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A different tradition focused on aspects of knowledge that are "social" in a more sociological or political sense, though members of this tradition less frequently aligned their work to core issues in epistemology. Karl Marx's theory of ideology could well be considered a type of social epistemology. On one interpretation of Marx's conception of "ideology", an ideology is a set of beliefs, a world-view, or a form of consciousness that is in some fashion false or delusive. The cause of these beliefs, and perhaps of their delusiveness, is the social situation and interests of the believers. Since the theory of ideology, so described, is concerned with the truth and falsity of beliefs, it might even be considered a form of classical social epistemology.
Karl Mannheim (1936) extended Marx's theory of ideology into a sociology of knowledge. He classed forms of consciousness as ideological when the thoughts of a social group can be traced to the group's social situation or "life conditions" (1936: 78). The descriptive enterprise of tracing these thoughts to the social situation might be construed as social epistemology. The further enterprise of critiquing and dissolving ideological delusions --"Ideologiekritik" -- is surely a form of social epistemology. The critical theory of the Frankfurt School was one attempt, or a family of attempts, to develop this idea. Critical theory aims at emancipation and enlightenment by making agents aware of hidden coercion in their environment, enabling them to determine where their true interests lie (Geuss 1981: 54). In a variant of critical theory, Jurgen Habermas introduced the idea of an "ideal speech situation", a hypothetical situation of absolutely uncoerced and unlimited discussion between completely free and equal human agents (Habermas 1973; Geuss 1981: 65). In some writings Habermas uses the ideal speech situation as a transcendental criterion of truth. Beliefs that agents would agree upon in the ideal speech situation are ipso facto true beliefs (Habermas and Luhmann 1971: 139, 224). Here a social communicational device is treated as a type of epistemic standard.
Subsequent developments in the sociology of knowledge, and especially in the sociology of science, can also be considered forms of social epistemology. Since science is widely considered the paradigmatic knowledge-producing enterprise, and since epistemology is centrally concerned with knowledge, any endeavor that seeks to identify social determinants of science might plausibly be categorized as a form of social epistemology. Both Mannheim and the sociologist of science Robert Merton (1973) exempted (natural) science from the influence of societal or "existential" factors of the types that influence other categories of beliefs. Science was viewed as a society unto itself, largely autonomous from the rest of society. But later sociologists of science have declined to offer the same exemption. The Edinburgh School contends that all scientific beliefs are on a par with other beliefs in terms of their causes. Barry Barnes and David Bloor formulated a "symmetry" or "equivalence" postulate, according to which all beliefs are on a par with respect to the causes of their credibility (1982). Many historical case studies conducted in this tradition have tried to show how scientists too are swayed by class interests, political interests, and other factors usually considered "external" to pure science (Forman 1971; Shapin 1975; Mackenzie 1981). Thomas Kuhn (1962/1970) is thought to have shown that purely objective considerations can never settle disputes between competing scientific theories or paradigms, and hence scientific beliefs must be influenced by "social factors". Kuhn's descriptions of the practices of scientific research communities, especially descriptions of the inculcation and preservation of paradigms during periods of "normal" science, were clear and influential examples of a social analysis of science, especially when contrasted with the positivist tradition of analysis. Michel Foucault developed a radically political view of knowledge and science, arguing that practices of so-called knowledge-seeking, especially in the modern world, really serve the aims of power and social domination (1977, 1980). All of these writers may be considered "social epistemologists", although they themselves do not employ this phrase.
Perhaps the first use of the phrase "social epistemology" appears in the writings of a library scientist, Jesse Shera, who in turn credits his associate Margaret Egan. "[S]ocial epistemology," says Shera, "is the study of knowledge in society.... The focus of this discipline should be upon the production, flow, integration, and consumption of all forms of communicated thought throughout the entire social fabric" (1970: 86). Shera was particularly interested in the affinity between social epistemology and librarianship. He did not, however, construct a conception of social epistemology with very definite philosophical or social-scientific contours. What might such contours be?
The foregoing remarks apply to classical epistemology in its "individualist" guise. What type of epistemology does one get if one tries to "socialize" classical epistemology? One gets some sort of social angle on the pursuit of true belief and/or the pursuit of justified belief. Some projects in social epistemology have adopted precisely these themes.
Perhaps the first formulation of a truth-oriented social epistemology is found in writings by Alvin Goldman from the late 1970s through the mid-1980s (Goldman 1978, 1986, 1987). Goldman there proposes to divide epistemology into two branches: individual epistemology and social epistemology (or "epistemics"). Both branches would seek to identify and assess processes, methods or practices in terms of their contributions -- positive or negative -- to the production of true belief. Individual epistemology would identify and evaluate psychological processes that occur within the epistemic subject. Social epistemology would identify and evaluate social processes by which epistemic subjects interact with other agents who exert causal influence on their beliefs. The communicational acts of other agents and the institutional structures that guide or frame such communicational acts would be prime examples of social-epistemic practices that would be studied within social epistemology. In Goldman's subsequent book, Knowledge in a Social World (1999), this conception of social epistemology is developed in detail. It is argued that, both in everyday life and in specialized arenas such as science, law, and education, a certain value is placed on having true beliefs rather than false beliefs or no opinion (uncertainty). This type of value is called "veritistic value", and a measure of veritistic value is proposed. The rest of the book examines types of social practices that make positive or negative contributions toward increasing veritistic value. Types of practices examined include speech practices of reporting and arguing, market and non-market mechanisms that regulate the flow of speech, types of information technologies, assigning scientific credit and guiding scientific inquiries with an eye to credit, trial procedures or legal adjudication systems, and systems that disseminate political information about electoral candidates.
The veritistic approach to social epistemology aims to be evaluative or normative rather than purely descriptive or explanatory. It seeks to evaluate actual and prospective practices in terms of their impacts on true versus false beliefs. Although truth may have no explanatory role to play in the social studies of knowledge, it can play a regulative role. How can truth play a regulative role, it may be asked, unless we already have ways of deciding what is true? How can the social epistemologist assess the truth-propensity of a practice unless she already has a method of determining whether the beliefs caused by the practice are true or false? But if she has such a method of determination, why bother with social epistemology? In answer to these questions, it is sometimes possible to demonstrate mathematically that a certain practice would have certain veritistic properties. For example, Goldman indicates that a particular (difficult to instantiate) practice of Bayesian inference has a general propensity, on average, to increase the veritistic properties of one's beliefs (Goldman 1999: 115-123). Similarly, it can be shown mathematically that a certain mode of amalgamating expert opinions in a group yields greater group accuracy than other modes of amalgamation (Shapley and Grofman 1984; Goldman 1999: 81-82). Finally, a practice can sometimes be judged veritistically unsatisfactory when later and better evidence shows that many judgments issued under its aegis were false. The medieval practice of trial by ordeal was abandoned in part because it was shown that the ordeal had produced numerous erroneous judgments of guilt. This emerged when voluntary confessions were later obtained from different people, or new eye-witnesses came forward.
Philip Kitcher has also developed the social epistemology of science from a truth-oriented perspective. One of his chief concerns has been the division of cognitive labor (Kitcher 1990, 1993: chap. 8). The progress of science will be optimized, says Kitcher, when there is an optimal distribution of effort within the scientific community. It may be better for a scientific community to attack a given problem by encouraging some members to pursue one strategy and others to pursue another, rather than all pursue the single most promising strategy. In saying that progress will be "optimized", it is meant that it will be optimized in terms of getting true answers to significant scientific questions. In The Advancement of Science (1993) Kitcher constructs the notion of a "consensus practice", a social practice built up from individual practices consisting of an individual's beliefs, the informants he regards as credible, the methodology of scientific reasoning he accepts, and so forth. A "core" consensus practice consists of the elements of individual practices common to all members of the community. A "virtual" consensus practice is a practice generated by taking into account the statements, methodologies, etc. that members accept "indirectly" by deferring to other scientists as authorities. Kitcher then constructs a family of notions of scientific "progress", and he characterizes progress in terms of improvements of consensus practices in getting significant truth and achieving explanatory success.
Feminist epistemologists often embrace the idea of social epistemology. However, many of them strongly criticize traditional epistemology and view it as a poor model for feminist epistemology. At least a few feminist epistemologists, however, take a fundamentally truth-oriented position. Elizabeth Anderson explicitly views feminist epistemology as a branch of social epistemology (1995: 54). Furthermore, when she proceeds to explain the aim of social epistemology, she identifies it as the aim of promoting our reliable, i.e., truth-conducive, processes of belief formation and checking or canceling out our unreliable belief-forming processes (1995: 55). Thus, the fundamental aim is the classical one of seeking true beliefs and avoiding false ones.
Thus far our examples of classically-oriented social epistemology center on the truth aim. What about the aim of epistemic justification or rationality? As indicated earlier, the problem of testimony is a problem about justification: What makes a hearer justified in accepting a report or other factual statement by a speaker? In the last two decades, testimony has become an active area of epistemological investigation. Although testimony theorists do not generally use the phrase "social epistemology" to describe their inquiry, that seems to be an appropriate label (see Schmitt 1994a).
According to "reductionism" about testimony, a hearer H is justified or warranted in accepting a speaker's report or factual statement only if H is justified is believing that the speaker is reliable and sincere, where the latter justification rests on sources other than testimony itself. In other words, testimony can only be a derivative source of epistemic warrant, not a "basic" source like perception, memory, or inductive inference. This reductionist view was held by Hume. In contrast to reductionism, there is the view that testimony is itself a "basic" source of warrant. A hearer has default, or prima facie, warrant in believing what a speaker says, no matter how little he knows about the speaker's reliability and sincerity. Of course, evidence of the speaker's unreliability or insincerity may defeat or override his prima facie warrant for acceptance. But that does not conflict with the claim that testimony per se is a basic source of evidence. C. A. J. Coady (1992) argues that reductionism would lead to widespread skepticism, because people do not generally have enough testimony-free evidence of testifiers' trustworthiness to confer the sort of justification demanded by reductionism. This argument is amplified and qualified by Elizabeth Fricker (1995). Others such as Tyler Burge (1993) and Richard Foley (1994) have argued that reductionism is in any case inadequately motivated.
Another form of justificationist social epistemology that is broadly classical in conception is that of Helen Longino (1990, 1993). In Longino's conception, a scientific belief is justified to the extent that it results from the application of "objective" methods. "To say that a theory or hypothesis was accepted on the basis of objective methods does not guarantee that it is true, but it does--if anything does--justify us in asserting that it is true" (1993: 268). The social character of Longino's approach is reflected in her insistence that objectivity is a characteristic of a community's scientific practice rather than a characteristic of an individual scientist, for objectivity refers to the avoidance of individual subjectivity or bias. Longino develops an account of objectivity that is tied to critical discourse. Objectivity in a scientific community, she says, would require four features: recognized avenues for criticism, responsiveness of beliefs to critical discussion, shared standards of responsiveness to criticism, and equality of intellectual authority.
They are, nonetheless, clearly interested in belief-forming practices. If we use the term "knowledge" for any sort of belief (or at least for "institutionalized" belief), whether true or false, justified or unjustified, then they can be said to be investigators of knowledge. Since they are specifically interested in social influences on knowledge (so understood), they plausibly qualify as social epistemologists. They do not typically apply this label to themselves, perhaps in recognition that what was traditionally called "epistemology" had different purposes or aspirations. But if the old aspirations must be abandoned -- as Richard Rorty (1979) explicitly argued -- why not use the old label for the new type of project? For this reason, researchers in the social studies of science, or science and technology studies, will here be considered social epistemologists. There is, however, an additional reason why some of these writers might be called social epistemologists. Some claim to derive epistemologically significant conclusions (in the classical sense of "epistemology") from their sociological or anthropological investigations. Two examples are cases in point. First, as indicated earlier, historical case studies undertaken by members of the Edinburgh School attempt to show that scientists are heavily influenced by social factors "external" to the proper business of science. Other social analyses of science try to show how the game of scientific persuasion is really driven by factors resembling battles or political contests, where the outcome depends on the number or strength of one's allies as contrasted with, say, genuine epistemic worth. If either of these claims were right, the epistemic status of science as an objective and authoritative source of information would be greatly reduced. This claim, if true, seems to have genuine epistemological significance. Second, some sociologists of science claim to show that scientific "facts" are not "out-there" entities, which obtain independently of the human social interactions, but are mere "fabrications" resulting from those social interactions. This is an epistemological thesis, or at least a metaphysical thesis, of some philosophical significance. So some of these writers seem to have philosophical aspirations, not merely social science aspirations.
Let us begin with the first type of thrust, i.e., attempts to debunk the epistemic authority of science. The debunking of science's epistemic authority, at least by sociologists or historians of science, would have to be accomplished by empirical means, for example, by showing how scientific beliefs were actually produced in this or that socio-historical episode. This is precisely what various historians and sociologists of science purport to accomplish. One challenge to this would be a straightforwardly empirical challenge: Do these historical accounts get matters right? Many debunking efforts by members of the "Strong Programme" in the sociology of science have been disputed by others. In addition, there is an obvious, theoretically more interesting, response. How can these studies establish the debunking conclusions unless the studies themselves have epistemic authority? Yet the studies themselves use some of the very empirical, scientific procedures they purport to debunk. If such procedures are epistemically questionable, the studies' own results should be in question. There is, in other words, a problem of "reflexivity" facing this type of debunking challenge.
Not all sociological approaches are linked to historical case studies. Some offer a more theoretical analysis of how scientists persuade one another of this or that conclusion. For example, Bruno Latour sketches an account of how persuasion is effected in science by marshalling "allies" of substantial reputation on one's own side of a controversy (1987: chap. 1). Can this ostensibly non-epistemic account of science support a successful debunking of its epistemic pretensions? A first point to notice is that any successful debunking of epistemic authority, if explicitly spelled out, must address epistemic issues. It must be shown that the procedures used by scientists have poor epistemic qualities. But this presupposes that there are objective, bona fide epistemic categories, which sociologists of science of Latour's persuasion tend to doubt or deny. If such categories are admitted, the further question arises as to whether persuasion by reference to the numbers of concurring "allies" is really an epistemically bad procedure. Although Latour's military/political vocabulary provides an amusing contrast with conventional characterizations of science, it isn't clear that the practices described are epistemically bad, or sub-rational, practices.
Let us turn now to the social construction of scientific facts. Again there is a question of how this sort of thesis could be established by sociologists. How could any scrutinizing of the activities of human scientists have determinate implications as to whether certain chemical substances, for example, exist independently of these scientists' interactions? Yet this is exactly what Latour and Steve Woolgar imply in their book Laboratory Life: The [Social] Construction of Scientific Facts (1979/1986). Latour and Woolgar claim that the "reality [of a scientific entity or fact] is formed as a consequence of [the] stabilization [of a controversy]" (1986: 180). In other words, the reality does not exist prior to the social event of stabilization, but is the result of such stabilization. How can they determine this without being biochemists as opposed to sociologists? How can the study of macro-events of a social nature establish that there do or do not exist certain biochemical substances independently of those macro-events?
In discussing social constructivism, it is essential to distinguish between weak and strong versions. Weak social constructivism is the view that human representations of reality -- either linguistic or mental representations -- are social constructs. For example, to say that gender is socially constructed, in this weak version of social constructivism, is to say that people's representations or conceptions of gender are socially constructed. Strong social constructivism claims not only that representations are socially constructed, but that the entities themselves to which these representations refer are socially constructed. In other words, not only are scientific representations of certain biochemical substances socially constructed, but the substances themselves are socially constructed. The weak version of social constructivism is quite innocuous, at least in the present context. Only the thesis of strong social constructivism is metaphysically (and, by implication, epistemologically) interesting. It is this sort of metaphysical thesis that Latour and Woolgar seem to endorse.
But there are many problems with this metaphysical thesis. One question is whether social constructivists like Latour and Woolgar mean to be "causal" constructivists or "constitutive" constructivists, in the terminology of Andre Kukla (2000). Causal constructivism is the view that human activity causes and sustains facts about the world, including scientific facts, whereas constitutive constructivism is the view that what we call "facts about the world" are really just facts about human activity (Kukla 2000: 21). Although Latour and Woolgar use the language of causal constructivism, it seems more likely that the doctrine they intend is constitutive constructivism. There are, however, severe philosophical difficulties for constitutive social constructivism as a general metaphysical doctrine, as Kukla explains.
Not all researchers within the social studies of science think of social epistemology as confined to the description and explanation of science. Steve Fuller (1987, 1988, 1999), who champions social epistemology in that very phrase, sees the enterprise as normative: How should the institution of science be organized and run? What is the best (scientific) means to knowledge production? However, Fuller does not construe "knowledge" in a truth-entailing fashion, and so parts company with classical epistemology. What does he take the end of knowledge production to be? In one place he says that it's a matter of empirical determination what that end is (1987: 177). But if we don't now know the end, how can we try to direct science toward it? And how can one determine science's end empirically? Science might be found to have many different results. Which of them is its "end"?
Can the opposition between the rational and the social be eliminated, or at least relaxed? A first possible move is to allow "interests" to include the private or professional interests of scientists. It seems undeniable that scientists are at least partly driven by a desire for "credit" from their peers (Hull 1988). But won't private and professional interests deflect scientists from reason and truth as much as class or political interests? Several writers argue to the contrary. There is no necessary conflict between professional interest and successful pursuit of truth. Kitcher (1990) argues that the optimal division of labor in scientific research may be attained not by "pure", altruistic scientists but by scientists with "grubby" and epistemically "sullied" motives. Similarly, Goldman and Shaked (1991) show that, given certain assumptions about credit-giving practices and experimental choices, there will be little difference between choices of truth-motivated scientists and choices of credit-motivated scientists. Hence, there will be little difference in expected success of moving the community toward truth. Credit-driven interests need not be inimical to truth-promotion.
A further proposal is to expand the "social" beyond politics and interests altogether. The most inclusive sense of the social is simply any relationship among two or more individuals. There is no reason why social epistemology cannot be social in this broad sense. Any interaction among individuals affecting the credal states of some of them might be considered a social-epistemic relationship. So understood, a wide range of communicative interactions would be fit subjects for social epistemology. For example, many knowledge-seeking enterprises are collaborative in nature, including scientific enterprises involving research teams. An interesting task for social epistemology is to identify the types of collaboration that would be optimal in terms of some epistemically relevant measure (Thagard 1997).
Can the "social" be fully captured by inter-individual relationships? Some theorists would argue in the negative, pointing specifically to collective entities such as corporations, committees, juries, and teams. We often attribute mental or mental-like states, including beliefs, to such collective entities (Gilbert 1989; Tuomela 1995; Searle 1995). We might say, for example, that a jury was convinced that the defendant intended such-and-such, or that the jury doubted that a certain alleged conversation really took place. Collective entities are obviously "social" in an important way; and if it is granted that such entities are bearers of beliefs and other doxastic states, shouldn't these collective states be an important target for social epistemology? Precisely this is suggested by Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1993), who goes even further in proposing that the only real knowers are communities. For purposes of social epistemology it may not be sufficient that the notion of collective belief be legitimized. What must also be legitimized is the thesis that collective beliefs have epistemic properties, such as "rational" and "irrational", or "justified" and "unjustified". Perhaps this thesis is defensible, however. Frederick Schmitt (1994b) has argued that sense can be made of justification for group beliefs. So the door seems open to this widening of the concept of the "social" for the purposes of social epistemology.
The foregoing questions open up a wide territory for social epistemology to occupy. A great deal of social epistemology has thus far been rather "local" in scope, centering heavily on the domain of science. This is understandable, since science is the most visible, organized, and influential enterprise of knowledge seeking, or knowledge production. But science isn't the only enterprise of knowledge acquisition or knowledge dissemination. People acquire everyday factual information (e.g., the location of the nearest hardware store, the stance that political candidate X has taken on issue Y) by personal observation, and by hearing or reading the reports of others. These routes to knowledge are not strictly scientific. Moreover, most members of the general public never conduct scientific inquiries, but at best rely on first- or second-hand reports about them. Since specialists themselves often disagree in interpreting scientific results, laypersons must choose among them. They must decide what to believe without personally applying scientific methods. Finally, some contexts do not afford opportunities for (full) application of scientific methods. Jurors have no opportunity to apply all the tools of science to the factual questions before them, although they may, of course, hear expert witnesses who have applied scientific methods to related matters. Thus, while social epistemology has every reason to be concerned with science, it should also target other domains and knowledge-related practices.
For reasons such as these, social epistemology might be divided into topics that examine either global or local practices. Global practices cut across subject-matters and specific institutions. Local practices are tied to particular domains or types of institutions. Styles of rhetoric and interpersonal argumentation, for example, are found in every speech community and speech context. They are examples of global practices; and norms that guide such practices can be highly relevant to knowledge acquisition. Similarly, communication technologies and communicational institutions can massively affect the diffusion of all categories of information or misinformation. The printing press, the computer, and the Internet are particularly salient examples of pertinent communicational technologies. But we should not forget the scholarly library, or print, radio, and television journalism. Finally, systems of public and private education, at all levels, play crucial roles in disseminating knowledge. The form, structure, and policies associated with these communicational entities are highly relevant to the distribution of societal knowledge (Goldman 1999).
Local practices are those associated with particular domains or institutions, such as the adjudicative aspect of the law. Different legal traditions provide different sorts of structures for judging disputes. In the Anglo-American adversarial system, lawyers for the contending parties take the initiative in discovering and presenting evidence for their side, and lay jurors often play the role of fact-finders. In the Continental system, investigations and trials are led by judges rather than lawyers, and the same judges are the principal fact-finders. These systems presumably have the same central aim, viz., rendering correct or accurate judgments about questions under dispute, but one system might be better than the other at achieving that aim..
In all of these domains, social epistemology can ask questions about knowledge-enhancing practices and policies. Which journalistic practices, which Website-designing practices, which rules for intellectual property are best from a knowledge-promoting standpoint (Herman and Chomsky 1988; Fallis 2000; Lessig 1999)? Which system of legal adjudication -- the Continental system or the Anglo-American system -- is optimal in epistemic terms (Langbein 1985; Goldman 1999, chap. 9)? Looking at the details of the Anglo-American system, which specific rules concerning evidence admission or "discovery" of evidence would be epistemically optimal (Damaska 1997; Talbott and Goldman 1998)?
Depending on the specific area of social epistemology one chooses, different methodologies or research paradigms may be appropriate. The choice of methodology will also depend, of course, on whether a descriptive or normative approach is taken. In general, however, it seems likely that methodologies from many different disciplines are needed for a comprehensive treatment of social epistemology. Here is a sampling of methods that have already been applied in some of these terrains.
In the history and sociology of science, case studies and "field" studies (of laboratories) are prevalent. Rhetorical theory provides another approach to scientific discourse (McCloskey 1985; Fuller 1993). Yet another analytical tool for social epistemology is probability theory. For example, it can be used to prescribe rational changes in an agent's degree of belief, given credibility weights assigned to other agents and their degrees of belief (Lehrer and Wagner 1981). Various techniques of economic analysis, including game theory, can be helpful in social epistemology. These have been utilized in at least two domains: journalism (Cox and Goldman 1994) and the market for speech (Goldman and Cox 1996). Economists William Brock and Steven Durlauf (1999) have created a formal model of theory choice in science, using a neoclassical style of economic analysis. General algebraic techniques are used by Philip Kitcher (1993, chap. 8) to analyze social aspects of science. Clearly, the multiple problems and approaches of social epistemology invite varied research tools borrowed from many disciplines, and initial applications of these tools have been made. It is equally clear, however, that the work of the field lies more in the future than in the past.
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First published: February 26, 2001
Content last modified: February 26, 2001