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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Descartes' Modal Metaphysics


1. Second Replies, AT 7:149, CSM 2:106. This is of course just a restatement of Descartes' Fourth Meditation truth rule. See also Fifth Replies, AT 7:350-351, CSM 2:243. I use “CSM” to refer to the pagination in Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch 1984 and Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch 1985. I use “CSMK” to refer to the pagination in Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny 1991. I use “AT” to refer to the pagination in Adam and Tannery 1996.

2. Fourth Replies, AT 7:249, CSM 2:173. See also Curley 1986; Garber 1986, 81-97; Cottingham 1988, 43-46; Cunning 2002, Cunning 2003a, and Cunning 2003b.

3. See Cunning 2003b.

4. Second Replies, AT 7:130-131, CSM 2:94. See also Principles of Philosophy I:73, AT 8A:37, CSM 1:220. Descartes says that because “there is nothing whose true nature we perceive by the senses alone, it turns out that most people have nothing but confused perceptions throughout their entire lives.”

5. There are parallel passages in Second Replies at AT 7:163-164, CSM 2:115, and AT 7:166, CSM 2:117.

6. To [Mesland], 2 May 1644; AT 4:118, CSMK 235. See also “Conversation with Burman, 16 April 1648,” AT 5:160, CSMK 343. The passages in the latter are tricky because they are Burman's reports of one of his discussions with Descartes.

7. See also Mattern 1984, 475, 486-487; and Alanen (1991).

8. Wilson 1978, 185-198. A discussion of Wilson's view is in section four.

9. Normore 1991, 68.

10. Normore 1991, 69-71, and Normore 1986, 224 and 231-234.

11. Principles I:48, AT 8A:23, CSM 1:208. Descartes mentions in the first line of this section of Principles that “eternal truths” are part of his ontology as well. These are beings which, as he puts it, “have no existence outside our thought.” Whatever they are, they fit nicely into Descartes' dualistic ontology as features internal to created minds. (See Cunning 2003b.) A discussion of eternal truths is in section three below.

12. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 141-143, and Cunning 2003a.

13. See Nelson 1993, 685-688, and Nelson and Cunning 1999.

14. It should be noted that in the Early Modern period this view was not so unusual. Spinoza embraced a full-blown actualism, and it might be that in doing so he was just following Descartes. (See Cunning 2003b.)

15. It is interesting to note that after Descartes says to Mesland that “our mind is finite and so created as to be able to perceive as possible things which God has wished to be in fact possible,” he immediately retreats. After flirting with this and other ideas concerning what God has made possible, Descartes says,

… if we would know the immensity of his power we should not put these thoughts before our minds, nor should we conceive any precedence or priority between his intellect and his will; for the idea which we have of God teaches us that there is in him only a single activity, entirely simple and entirely pure. (AT 4:119, CSMK 235)
Here Descartes appears to be applying his actualism and saying that since God wills whatever he understands, the thought of an unactualized possible is incoherent and thus something of which we ought not speak when doing metaphysics.

16. See Bennett 1994, 647-649.

17. See Frankfurt 1977.

18. To [Mesland], 2 May 1644; AT 4:118, CSMK 235; Frankfurt 1977, 43.

19. For [Arnauld], 29 July 1648; AT 5:224, CSMK 358-359; Frankfurt 1977, 49.

20. Frankfurt 1977, 50-51.

21. Curley 1984, 579-503.

22. AT 4:118-119, CSMK 235; Curley 1984, 582.

23. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 144-146.

24. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 144-145, and Cunning 2003b.

25. Kenny 1970, 692-700.

26. Schmaltz 1991, 135.

27. Vere Chappell points this out in Chappell 1997, 123-27.

28. It may be that Descartes equivocates in his use of eternal. He holds that God exists from eternity and that He wills everything from eternity, yet he holds that eternal truths have no existence outside of our thought. His view might just be that eternal truths exist in non-eternal finite minds and are eternal in the sense that their truth values do not change. This reading squares with the passages (AT 1:145, CSMK 23; and AT 2:138, CSMK 103) in which Descartes distances himself from the view that eternal truths are eternal in any robust sense. See Cunning 2003b.

29. Wilson 1978, 185-198, and Curley 1978, 193-206. See also Gueroult 1984, 47-57.

30. Wilson 1978, 196-198.

31. Rozemond 1998, 28-37.

32. Rozemond 1998, 3-8.

33. Rozemond 1998, 28-37.

34. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 148.

Copyright © 2002 by
David Cunning
First published: April 22, 2002
Content last modified: April 22, 2002