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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Doing vs. Allowing Harm


1. This issue is relevant also to the debate over abortion, the debate over capital punishment, and the more theoretical debate over consequentialism. See Scheffler, Smart and Williams.

2. James Rachels, “Active and Passive Euthanasia,”. See also Michael Tooley, “Abortion and Infanticide,” Philosophy and Public Affairs 2 1972, Peter Singer, Practical Ethics,1979 and Peter Unger, Living High and Letting Die.

3. “The Additive Fallacy”.

4. Ibid., 259. See Heidi Malm (1992) for a response to Kagan.

5. We talk about allowing the tree to fall, but we do not talk about “doing the tree fall”. We do of course talk about “making the tree fall” and “causing the tree to fall,” but I am reluctant to use these terms, because they suggest that allowing the tree to fall is not a way of causing it to fall, and, as I shall argue below, this is wrong.

6. See, for example, Daniel Callahan, 1989.

7. This idea, which has its roots in Hume's writings, is developed in Lewis, 1986. Note that the definition I mention in the text represents the gut idea of the counterfactual account of causation. Subsequent versions are much more complicated, but they all imply that letting die is a kind of causing.

8. See Mackie, 1974. According to “transference” accounts of causation, causation consists in the transfer of energy or momentum from one object to another at the point of contact between the objects. Such accounts would indeed imply that allowing was not causing. See J. Aronsen, 1971 . But it seems then that a different premise in the argument for the moral insignificance of the distinction would be in trouble. The thought that one cannot be morally responsible for what one is not causally responsible for now seems dubious. It seemed correct, before, I conjecture, because, on the counterfactual accounts, it is very close to the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. If the transference account of causation is correct, then lack of causal responsibility does not imply inability to make a difference.

9. Or “ if the agent had never existed.” See Shelly Kagan, 1989, p. 94 ff for this version.

10. It might be objected that, had Franz been absent, the death would not have occurred, because the victim would have died a different death, since he would have been killed by Hans rather than by Franz. It seems to me that this response fails, since it is simply asserting the very point at issue: that the counterfactual account implies that Franz killed.

11. See Donagan, 1977.

12. See Christian Munthe, 1999, for an interesting attack on the claim that the counterfactual distinction is morally significant. Munthe argues that if true, this claim would violate the rule that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’.

13. See Warren Quinn, “Actions, Intentions, and Consequences: The Doctrine of Doing and Allowing.”.

14. Quinn uses the expression, “harmful positive agency” for doing harm and “harmful negative agency” for allowing harm. This idea can be traced back at least to Anscombe and Davidson (see Anscombe, 1958 and Davidson, 1980.)

15. See Foot, 1985. Note that Quinn's argument for the moral significance of the distinction doesn't seem to hang on his account of the distinction.

16. Ibid., p. 156.

17. See Strudler and Wasserman for an interesting critique of this point.

18. Bennett has developed and defended these ideas in a series of articles and a book. See Bennett, 1967, 1981, 1993, 1995.

19. This nutshell leaves out much important detail. See the original.

20. For example, Daniel Dinello (1971). Quinn makes a similar point in “Actions, Intentions, and Consequences.”

21. If you feel that whether this counts as a killing depends on other factors such as what the agent knows or desires, add whatever features will make it seem most favorable to me. My point is simply that sometimes an agent can kill while remaining completely immobile. Robin Dillon helped me to see this point. Bennett offers several other reasons for thinking that the immobility objection is not decisive against him. See p. 98 ff of The Act Itself.

22. This objection was suggested to me by remarks of Paul Wagoner. Note that Sassan bears obvious resemblances to Harry Frankfurt's famous counterexample to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities. See Frankfurt, 1969. It is importantly different from that example, however.

23. In correspondence.

24. I am indebted to John Hawthorne for with the ideas of this paragraph. Does every case of this sort have a victim? It is arguable that every upshot consists in a state or event occurring in some object or objects. Let that object or objects be the ‘victim’ with which, directly or indirectly, the agent interacts.

25. I was surprised to learn—from Jonathan Schaffer—that firing a gun is a safety net case—that most triggers work by removing a barrier and “allowing” pent-up energy to release the bullet. This example suggests that we had better put safety net cases on the positive side of the line.

26. I need to insist that the agent is not identical with X. Without this qualification, some very standard cases of allowing would count as positive relevance, since the agent might be said to act on herself to prevent herself from saving the victim. I'm not sure that it even makes sense to talk of an agent acting on herself, or of forces running from her to herself, but if it does, let us exclude such cases.

27. Bernard Williams discusses a case like this. See his 1973, pp. 98-99.

28. In “Killing, Letting Die and Withdrawing Aid”. See Tracy Isaacs (1995) for a powerful critique of McMahan.

29. Ibid., (in Norcross and Steinbock) p. 396.

30. Matthew Hanser argues that we should recognize a third category here: preventing someone from being saved. I think this treatment of “safety net” cases can be seen as confirming my point about the tissue of overlapping distinctions. Clear cases of killing fall on the positive side of all of the candidate distinctions, clear cases of allowing death fall on the negative side of all the distinctions; indeterminate cases fall on one side of one distinction and on the other side of another distinction. Treating these as a third category is just another way of making the same point. See Hanser, 1999.

Copyright © 2002 by
Frances Howard-Snyder

First published: May 14, 2002
Content last modified: May 14, 2002