#### Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Bayesian Epistemology

## Probability Laws

There are many different versions of the probability laws.
Probability can be defined over sentences or over sets; it can be
defined as conditional or unconditional. This article assumes the
following laws of unconditional probability defined over sentences:
(A1) All probabilities are between zero and one -- that is, for any
sentence *S*: 0
*P*(*S*)
1.
(A2) Logical truths have probability one -- that is, for any logical
truth *L*: *P*(*L*) = 1.

(A3) Where *S* and *T*, are mutually exclusive, the
probability of *S* or *T*
(*S* *T*)
is the sum of their individual probabilities -- that
is:
*P*(*S* *T*) =
*P*(*S*) + *P*(*T*).

Using these laws, it is possible to derive as theorems many of the
standards truths of probability -- for example, that the probability
of a sentence and its negation sum to one -- in other words:
*P*(~*S*) =
1
*P*(*S*).
(A3) is referred to as the *Principle of Finite Additivity*,
because it involves only finite sums. Most mathematical
treatments of probability require an extension of (A3) to cover
countably infinite sums. The result is a *Principle of
Countable Additivity*. The standard way of stating this axiom
involves translating the axioms into set theory, where countably
infinite unions (corresponding to infinite disjunctions) are
defined. The relation to (A3) is clearer if one simply extends the
ordinary notion of sentence to include infinitely long expressions
formed in accordance with the formation rules of the
language -- thus allowing for the possibility of infinite
disjunctions:

(A4) Where *S*_{1}, *S*_{2}, ... is a
countably infinite sequence of mutually exclusive sentences:
*P*(*S*_{1}
*S*_{2}
... ) = *P*(*S*_{1}) +
*P*(*S*_{2}) + ... .

The discussion of the probability axioms in the text assumes only
Finite Additivity, because it is only Axioms (A1)-(A3) that can be
given a Dutch Book justification.

Copyright © 2001 by

**William J. Talbott**

*wtalbott@u.washington.edu*
Return to Bayesian Epistemology

*First published: July 12, 2001*

*Content last modified: July 12, 2001*