he
laid down a comprehensive foundation which remains today a powerful
basis for computer ethics research and analysis.
Wiener's book included (1) an account of the purpose of a human
life, (2) four principles of justice, (3) a powerful method for doing
applied ethics, (4) discussions of the fundamental questions of
computer ethics, and (5) examples of key computer ethics topics.
[Wiener 1950/1954, see also Bynum 1999]
Wiener's foundation of computer ethics was far ahead of its
time, and it was virtually ignored for decades. On his view, the
integration of computer technology into society will eventually
constitute the remaking of society -- the "second industrial
revolution". It will require a multi-faceted process taking decades of
effort, and it will radically change everything. A project so vast will
necessarily include a wide diversity of tasks and challenges. Workers
must adjust to radical changes in the work place; governments must
establish new laws and regulations; industry and businesses must create
new policies and practices; professional organizations must develop new
codes of conduct for their members; sociologists and psychologists must
study and understand new social and psychological phenomena; and
philosophers must rethink and redefine old social and ethical
In the mid 1960s, Donn Parker of SRI International in Menlo Park,
California began to examine unethical and illegal uses of computers
by computer professionals. "It seemed," Parker said, "that when
people entered the computer center they left their ethics at the
door." [See Fodor and Bynum, 1992] He collected examples of computer
crime and other unethical computerized activities. He published
"Rules of Ethics in Information Processing" in Communications of
the ACM in 1968, and headed the development of the first Code of
Professional Conduct for the Association for Computing Machinery
(eventually adopted by the ACM in 1973). Over the next two decades,
Parker went on to produce books, articles, speeches and workshops
that re-launched the field of computer ethics, giving it momentum and
importance that continue to grow today. Although Parker's work was
not informed by a general theoretical framework, it is the next
important milestone in the history of computer ethics after
Wiener. [See Parker, 1968; Parker, 1979; and Parker et al., 1990.]
During the late 1960s, Joseph Weizenbaum, a computer scientist at MIT
in Boston, created a computer program that he called ELIZA. In his
first experiment with ELIZA, he scripted it to provide a crude
imitation of "a Rogerian psychotherapist engaged in an initial
interview with a patient". Weizenbaum was shocked at the reactions
people had to his simple computer program: some practicing
psychiatrists saw it as evidence that computers would soon be
performing automated psychotherapy. Even computer scholars at MIT
became emotionally involved with the computer, sharing their intimate
thoughts with it. Weizenbaum was extremely concerned that an
"information processing model" of human beings was reinforcing an
already growing tendency among scientists, and even the general
public, to see humans as mere machines. Weizenbaum's book,
Computer Power and Human Reason [Weizenbaum, 1976],
forcefully expresses many of these ideas. Weizenbaum's book,
plus the courses he offered at MIT and the many speeches he gave
around the country in the 1970s, inspired many thinkers and projects
in computer ethics.
In the mid 1970s, Walter Maner (then of Old Dominion University in
Virginia; now at Bowling Green State University in Ohio) began to use
the term "computer ethics" to refer to that field of inquiry dealing
with ethical problems aggravated, transformed or created by computer
technology. Maner offered an experimental course on the subject at
Old Dominion University. During the late 1970s (and indeed into the
mid 1980s), Maner generated much interest in university-level
computer ethics courses. He offered a variety of workshops and
lectures at computer science conferences and philosophy conferences
across America. In 1978 he also self-published and disseminated his
Starter Kit in Computer Ethics, which contained curriculum
materials and pedagogical advice for university teachers to develop
computer ethics courses. The Starter Kit included suggested course
descriptions for university catalogs, a rationale for offering such a
course in the university curriculum, a list of course objectives,
some teaching tips and discussions of topics like privacy and
confidentiality, computer crime, computer decisions, technological
dependence and professional codes of ethics. Maner's
trailblazing course, plus his Starter Kit and the many conference
workshops he conducted, had a significant impact upon the teaching of
computer ethics across America. Many university courses were put in
place because of him, and several important scholars were attracted
into the field.
By the 1980s, a number of social and ethical consequences of
information technology were becoming public issues in America and
Europe: issues like computer-enabled crime, disasters caused by
computer failures, invasions of privacy via computer databases, and
major law suits regarding software ownership. Because of the work of
Parker, Weizenbaum, Maner and others, the foundation had been laid for
computer ethics as an academic discipline. (Unhappily, Wiener's
ground-breaking achievements were essentially ignored.) The time was
right, therefore, for an explosion of activities in computer ethics.
In the mid-80s, James Moor of Dartmouth College published his
influential article "What Is Computer Ethics?" (see discussion below)
in Computers and Ethics, a special issue of the journal
Metaphilosophy [Moor, 1985]. In addition, Deborah Johnson of
Rensselaer Polytechnic Institute published Computer Ethics
[Johnson, 1985], the first textbook -- and for more than a decade, the
defining textbook -- in the field. There were also relevant books
published in psychology and sociology: for example, Sherry Turkle of
MIT wrote The Second Self [Turkle, 1984], a book on the impact
of computing on the human psyche; and Judith Perrolle produced
Computers and Social Change: Information, Property and Power
[Perrolle, 1987], a sociological approach to computing and human
In the early 80s, the present author (Terrell Ward Bynum) assisted
Maner in publishing his Starter Kit in Computer Ethics
[Maner, 1980] at a time when most philosophers and computer
scientists considered the field to be unimportant [See Maner,
1996]. Bynum furthered Maner's mission of developing courses and
organizing workshops, and in 1985, edited a special issue of
Metaphilosophy devoted to computer ethics [Bynum, 1985]. In
1991 Bynum and Maner convened the first international
multidisciplinary conference on computer ethics, which was seen by
many as a major milestone of the field. It brought together, for the
first time, philosophers, computer professionals, sociologists,
psychologists, lawyers, business leaders, news reporters and
government officials. It generated a set of monographs, video
programs and curriculum materials [see van Speybroeck, July
During the 1990s, new university courses, research centers,
conferences, journals, articles and textbooks appeared, and a wide
diversity of additional scholars and topics became involved. For
example, thinkers like Donald Gotterbarn, Keith Miller, Simon Rogerson,
and Dianne Martin -- as well as organizations like Computer
Professionals for Social Responsibility, the Electronic Frontier
Foundation, ACM-SIGCAS -- spearheaded projects relevant to computing
and professional responsibility. Developments in Europe and Australia
were especially noteworthy, including new research centers in England,
Poland, Holland, and Italy; the ETHICOMP series of conferences led by
Simon Rogerson and the present author; the CEPE conferences founded by
Jeroen van den Hoven; and the Australian Institute of Computer Ethics
headed by Chris Simpson and John Weckert.
These important developments were significantly aided by the
pioneering work of Simon Rogerson of De Montfort University (UK), who
established the Centre for Computing and Social Responsibility there.
In Rogerson's view, there was need in the mid-1990s for a "second
generation" of computer ethics developments:
The mid-1990s has heralded the beginning of a second
generation of Computer Ethics. The time has come to build upon and
elaborate the conceptual foundation whilst, in parallel, developing
the frameworks within which practical action can occur, thus reducing
the probability of unforeseen effects of information technology
application [Rogerson, Spring 1996, 2; Rogerson and Bynum,
From the 1940s through the 1960s, therefore, there was no discipline
known as "computer ethics" (notwithstanding the work of Wiener and
Parker). However, beginning with Walter Maner in the 1970s, active
thinkers in computer ethics began trying to delineate and define
computer ethics as a field of study. Let us briefly consider five
When he decided to use the term "computer ethics" in the mid-70s,
Walter Maner defined the field as one which examines "ethical problems
aggravated, transformed or created by computer technology". Some old
ethical problems, he said, are made worse by computers, while others
are wholly new because of information technology. By analogy with the
more developed field of medical ethics, Maner focused attention upon
applications of traditional ethical theories used by philosophers doing
"applied ethics" -- especially analyses using the utilitarian ethics of
the English philosophers Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, or the
rationalist ethics of the German philosopher Immanual Kant.
In her book, Computer Ethics, Deborah Johnson 
defined the field as one which studies the way in which computers "pose
new versions of standard moral problems and moral dilemmas,
exacerbating the old problems, and forcing us to apply ordinary moral
norms in uncharted realms," [Johnson, page 1]. Like Maner before her,
Johnson recommended the "applied ethics" approach of using
procedures and concepts from utilitarianism and Kantianism. But, unlike
Maner, she did not believe that computers create wholly new moral
problems. Rather, she thought that computers gave a "new twist" to old
ethical issues which were already well known.
James Moor's definition of computer ethics in his article "What
Is Computer Ethics?" [Moor, 1985] was much broader and more
wide-ranging than that of Maner or Johnson. It is independent of any
specific philosopher's theory; and it is compatible with a wide
variety of methodological approaches to ethical problem-solving. Over
the past decade, Moor's definition has been the most influential
one. He defined computer ethics as a field concerned with "policy
vacuums" and "conceptual muddles" regarding the social and ethical use
of information technology:
A typical problem in computer ethics arises because there
is a policy vacuum about how computer technology should be
used. Computers provide us with new capabilities and these in turn
give us new choices for action. Often, either no policies for conduct
in these situations exist or existing policies seem inadequate. A
central task of computer ethics is to determine what we should do in
such cases, that is, formulate policies to guide our actions.... One
difficulty is that along with a policy vacuum there is often a
conceptual vacuum. Although a problem in computer ethics may seem
clear initially, a little reflection reveals a conceptual
muddle. What is needed in such cases is an analysis that provides a
coherent conceptual framework within which to formulate a policy for
action [Moor, 1985, 266].
Moor said that computer technology is genuinely revolutionary
because it is "logically malleable":
Computers are logically malleable in that they can be
shaped and molded to do any activity that can be characterized in terms
of inputs, outputs and connecting logical operations....Because logic
applies everywhere, the potential applications of computer technology
appear limitless. The computer is the nearest thing we have to a
universal tool. Indeed, the limits of computers are largely the limits
of our own creativity [Moor, 1985, 269]
According to Moor, the computer revolution is occurring in two stages.
The first stage was that of "technological introduction" in which
computer technology was developed and refined. This already occurred in
America during the first forty years after the Second World War. The
second stage -- one that the industrialized world has only recently
entered -- is that of "technological permeation" in which technology
gets integrated into everyday human activities and into social
institutions, changing the very meaning of fundamental concepts, such
as "money", "education", "work", and "fair elections".
Moor's way of defining the field of computer ethics is very
powerful and suggestive. It is broad enough to be compatible with a
wide range of philosophical theories and methodologies, and it is
rooted in a perceptive understanding of how technological
revolutions proceed. Currently it is the best available definition of
Nevertheless, there is yet another way of understanding computer ethics that is also very helpful--and compatible with a wide variety of theories and approaches. This "other way" was the approach taken by Wiener in 1950 in his book The Human Use of Human Beings, and Moor also discussed it briefly in "What Is Computer Ethics?" . According to this alternative account, computer ethics identifies and analyzes the impacts of information technology upon human values like health, wealth, opportunity, freedom, democracy, knowledge, privacy, security, self-fulfillment, and so on. This very broad view of computer ethics embraces applied ethics, sociology of computing, technology assessment, computer law, and related fields; and it employs concepts, theories and methodologies from these and other relevant disciplines [Bynum, 1993]. The fruitfulness of this way of understanding computer ethics is reflected in the fact that it has served as the organizing theme of major conferences like the National Conference on Computing and Values (1991), and it is the basis of recent developments such as Brey’s "disclosive computer ethics" methodology [Brey 2000] and the emerging research field of "value-sensitive computer design". (See, for example, [Friedman, 1997], [Friedman and Nissenbaum, 1996], [Introna and Nissenbaum, 2000].)
In the 1990s, Donald Gotterbarn became a strong advocate for a
different approach to defining the field of computer ethics. In
Gotterbarn's view, computer ethics should be viewed as a branch of
professional ethics, which is concerned primarily with standards of
practice and codes of conduct of computing professionals:
There is little attention paid to the domain of
professional ethics -- the values that guide the day-to-day activities
of computing professionals in their role as professionals. By computing
professional I mean anyone involved in the design and development of
computer artifacts... The ethical decisions made during the development
of these artifacts have a direct relationship to many of the issues
discussed under the broader concept of computer ethics [Gotterbarn,
With this professional-ethics definition of computer ethics in mind,
Gotterbarn has been involved in a number of related activities, such as
co-authoring the third version of the ACM Code of Ethics and
Professional Conduct and working to establish licensing standards for
software engineers [Gotterbarn, 1992; Anderson, et al., 1993;
Gotterbarn, et al., 1997].
No matter which re-definition of computer ethics one chooses, the
best way to understand the nature of the field is through some representative examples of the issues and problems that have attracted research and scholarship. Consider, for example, the following topics:
(See also the wide range of topics included in the recent anthology [Spinello and Tavani, 2001].)
As a "universal tool" that can, in principle, perform almost any task,
computers obviously pose a threat to jobs. Although they occasionally
need repair, computers don't require sleep, they don't get
tired, they don't go home ill or take time off for rest and
relaxation. At the same time, computers are often far more efficient
than humans in performing many tasks. Therefore, economic incentives to
replace humans with computerized devices are very high. Indeed, in the
industrialized world many workers already have been replaced by
computerized devices -- bank tellers, auto workers, telephone
operators, typists, graphic artists, security guards, assembly-line
workers, and on and on. In addition, even professionals like medical
doctors, lawyers, teachers, accountants and psychologists are finding
that computers can perform many of their traditional professional
duties quite effectively.
The employment outlook, however, is not all bad. Consider, for example, the
fact that the computer industry already has generated a wide variety of
new jobs: hardware engineers, software engineers, systems analysts,
webmasters, information technology teachers, computer sales clerks, and
so on. Thus it appears that, in the short run, computer-generated
unemployment will be an important social problem; but in the long run,
information technology will create many more jobs than it
Even when a job is not eliminated by computers, it can be radically
altered. For example, airline pilots still sit at the controls of
commercial airplanes; but during much of a flight the pilot simply
watches as a computer flies the plane. Similarly, those who prepare
food in restaurants or make products in factories may still have jobs;
but often they simply push buttons and watch as computerized devices
actually perform the needed tasks. In this way, it is possible for
computers to cause "de-skilling" of workers, turning them into passive
observers and button pushers. Again, however, the picture is not all
bad because computers also have generated new jobs which require new
sophisticated skills to perform -- for example, "computer assisted
drafting" and "keyhole" surgery.
Another workplace issue concerns health and safety. As Forester and
Morrison point out [Forester and Morrison, 140-72, Chapter 8], when
information technology is introduced into a workplace, it is important
to consider likely impacts upon health and job satisfaction of workers
who will use it. It is possible, for example, that such workers will
feel stressed trying to keep up with high-speed computerized devices --
or they may be injured by repeating the same physical movement over and
over -- or their health may be threatened by radiation emanating from
computer monitors. These are just a few of the social and ethical
issues that arise when information technology is introduced into the
In this era of computer "viruses" and international spying by "hackers"
who are thousands of miles away, it is clear that computer security is
a topic of concern in the field of Computer Ethics. The problem is not
so much the physical security of the hardware (protecting it from
theft, fire, flood, etc.), but rather "logical security", which Spafford,
Heaphy and Ferbrache [Spafford, et al, 1989] divide into five aspects:
Malicious kinds of software, or "programmed threats", provide a significant
challenge to computer security. These include "viruses", which cannot
run on their own, but rather are inserted into other computer programs;
"worms" which can move from machine to machine across networks, and may
have parts of themselves running on different machines; "Trojan horses"
which appear to be one sort of program, but actually are doing damage
behind the scenes; "logic bombs" which check for particular conditions
and then execute when those conditions arise; and "bacteria" or
"rabbits" which multiply rapidly and fill up the computer's memory.
- Privacy and confidentiality
- Integrity -- assuring that data and programs are not modified
without proper authority
- Unimpaired service
- Consistency -- ensuring that the data and behavior we see today
will be the same tomorrow
- Controlling access to resources
Computer crimes, such as embezzlement or planting of logic bombs,
are normally committed by trusted personnel who have permission to use
the computer system. Computer security, therefore, must also be
concerned with the actions of trusted computer users.
Another major risk to computer security is the so-called "hacker"
who breaks into someone's computer system without permission. Some
hackers intentionally steal data or commit vandalism, while others
merely "explore" the system to see how it works and what files it
contains. These "explorers" often claim to be benevolent defenders of
freedom and fighters against rip-offs by major corporations or spying
by government agents. These self-appointed vigilantes of cyberspace say
they do no harm, and claim to be helpful to society by exposing
security risks. However every act of hacking is harmful, because any
known successful penetration of a computer system requires the owner to
thoroughly check for damaged or lost data and programs. Even if the
hacker did indeed make no changes, the computer's owner must run
through a costly and time-consuming investigation of the compromised system [Spafford,
One of the earliest computer ethics topics to arouse public interest was privacy. For example, in the mid-1960s the American government already had created large databases of information about private citizens (census data, tax records, military service records, welfare records, and so on). In the US Congress, bills were introduced to assign a personal identification number to every citizen and then gather all the government’s data about each citizen under the corresponding ID number. A public outcry about "big-brother government" caused Congress to scrap this plan and led the US President to appoint committees to recommend privacy legislation. In the early 1970s, major computer privacy laws were passed in the USA. Ever since then, computer-threatened privacy has remained as a topic of public concern. The ease and efficiency with which computers and computer networks can be used to gather, store, search, compare, retrieve and share personal information make computer technology especially threatening to anyone who wishes to keep various kinds of "sensitive" information (e.g., medical records) out of the public domain or out of the hands of those who are perceived as potential threats. During the past decade, commercialization and rapid growth of the internet; the rise of the world-wide-web; increasing "user-friendliness" and processing power of computers; and decreasing costs of computer technology have led to new privacy issues, such as data-mining, data matching, recording of "click trails" on the web, and so on [see Tavani, 1999].
The variety of privacy-related issues generated by computer technology has led philosophers and other thinkers to re-examine the concept of privacy itself. Since the mid-1960s, for example, a number of scholars have elaborated a theory of privacy defined as "control over personal information" (see, for example, [Westin, 1967], [Miller, 1971], [Fried, 1984] and [Elgesem, 1996]).
On the other hand, philosophers Moor and Tavani have argued that control of personal information is insufficient to establish or protect privacy, and "the concept of privacy itself is best defined in terms of restricted access, not control" [Tavani and Moor, 2001] (see also [Moor, 1997]). In addition, Nissenbaum has argued that there is even a sense of privacy in public spaces, or circumstances "other than the intimate." An adequate definition of privacy, therefore, must take account of "privacy in public" [Nissenbaum, 1998]. As computer technology rapidly advances -- creating ever new possibilities for compiling, storing, accessing and analyzing information -- philosophical debates about the meaning of ‘privacy’ will likely continue (see also [Introna, 1997]).
Questions of anonymity on the internet are sometimes discussed in the same context with questions of privacy and the internet, because anonymity can provide many of the same benefits as privacy. For example, if someone is using the internet to obtain medical or psychological counseling, or to discuss sensitive topics (for example, AIDS, abortion, gay rights, venereal disease, political dissent), anonymity can afford protection similar to that of privacy. Similarly, both anonymity and privacy on the internet can be helpful in preserving human values such as security, mental health, self-fulfillment and peace of mind. Unfortunately, privacy and anonymity also can be exploited to facilitate unwanted and undesirable computer-aided activities in cyberspace, such as money laundering, drug trading, terrorism, or preying upon the vulnerable (see [Marx, 2001] and [Nissenbaum, 1999]).
One of the more controversial areas of computer ethics concerns the
intellectual property rights connected with software ownership. Some
people, like Richard Stallman who started the Free Software
Foundation, believe that software ownership should not be allowed at
all. He claims that all information should be free, and all programs
should be available for copying, studying and modifying by anyone who
wishes to do so [Stallman, 1993]. Others argue that software
companies or programmers would not invest weeks and months of work
and significant funds in the development of software if they could
not get the investment back in the form of license fees or sales
[Johnson, 1992]. Today's software industry is a
multibillion dollar part of the economy; and software companies claim
to lose billions of dollars per year through illegal copying
("software piracy"). Many people think that software should be
ownable, but "casual copying" of personally owned programs for
one's friends should also be permitted (see [Nissenbaum, 1995]). The software industry
claims that millions of dollars in sales are lost because of such
copying. Ownership is a complex matter, since there are several
different aspects of software that can be owned and three different
types of ownership: copyrights, trade secrets, and patents. One can
own the following aspects of a program:
A very controversial issue today is owning a patent on a computer
algorithm. A patent provides an exclusive monopoly on the use of the
patented item, so the owner of an algorithm can deny others use of the
mathematical formulas that are part of the algorithm. Mathematicians
and scientists are outraged, claiming that algorithm patents
effectively remove parts of mathematics from the public domain, and
thereby threaten to cripple science. In addition, running a preliminary
"patent search" to make sure that your "new" program does not violate
anyone's software patent is a costly and time-consuming process. As a
result, only very large companies with big budgets can afford to run
such a search. This effectively eliminates many small software
companies, stifling competition and decreasing the variety of programs
available to the society [The League for Programming Freedom, 1992].
Computer professionals have specialized knowledge and often have
positions with authority and respect in the community. For this reason,
they are able to have a significant impact upon the world, including
many of the things that people value. Along with such power to change
the world comes the duty to exercise that power responsibly [Gotterbarn, 2001]. Computer professionals find themselves in a variety of professional
relationships with other people [Johnson, 1994], including:
- The "source code" which is written by the programmer(s) in a
high-level computer language like Java or C++.
- The "object code", which is a machine-language translation of the
- The "algorithm", which is the sequence of machine commands that the
source code and object code represent.
- The "look and feel" of a program, which is the way the program
appears on the screen and interfaces with users.
These relationships involve a diversity of interests, and sometimes
these interests can come into conflict with each other. Responsible
computer professionals, therefore, will be aware of possible conflicts
of interest and try to avoid them.
Professional organizations in the USA, like the Association for
Computing Machinery (ACM) and the Institute of Electrical and
Electronic Engineers (IEEE), have established codes of ethics,
curriculum guidelines and accreditation requirements to help computer
professionals understand and manage ethical responsibilities. For
example, in 1991 a Joint Curriculum Task Force of the ACM and IEEE
adopted a set of guidelines ("Curriculum 1991") for college programs in
computer science. The guidelines say that a significant component of
computer ethics (in the broad sense) should be included in
undergraduate education in computer science [Turner, 1991].
In addition, both the ACM and IEEE have adopted Codes of Ethics for
their members. The most recent ACM Code
(1992), for example, includes "general moral imperatives", such as
"avoid harm to others" and "be honest and trustworthy". And also
included are "more specific professional responsibilities" like
"acquire and maintain professional competence" and "know and respect
existing laws pertaining to professional work." The IEEE Code of Ethics
(1990) includes such principles as "avoid real or perceived conflicts
of interest whenever possible" and "be honest and realistic in stating
claims or estimates based on available data."
The Accreditation Board for Engineering Technologies (ABET) has long
required an ethics component in the computer engineering curriculum.
And in 1991, the Computer Sciences Accreditation Commission/Computer
Sciences Accreditation Board (CSAC/CSAB) also adopted the requirement
that a significant component of computer ethics be included in any
computer sciences degree granting program that is nationally accredited
It is clear that professional organizations in computer science
recognize and insist upon standards of professional responsibility for
Computer ethics today is rapidly evolving into a broader and even
more important field, which might reasonably be called "global
information ethics". Global networks like the Internet and especially
the world-wide-web are connecting people all over the earth. As
Krystyna Gorniak-Kocikowska perceptively notes in her
paper, "The Computer Revolution and the Problem of Global Ethics"
[Gorniak-Kocikowska, 1996], for the first time in history,
efforts to develop mutually agreed standards of conduct, and efforts
to advance and defend human values, are being made in a truly global
context. So, for the first time in the history of the earth, ethics
and values will be debated and transformed in a context that is not
limited to a particular geographic region, or constrained by a
specific religion or culture. This may very well be one of the most
important social developments in history. Consider just a few of the
If computer users in the United States, for example, wish to protect
their freedom of speech on the internet, whose laws apply? Nearly two
hundred countries are already interconnected by the internet, so the
United States Constitution (with its First Amendment protection for
freedom of speech) is just a "local law" on the internet -- it does not
apply to the rest of the world. How can issues like freedom of speech,
control of "pornography", protection of intellectual property,
invasions of privacy, and many others to be governed by law when so many countries are involved? If a citizen in a European
country, for example, has internet dealings with someone in a far-away
land, and the government of that land considers those dealings to be
illegal, can the European be tried by the courts in the far-away
The world is very close to having technology that can provide
electronic privacy and security on the internet sufficient to safely
conduct international business transactions. Once this technology is in
place, there will be a rapid expansion of global "cyberbusiness". Nations
with a technological infrastructure already in place will enjoy rapid
economic growth, while the rest of the world lags behind. What will be
the political and economic fallout from rapid growth of global
cyberbusiness? Will accepted business practices in one part of the
world be perceived as "cheating" or "fraud" in other parts of the
world? Will a few wealthy nations widen the already big gap between
rich and poor? Will political and even military confrontations emerge?
If inexpensive access to the global information net is provided to rich
and poor alike -- to poverty-stricken people in ghettos, to poor
nations in the "third world", etc.-- for the first time in history,
nearly everyone on earth will have access to daily news from a free
press; to texts, documents and art works from great libraries and
museums of the world; to political, religious and social practices of
peoples everywhere. What will be the impact of this sudden and profound
"global education" upon political dictatorships, isolated communities,
coherent cultures, religious practices, etc.? As great universities of
the world begin to offer degrees and knowledge modules via the
internet, will "lesser" universities be damaged or even forced out of
Information Rich and Information Poor
The gap between rich and poor nations, and even between rich and poor
citizens in industrialized countries, is already disturbingly wide. As
educational opportunities, business and employment opportunities,
medical services and many other necessities of life move more and more
into cyberspace, will gaps between the rich and the poor become even worse?
Given the explosive growth of Computer ethics during the past two
decades, the field appears to have a very robust and significant
future. Two important thinkers, however, Krystyna Gorniak-Kocikowska
and Deborah Johnson, have recently argued that computer ethics will
disappear as a separate branch of ethics. In 1996 Gorniak-Kocikowska
predicted that computer ethics, which is currently
considered a branch of applied ethics, will eventually evolve into
According to her hypothesis, "local" ethical theories like
Europe's Benthamite and Kantian systems and the ethical systems
of other cultures in Asia, Africa, the Pacific Islands, etc., will
eventually be superceded by a global ethics evolving from
today's computer ethics. "Computer" ethics, then, will become
the "ordinary" ethics of the information age.
In her 1999 ETHICOMP paper [Johnson, 1999], Johnson expressed
a view which, upon first sight, may seem to be the same as
A closer look at the Johnson hypothesis reveals that it is a
different kind of claim than Gorniak's, though not inconsistent
with it. Johnson's hypothesis addresses the question of whether
or not the name "computer ethics" (or perhaps "information ethics")
will continue to be used by ethicists and others to refer to ethical
questions and problems generated by information technology. On
Johnson's view, as information technology becomes very
commonplace -- as it gets integrated and absorbed into our everyday
surroundings and is perceived simply as an aspect of ordinary life --
we may no longer notice its presence. At that point, we would no
longer need a term like "computer ethics" to single out a subset of
ethical issues arising from the use of information
technology. Computer technology would be absorbed into the fabric of
life, and computer ethics would thus be effectively absorbed into
Taken together, the Gorniak and Johnson hypotheses look to a future in
which what we call "computer ethics" today is globally important and a
vital aspect of everyday life, but the name "computer ethics" may no
longer be used.
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Copyright © 2001 by
Terrell Ward Bynum
Table of Contents
First published: August 13, 2001
Content last modified: August 13, 2001