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Death

Attempts to understand death and its ramifications have generated much controversy. In what follows we will examine six areas of debate. First, what constitutes a person's death? It is clear enough that people die when their lives end, but less clear what constitutes the ending of a person's life.

A second controversy is whether one or more of several arguments defeats the harm thesis, the claim that death harms the individual who dies. (Often, discussions of the harm thesis ask whether post-mortem events, as well as death, can harm the individual who dies.) These arguments are as follows: (1) The no-self theory rejects the very idea of a self; this is a challenge to the harm thesis, since, unless there are selves, there is nothing that death can harm. (2) According to the comparative good objection, saying that death is harmful would make sense only if saying that the dead are worse off than the living made sense, which it does not, because an individual who has died is nonexistent and hence does not have a level of well-being. (3) The symmetry argument claims that it is irrational to think death is bad for us, because we do not think the nonexistence that preceded our births is bad for us, and when we compare this period of nonexistence to death, we see the two are mirror images, alike in all respects. (4) What might be called the timing puzzle is an attempt to impale the harm thesis on the horns of a dilemma. If death, or some post-mortem event, harms us, it does so before we die, or afterwards. The first option seems absurd, so the harm must occur while we are dead. But a person can be harmed only if caused to be in some sort of objectionable condition, and since the dead do not exist, they are in no condition at all. Either way, the harm thesis is false.

A third controversy concerns attempts to show that even if the dead cannot be harmed, the harm thesis is correct, since death, and some post-mortem events, harm the living. That is, there is something in the way death affects an individual who is not yet dead that constitutes harm. Admittedly, the idea that death or a post-mortem event harms the living may appear mysterious, but only if we operate with two overly narrow conceptions. First, we may think, mistakenly, that unless one thing A, has a causal impact on another B, A cannot affect B at all. This overlooks the possibility that A might affect B by influencing what is true of B. This is the way people who care about how they are thought of can be affected for the worse by posthumous events that destroy their reputations: these events have no causal impact on them, but they make it true of them that their desire always to be thought well of will be thwarted. Death, also, can affect us, by making it true of us that many of our desires will be thwarted. A second overly narrow conception we might have concerns harm. Everyone acknowledges that an event is harmful if it causes the presence of a bad condition of some sort, such as a wound. But there is another kind of harm: an event is sometimes harmful because it causes the absence of a good condition of some sort. When our teacher is killed, we lose knowledge we would otherwise have gained. Some theorists argue that all harms reduce to the first sort (so that, if the loss of a teacher is harmful, that is because it leaves us in a bad -- in effect ‘wounded’ -- condition), and reject the harm thesis on the grounds that death and posthumous events cannot cause wound-type harms. Other theorists counter that both kinds of harm exist, and death can harm us in the second way, by precluding our achieving all sorts of goods, yet leaving no ‘wounds’.

Assuming that the harm thesis is correct, a fourth controversy arises, concerning the specific nature of the harm death and various post-mortem events do, and whether such harms constitute misfortune. Presumably, these events harm us by putting certain goods out of our reach, but we are not always harmed by states of affairs that block our access to goods. My not having a magic lamp blocks me from getting three wishes, but it would be silly to say that I am harmed by my lack of a lamp. As an approximation, we might say that an event or state of affairs harms me if it ensures that I will lack some good that, otherwise, I would have had, but this criterion is open to objections.

A fifth controversy concerns whether all deaths are misfortunes or only some. Of particular interest here is a dispute between Thomas Nagel, who says that death is always an evil, since continued life always makes good things accessible, and Bernard Williams, who argues that, while premature death is a misfortune, it is a good thing that we are not immortal, since we cannot continue to be who we are now and remain meaningfully attached to life forever.

A final controversy concerns whether or not the harmfulness of death can be reduced. It may be that, by adjusting our conception of the self, or the good life, and by altering our attitudes, we can reduce or eliminate the harm death can do to us. Indeed, the adaptation of our views and attitudes might be a way to reduce or eliminate the harmfulness of anything that might happen to us, as certain ancient theorists, such as Gautama and perhaps Epicurus suggested. But there is a case to be made that such efforts will backfire if taken to extremes.


1. What is Death?

The term ‘death’ is ambiguous. Undergoing a disease that undermines the ability to live is one thing, the ending of life is a second, and the condition of having life over is a third. The first of these is a process, the second an event, while the third is a state or condition. ‘Death’ can refer to any or all of the three, and it is particularly easy to run the last two together. To avoid confusion, it helps to use the term death (or dying) for the event of life's ending, the term being dead for the state in which life has ended, and neither for the process of physiological decline that (unless halted) undermines life and leads to death.

‘Death’ is also unclear in at least two ways. First, the concept of life is not entirely clear, and to the extent that we are puzzled about what life entails, we will be puzzled about what is entailed by the ending of life, that is, death (Feldman 1992). Second, it seems somewhat indeterminate whether a temporary absence of life suffices for death, or whether death entails a permanent loss of life. For practical purposes, whenever a creature loses life, or becomes nonexistent, the condition is permanent; so ‘death’, as commonly used, need not be sensitive to the distinction between temporary nonexistence and permanent nonexistence. But in thought experiments we can imagine the temporary loss of life and existence. Suppose, for example, that I were frozen and later revived, as is sometimes done to simple organisms: it is tempting to say that I cease to be alive, and cease to exist, while frozen in a state of suspended animation. Or imagine a futuristic device that reduces me to disconnected atoms which it stores and later reassembles just as they were before. Many of us will say that I would survive—my life would continue—after the reassembly, but it is quite clear that I would not exist during intervals when my atoms are stacked in storage. In these cases, our linguistic intuitions give no definitive verdict concerning the applicability of ‘death’. On the one hand, it seems appropriate to say that I die when my body is completely frozen or my atoms are disconnected, since the term ‘death’ seems applicable when a creature's life ceases. On the other hand it seems correct to deny that I die, since the cessation of my existence is only temporary given that my life is eventually restored, and ‘death’ seems applicable only when a creature is made permanently nonexistent. Nonetheless, once we allow our competing intuitions to work themselves out, we are likely to conclude that permanent nonexistence more fully captures what we mean by ‘death’; hence in what follows we may as well assume that death entails permanent nonexistence.

According to some religious traditions, people need not permanently cease to exist when their bodies break down. There are perhaps two main competing ideas about how an afterlife is possible. First, our physical demise could be merely temporary, since God might resurrect our bodies (restoring our mental life in doing so). Second, we might avoid even temporary nonexistence, assuming we are immaterial (nonphysical) souls who survive the demise of the body. Proponents of the first idea of the afterlife sometimes apply ‘death’ to the breakdown of bodies, and proponents of the second sometimes apply it to the soulís departure from the body, but both groups presumably will also acknowledge that ‘death’ would apply to our permanent nonexistence (even though they would deny that such death is inevitable).

1.1 Transition v. Ending

Does our existence come to a final end when our bodies break down, or is there some sort of transition to an afterlife? As evidence for the latter, one might cite anecdotes by gravely ill people, who sometimes report out-of-body experiences, whereby they seem to be souls traveling outside of their bodies. But these data can be accommodated by the hypothesis that death is our complete annihilation, together with the claim that out-of-body experiences are misleading. In support of this alternative, we might cite the fact that these experiences can be produced pharmacologically (Blackmore 1993), in people who are perfectly healthy. Unless one supposes that souls are knocked loose by drugs, only to wander back once the drugs wear off, such experiments suggest that out-of-body experiences are illusory, even when triggered in the brains of dying people. Moreover, scientists have never been able to detect souls, and many of the people who claim this ability have been proven frauds. Aside from such empirical considerations, there are further arguments for an afterlife in the philosophical and religious literature. However, most philosophers are skeptical about these arguments, and we must leave these aside. Hereinafter we will adopt the conservative assumption that death is annihilation, or permanent nonexistence.

1.2 Death and Identity

Even if immaterial souls do not exist, there is good reason not to identify the deaths of people with the deaths of their bodies. For you can survive the demise of parts of your body, and your body can survive while you do not. You die if and only if your identity is destroyed. Hence we can clarify what it is for a person to die only if we clarify what is essential to a person's identity (Green and Winkler 1980). This is a complicated matter, which we must leave largely unexamined. But a few points are in order.

First, theorists such as Derek Parfit (1984), building on the work of John Locke (1689), have made a strong case for the view that psychological attributes such as memories and character traits, which change gradually over time, are central to our identities (see the essays in Perry 1975). Two separate but related ideas of identity vie for our acceptance: identity as connectedness requires that one's psychological profile not change significantly over time if one is to remain the same person, while identity as continuity allows changes in one's profile so long as these are gradual. According to the first idea, we can gradually lose our identities; identity is a matter of degree, since we retain our psychological attributes in varying degrees. By the second idea, identity is all or nothing; we either remain the same person or we do not; either there is not more than a gradual change in our psychological profiles or there is. Hence if we think of identity as connectedness, we will conclude that death, too, can come in degrees, and becomes complete when our psychological profiles are greatly altered or destroyed. Thinking of identity as continuity will lead us to say that death is all or nothing -- that people live through gradual, but not sudden and drastic, psychological changes.

Second, it is important to distinguish between the concept of death and a criterion for death. The concept of death says what death is: the cessation of personal survival. A criterion for death, by contrast, lays out a condition by which a person's death may be determined. The traditional criterion for death says that you will be dead when your heart and lungs cease to function (not that death is cessation of respiration and cardiac functioning). A more recent criterion is brain death -- meaning the death of the entire brain -- since the brain is the seat of our psychological features. The brain death criterion is more accurate since, with modern technology, respiration and blood circulation can be maintained artificially even when the brain is dead. As things stand, authorities in the legal and medical context frequently rely on the brain death criterion (President's Commission, 1981). For example, tissues are not to be harvested from organ donors unless the entire brain is dead. But there is good reason to consider a person dead even if certain parts of the brain are still alive. Personality is most closely associated with the higher brain (the cerebral cortex). Unsurprisingly, then, there is increasing support for a higher brain criterion for death, according to which death occurs when the higher brain is no longer alive.

2. How is Death Not Harmful?

Typically, those who value life accept a view that might be called the harm thesis: annihilation is, at least sometimes, bad for those who die, and in this sense something that ‘harms’ them. It is important to know what to make of this thesis, since our response itself can be harmful. This might happen as follows: suppose that we love life, and reason that since it is good, more would be better. Our thoughts then turn to death, and we decide it is bad: the better life is, we think, the better more life would be, and the worse death is. At this point, we are in danger of condemning the human condition, which embraces life and death, on the grounds that it has a tragic side, namely death. It will help some if we remind ourselves that our situation also has a good side. Indeed, our condemnation of death is here based on the assumption that more life would be good. But such consolations are not for everyone. (They are unavailable if we crave immortality on the basis of demanding standards by which the only worthwhile projects are endless in duration, for then we will condemn the condition of mere mortals as tragic through and through, and may, as Unamuno (1913) points out, end up suicidal, fearing that the only life available is not worth having.) And a favorable assessment of life may be a limited consolation, since it leaves open the possibility that, viewing the human condition as a whole, the bad cancels much of the good. In any case it is grim enough to conclude that, given the harm thesis, the human condition has a tragic side. It is no wonder that theorists over the millennia have sought to defeat the harm thesis. Let us examine their efforts.

2.1 The No-self Challenge

The first challenge to the harm thesis confronts us if we object to death on the grounds that it takes away our existence. According to Gautama (563-483 B.C.), it is a mistake to say that death ends our existence. If he is correct, our objection is moot. But why does Gautama deny that death causes our nonexistence? It is not because there is an afterlife. Instead, his thought is that there is no self and never was. The notion of a self is defective, so it makes no sense to ask whether selves are annihilated, and those who fear annihilation are confused. The no-self view, in turn, Gautama rests on skepticism about the notion of souls or substances, thought of as changeless substrata underlying changing attributes.

This first challenge to the harm thesis is far from conclusive, however, since the notion of personal identity is not tied inextricably to any particular conception of substance. As John Locke pointed out, a criterion of identity based on psychological continuity floats free of any particular conception of the underlying material basis for our psychological attributes. Presumably, our psychological attributes, and hence our identities, depend on the brain, yet survive its material transformation.

2.2 The Comparative Good Objection

Consider a second challenge to the harm thesis. The claim that we are harmed by death seems to imply that we are worse off dead than alive. But being worse off dead seems to require that we have some level of well-being while dead which compares badly to our level of well-being while alive. However, the dead do not have a level of well-being since they do not exist. Apparently we are in a muddle when we claim to be harmed by death.

This objection fails, since being worse off dead than alive need not imply that we have some level of well-being while dead. Perhaps when I say I am worse off dead than alive, I compare alternative ways my life might go, noting that some alternatives would be better than others, and judge that an endless life is the best fate of all for me. Perhaps I assess events in terms of their bearing on which alternative I end up with, as follows: when an event determines that the way my life shall go is inferior to the alternative ways it might have gone, it harms me. Relying on this approach, I conclude that any event, such as death, that ends my life is bad for me in the sense that it brings about one of the inferior alternatives. What I am saying, then, is that endless life is better for me than the briefer alternatives, not that my state while living endlessly is better than my state while nonexistent. Death affects me, not by placing me in some condition or another during some mysterious form of existence, but rather by limiting the duration of my life.

2.3 The Symmetry Argument

A third challenge to the harm thesis is an attempt to show that the state death puts us in, nonexistence, is not bad. According to the symmetry argument, posed by Lucretius, a follower of Epicurus, we can prove this to ourselves by thinking about our state before we were born:

Look back at time … before our birth. In this way Nature holds before our eyes the mirror of our future after death. Is this so grim, so gloomy? (Lucretius 1951)

The idea is clear to a point: it is irrational to object to death, since we do not object to pre-natal nonexistence (the state of nonexistence that preceded our births), and the two are alike in all relevant respects, so that any objection to the one would apply to the other. However, Lucretius' argument admits of more than one interpretation, depending on whether it is supposed to address the event of death or the state of death (or both).

On the first interpretation, the death event is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against it is the fact that it is followed by our nonexistence, yet the latter is not objectionable, even to us, as is shown by the fact that we do not object to our nonexistence before birth. So understood, the symmetry argument is weak. Our complaint about death need not be that the state of nonexistence is ghastly. Instead, our complaint might be that death brings life, which is a good thing, to an end, and, all things being equal, what ends good things is bad. Notice that the mirror image of death is birth (or, more precisely, becoming existent), and the two affect us in very different ways: birth makes life possible; it starts a good thing going. Death makes life impossible; it brings a good thing to a close.

Perhaps Lucretius only meant to argue that the death state is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against the death state is that it is nonexistence, which is not really objectionable, as witness our attitude about pre-natal nonexistence. So interpreted, there is a kernel of truth in Lucretius' argument. Truly, our pre-natal nonexistence does not concern us much. But that is because pre-natal nonexistence is followed by existence. Nor would we worry overly about post-natal nonexistence if it, too, were followed by existence. If we could move in and out of existence, say with the help of futuristic machines that could dismantle us, then rebuild us, molecule by molecule, after a period of nonexistence, we would not be overly upset about the intervening gaps, and, rather like hibernating bears, we might enjoy taking occasional breaks from life while the world gets more interesting. But undergoing temporary nonexistence is not the same as undergoing permanent nonexistence. Unlike the former, the latter entails death in the fullest sense. What is upsetting is the death that precedes post-natal nonexistence -- or, what comes to the same thing, the permanence of post-natal nonexistence -- not nonexistence per se.

There is another way to use considerations of symmetry to argue against the harm thesis: we want to die later, or not at all, because it is a way of extending life, but this attitude is irrational, Lucretius might say, since we do not want to be born earlier (we do not want to have always existed), which is also a way to extend life. As this argument suggests, we are more concerned about the indefinite continuation of our lives than about their indefinite extension. (Be careful when you rub the magic lamp: if you wish that your life be extended, the genie might make you older!) A life can be extended by adding to its future or to its past. Some of us might welcome the prospect of having lived a life stretching indefinitely into the past, given fortuitous circumstances. But we would prefer a life stretching indefinitely into the future.

Is it irrational to want future life more than past life? No; it is not surprising to find ourselves with no desire to extend life into the past, since the structure of the world permits life extension only into the future, and that is good enough. But what if life extension were possible in either direction? Would we still be indifferent about a lengthier past? And should our attitude about future life match our attitude about past life?

There should be a match if our interests and attitudes are limited in certain ways. If quantity of life is the only concern, a preference for future life is irrational. Similarly, the preference is irrational if our only concern is to maximize how much pleasure we experience over the course of our lives without regard to its temporal distribution. But our attitude is not that of the life- or pleasure-gourmand.

According to Parfit, we have a far-reaching bias extending to goods in general: we prefer that any good things, not just pleasures, be in our future, and that bad things, if they happen at all, be in our past. He argues that if we take this extensive bias for granted, we can explain why it is rational to deplore death more than we do our not having always existed: the former, not the latter, deprives us of good things in the future (he need not say that it is because it is in the past that we worry about the life-limiting event at the beginning of our lives less than the life-limiting event at the end). This preference for future goods is unfortunate, however, according to Parfit. If cultivated, the temporal insensitivity of the life- or pleasure-gourmand could lower our sensitivity to death: towards the end of life, we would find it unsettling that our supply of pleasures cannot be increased in the future, but we would be comforted by the pleasures we have accumulated.

Whether or not we have the extensive bias described by Parfit, it is true that the accumulation of life and pleasure, and the passive contemplation thereof, are not our only interests. We also have active, forward-looking goals and concerns. Engaging in such pursuits has its own value; for many of us, these pursuits, and not passive interests, are central to our identities. However, we cannot make and pursue plans for our past. We must project our plans (our self-realization) into the future, which explains our forward bias. It is not irrational to prefer that our lives be extended into the future rather than the past, if for no other reason than this: only the former makes forward-looking pursuits possible. It is not irrational to prefer not to be at the end of our lives, unable to shape them further, and limited to reminiscing about days gone by.

Nevertheless, it does not follow that we should be indifferent about the extent of our pasts. Being in the grip of forward-looking pursuits is important, but these take time, and their historical development, which underlies our self-realization, is important, too. We have passive interests as well, which would prompt us to extend our pasts if the opportunity presented itself. If fated to die tomorrow, most of us would prefer to have a thousand years of glory behind us rather than fifty years of glory.

2.4 The Timing Puzzle: Death Cannot Affect Us

Another challenge arises when we look for the specific time during which we undergo the harm that death supposedly brings upon us. As Epicurus (341-270) says in his Letter to Menoeceus, there does not appear to be such a time:

Death …, the most awful of evils, is nothing to us, seeing that, when we are, death is not come, and, when death is come, we are not.
His thought is that if death is bad for us, there must be a time when we are made worse off. Given that death follows immediately upon life, the harm must be incurred either while we are alive, or afterwards. Presumably it is not incurred while we are alive, since that implies that we undergo the harm before the death responsible for it occurs. But the alternative is to say that the harm is incurred after we are gone. Yet it is odd to say that nonexistent people can be harmed, for wouldn't that mean people have some sort of ghostly existence after their lives end, and that the condition of these ghosts can be worsened?

Epicurus focuses on death, but if his argument is good, it applies more generally, to include all events that follow death. Let us call something a mortem event if it takes place when we die or afterwards, so that death and every event that follows is a mortem event. Epicurus's position is that no mortem event can harm us.

Epicurus's argument can be interpreted in more than one way. The intent might be to show that no mortem event can affect us at all. This claim, together with the following impact thesis, implies that mortem events are harmless:

An event harms us only if it somehow affects us at some time (the event may affect us well after it occurs).

Let us see if it is possible to show that mortem events do not affect us. Then we can try out a weaker thesis: that no mortem event can affect us in a way that matters. This weaker claim is easier to defend; in all likelihood, it is what Epicurus had in mind, but the stronger claim is worth exploring.

To defend the view that mortem events do not affect us, we need to make some assumptions about when an event can affect us. To this end, let us adopt the causal account of responsibility:

  1. An event (or state of affairs) can affect some subject (person or thing) S only by causally affecting S (the causal impact only thesis).
  2. A subject S cannot be causally affected by an event while S is nonexistent (the exist while affected thesis).
  3. A subject cannot be causally affected by an event before the event occurs (the ban on backwards causation).

From this account, it follows that a post-mortem event, such as the burning of one's corpse, cannot affect us after we are dead, since, by (a), to be affected is to be affected causally, but, by (b), nonexistent people cannot be causally affected by any event. It also follows that a post-mortem event cannot affect us while we are alive, given the ban on backwards causation. We might call this the inertness of posthumous events argument:

  1. An event can affect us only by causally affecting us (the causal impact only thesis).
  2. We cannot be causally affected by an event while we are nonexistent (the exist while affected thesis).
  3. The dead do not exist.
  4. So no posthumous event can affect us while we are dead.
  5. We cannot be causally affected by an event before the event occurs (the ban on backwards causation).
  6. So no posthumous event can affect us while we are alive.
  7. So no posthumous event can affect us.
So far so good: no post-mortem event can affect us. However, there may still be a mortem event that can affect us: death. Of course, the thesis that we must exist to be affected rules out the possibility that death affects us after it occurs (after we are nonexistent). But it does not rule out the possibility that death affects us exactly when it occurs. Or does it?

Well, it does if death occurs only after we are nonexistent, as do post-mortem events. And some theorists have maintained that the event of death occurs on the nonexistence side of the boundary between our existence and nonexistence. For example, Feinberg (1984, p. 172) adopts this view in the following passage:

Death is defined simply as the first moment of the subject's nonexistence, so it is not something that ever coexists with the dying person for the time required for it to have a directly harmful effect on him.

However, the idea that we die only after we are nonexistent is unacceptable, for the event of death is a transition from a state of life to a state of death, and it is absurd to say that the transition takes place only after we are gone. It is also absurd to say the transition is completed while we are still alive. Hence defining death as the first moment of our nonexistence, as Feinberg does, is no better than defining it as the last moment of our existence.

But is it reasonable to say that we are alive at least part of the time during which we undergo the transition from life to death? Yes, since death takes time, and we are fully alive when the transition of death begins, partially alive as it progresses, and not at all alive when it ends. We exist while it is under way, and are affected by it in a straightforward way: it makes us less and less alive, until finally we cease to be.

However, conceivably a death might be instantaneous, in the following way: we simply move from being wholly alive to being wholly dead, and no time passes between the two. Can that kind of transition affect us? Actually, it is hard to say, since this picture is puzzling in certain ways. For example, if we suppose that no time passes in between our existing and our not existing, it seems to follow that everything that happens occurs either while we exist or while we do not exist (or during a period of time combining the two). We are never in between, never in any condition in between (whether existence, nonexistence, or some mysterious state that is neither), and no events happen in between. So if death is an event, when does it occur? If death is both an event and a transition across the boundary between being wholly alive and wholly dead, donít we have to imagine it overlapping with the sequences of events on both sides of this boundary? But suppose that, in spite of such puzzles, we can make it clear that the causal effects of an instantaneous death occur entirely on the far side of the boundary between existence and nonexistence. Then according to the causal account of responsibility, instant death does not causally affect us when it occurs or at any time thereafter.

Let's review. Granting them some leeway, especially the assumption that only what has a causal impact on us affects us, Epicurians can show that no mortem event other than death can affect us, and that if death can affect us, it can do so only precisely at the time it occurs. But they lack a convincing argument against the possibility that death and some of its effects overlap in time; and hence they cannot prove that mortem events are harmless.

2.5 The Timing Puzzle Again: Death's Impact Is Harmless

Instead of trying to show that no mortem event can affect us at all, Epicureans can try to show that no mortem event can affect us in a way that should matter to us. To that end, they can assume that something can affect us in a way that is positive, negative or even neutral from the standpoint of value, only if it causes (or can cause) in us the presence of some salient condition. The new strategy calls for replacing the impact thesis with the bad impact thesis:
An event harms us only if it is responsible for a bad condition's coming to be present in us at some time (the event and the condition's presence in us need not be simultaneous).
Some terminology will be helpful. If an event E is responsible for our being in a bad state, let us say that E is the indirect harm, while the bad state that E precipitates is the direct harm. Thus E indirectly harms us when it occurs, but directly harms us only when the bad state is brought about.

Proponents of the new thesis are committed to the old, but not vice versa. Something cannot affect us in a bad way unless it somehow affects us, but not all ways of affecting us involve the presence in us of some salient condition. Death affects us when it annihilates us, but it is not responsible for any condition's presence in us. For no condition can be present in us if there is no us. A condition cannot be present in us unless we exist. We can be directly harmed only if we exist--this claim is often called the existence condition. Yet we need not exist in order to be indirectly harmed: an event may indirectly harm us long before it has any direct impact on us; indirect harm may come even before we exist, as when someone times a bomb to go off 150 years later, killing everyone around.

Given the bad impact thesis, Epicureans can show that no mortem event can harm us by showing that no mortem event is responsible for any condition's presence in us. We might call this the absent conditions argument:

  1. Death is responsible for our nonexistence and for the absence of conditions in us at the time it occurs and thereafter, but not for the presence of any conditions in us at any time.
  2. Direct harms reduce to the presence of salient conditions in us, not in their absence (the bad impact thesis)
  3. So death cannot harm us.
The point can be extended to post-mortem events: given the ban on reverse causation, and the thesis that we are unaffected while not existing, nothing that happens after we die can be responsible for any condition's being present in us at any time, so posthumous events are harmless.

Different Epicureans offer different accounts of the salient condition genuine harm reduces to. However, they seem to agree that direct harm is a kind of experience, and they offer versions of the experience requirement, which says that an event can harm us only if we experience it (or only if we can experience it, or only if we (can) experience it as bad). According to Epicurus's own view, the only things that are bad for an individual are things that cause that individual to suffer (this claim is the painfulness criterion for harm). Armed with this criterion, he offers the argument from painlessness:

  1. The immediate result of death is the nonexistence of the self.
  2. So dying is painless.
  3. Nothing harms me unless it makes me suffer (the painfulness criterion for harm).
  4. So dying cannot harm me.
The same goes for post-mortem events: I cannot suffer posthumously, so nothing that happens after I die harms me.

Epicurus goes on to warn against three confusions that might blind us to the force of his view. First, it is easy to confuse death with the dying process leading up to it, such as progressive cancer, and to hold our complaints about the one against the other. But Epicurus admits that the latter can be painful and hence bad for us. Is he then trying to remove our concern about death only to leave in place our concern about the dying process? That would be odd, just as it would be odd to remove objections to the state of death, while leaving intact our objections to the event of death (but see Rosenbaum 1986). The stated goal of Epicureanism is ataraxia, or tranquility of mind; this goal is thought to be attainable because, for the enlightened, nothing in life is harmful. From this perspective, it would not be useful to show that being dead is of no concern, while leaving us terrified at the prospect of death, or the dying process. Of the three -- death, being dead, and the dying process -- Epicurus admits only that the dying process can be bad, and even it is not especially bad. But this last Epicurus rests on the dubious claim that serious afflictions are not very painful:

Continuous pain does not last long in the flesh; on the contrary, pain, if extreme, is present a very short time…. Illnesses of long duration even permit of an excess of pleasure over pain in the flesh (Principal Doctrines, Doctrine 4)
A second confused response results if we fail to distinguish pain caused by anticipating death with pain caused by death itself, and hold the former against the latter. Anticipating death upsets us and is, to that extent, a bad thing. However, our (present) anticipatory fear is not caused by our (future) death, since future events are powerless to affect the past. Moreover, fear is irrational unless its object is genuinely evil in some way, which death is not.

The third confusion arises if we do not distinguish what is bad for us from what is bad for others. At most, the fact that your family grieves your death supports the claim that your demise harms them, not that it harms you. (Too, your distress at anticipating your family's grief over your death is not grounds for you to regard your death as a bad thing: the suffering your death brings them cannot affect you, and your anticipatory grief is irrational.) Furthermore, their grief should be mitigated by the fact that your death is not bad for you. Their grief is entirely self-centered, exactly like the self-pity a gardener might feel at the loss of a familiar plot of land or pleasant flower.

(Would it be morally wrong to kill you, given Epicurus's painfulness criterion? Perhaps, but the moral case against killing is weak, given the fact that killing you harms you in no way, and, as a true Epicurean, you do not mind. But won't killing you displease others? Perhaps, but this reservation will not block the killing of pariahs -- or the complete annihilation of humanity.)

In sum, the Epicurean position comes to this: While one mortem event alone -- death -- can causally affect us (by annihilating us), no mortem event can harm us, since it can never cause in us the presence of any condition, and hence it can never cause in us a condition, such as the experience of pain, that qualifies as direct harm.

3. How Is Death Harmful?

Epicureans must be granted this much: all other things being equal, painless things, in being less frightening, are not as bad as painful things. If the immediate result of death is our nonexistence, and death happens too quickly to be experienced (which is far from obvious), then at least we can say that death and post-mortem events are painless, which makes them less frightening. However, even if we fear mortem events less, or not at all, since they are not experienced, should we conclude that they are not harmful? Let us see if the Epicureans' case holds up. As we shall see, even if we cannot be directly harmed while we are dead, it is possible to defend the harm thesis. We can start by looking for counterexamples to the bad impact thesis.

3.1 Harms that Wound Versus Harms that Deprive

One set of examples centers on the fact that most of us regret the severing of our interpersonal relationships and the thwarting of our aspirations. However, it is possible for these to be destroyed without our noticing. Suppose (Nozick 1971) that by means of an elaborate lie, an enemy convinces someone you love to hate you but to feign love so as to keep tabs on you for the rest of your life. Then you lose the love of your partner yet forever retain the appearance of love. Your loss produces no troubling experiences in you, but it is bad for you nonetheless. Or suppose (Nagel 1979) you are struck by an illness that instantly destroys your faculties and reduces you to the state of a contented infant. Here again is a tragic loss that is not accompanied by troubling experiences. A related case: it is bad to be raped after secretly being drugged into sleep, even though we cannot experience being raped while asleep. A second set of examples exploits the fact that we can experience, and suffer from, nothing that happens after we die, yet many post-mortem events are regrettable. For example, it is terrible to have your will set aside. And there are other examples. Suppose you found out that, starting in two weeks, your family and friends (or everyone in the world, for that matter) were to suffer horribly. But then you learn you are to die in one week, so their fate can have no causal impact on you. If you adopt the Epicurean's bad impact thesis, the fate of your loved ones, under such circumstances, is not cause for concern, and if you could do something now to prevent their suffering, it would be unimportant for you to do so. Most of us would be appalled by the Epicurean's indifference about all of these matters.

Epicureans are committed to denying that any of these examples involve genuine harm, given their view that (direct) harm consists in the presence of some condition that is bad for us, such as wounds or pain. Their view, which we might call the present bad view of harm or the wound model of harm, is that events are harmless -- unable to make us worse off -- unless they leave us in a condition analogous to being wounded. Our examples suggest that this is an overly narrow conception of harm. They suggest that the direct harmfulness of some events may consist in the absence of a salient good, such as the love of your partner, or the completion of your life's work, or the flourishing of your children. In fact, the salient good might be pleasure itself, so even hedonists can agree that the direct harmfulness of an event might consist in the absence of a good. Epicurus's own hedonist account is negative, in the sense that it restricts harm to the presence of pain; but nothing stops a hedonist from adopting a positive account, according to which an event may harm us by depriving us of pleasure. The idea that direct harms can consist in the absence of some salient good (but might also consist in the presence of a relevant bad condition) we might term the absent good view of harm, or the deprivation account of harm.

But if the absence of a salient good can constitute a harm, then death can be harmful, for there are two ways in which death can be responsible for harmfully absent goods. First, it destroys goods, such as good conditions present in us when we die (these are destruction harms). Second, it precludes our retaining goods or acquiring goods (preclusion harms). So the harm thesis is true after all.

However, proponents of the harm thesis still have work to do, for so far nothing they have said tells us when we incur the harms associated with absent goods. Now, it seems possible to pin down the time we incur the harms associated with death. Perhaps destruction harms and the death responsible for them occur simultaneously. And perhaps all preclusion harms associated with death can be treated similarly. However, the harm done by post-mortem events resists this treatment: it seems unfortunate if the executor of your will ignores your directives, but when are you made worse off? If we say you are harmed at the time your will is ignored, rather than before, we have to say that you can be made worse off after you are gone. It is as if, before and after you die, you persist in a harm-free condition until your evil relatives toss out your will, at which point you are placed in a state of being harmed, made all the more mysterious by the fact that you are long gone. That seems mistaken. But what are the alternatives? Perhaps, as Thomas Nagel suggests (1979), it is an indeterminate matter when some things, such as the violations of wills, or death, make us worse off, although they do so all the same.

Apparently, the absent good view of harm allows us to explain the harmfulness of death, but leaves us with questions about when posthumous events harm us. Should the air of mystery surrounding post-mortem harms prompt us to deny that they exist? That is one alternative open to the proponents of the harm thesis: They can give up on post-mortem harms and defend the harm thesis on the grounds that death is responsible for temporally locatable deprivation harms. They will have rejected only one of the three main pillars supporting the Epicureans' case against the harm thesis, namely the present bad view of harm. The remaining two pillars are the causal account of responsibility, and the assumption that the dead are in no sense real.

There are other alternatives. Each involves rejecting not just the present bad view of harm, but also one additional pillar of the Epicureans' argument. An option we shall call the harmed dead view rejects the assumption that the dead are not real. A further option, which we shall call the noncausal harm view, rejects the causal account of responsibility.

3.2 The Harmed Dead View

Suppose that in some sense people are real even after death annihilates them. This assumption may allow us to revive the possibility that post-mortem events can harm us while we are dead. But are annihilated people real in any sense? Perhaps; Silverstein (1980) argues that we can say that they exist in a timeless sense of existence, and Palle Yourgrau suggests that we speak of the dead, as well as the unborn, as objects, where an object has a kind of reality even if it does not exist. Doing so, Yourgrau thinks, allows us to say that “the deprivation of nonexistence endured by the unborn is as great as that suffered by the dead… ” (Yourgrau 1987, p. 149).

However, even if we can show that the dead are real in some sense, we will not be in a position to claim that the dead can be harmed unless we abandon the present bad view of harm. Absences are the only candidates for harm to people while they are nonexistent, for even if the dead are in some sense real, it is difficult to imagine a condition whose presence in them constitutes a state of harm. Being deprived of existence, as the unborn are, is itself at worst a harmful absence, and hence, by the bad impact thesis, no harm at all. We must also reject the experience requirement, which says that an event can harm us only if we experience it, for obviously the dead feel no pain. And if well-being is marked out in terms of the presence of some salient condition, it is difficult to see that the mode of reality possessed by the dead permit them to have a level of well-being. Hence if being harmed requires having a level of well-being, the dead cannot be harmed.

But if we do admit that goods deprivations can constitute harm, there is no further need to decide whether the dead can be harmed. As we shall see, we can defend the harm thesis on the basis of the deprivation account of harm together with other assumptions that hold even if the dead cannot be harmed.

3.3 The Noncausal Harm View

Undeniably, an air of mystery surrounds the idea that people who are annihilated come to be in a state of harm while dead. It would be desirable to pin down when post-mortem events harm us without assuming anything about the ontological status of the dead. Fortunately, there is a way. But we will have to reject one tenet of the causal account of responsibility, namely, the causal impact only thesis. Given the ban on backwards causation, the causal impact only thesis forces us to dismiss the idea that harm can occur before the event that precipitates it takes place. Yet, as George Pitcher (1984) says, this is precisely the idea we need in order to understand the harmfulness of a post-mortem event such as our will's being ignored. It is while you have a will, and the desires it expresses, that you are harmed. Pitcher's idea is that causation is not the only route via which things affect and thus harm others. The proposition, ‘You have a will which will be ignored’ is true now, even though it is true, in part, because of events that will occur after you and your desires cease to exist. These distant events harm you only indirectly. What directly harms you is your having desires or interests that will be thwarted, or your having the potential to attain a certain good that will go unrealized, which becomes true of you when you develop the desires or potential, and ceases to be true of you when they are gone. Perhaps (as the ban on backwards causation and the exist while affected thesis imply) we cannot be causally affected by events that will happen well after we are gone, yet we can be affected by these events in a straightforward non-causal way, because they help determine what is true of us now. It is not the dead who are harmed, but rather the living.

The idea of non-causal harm can be applied to death as well as post-mortem events. The verdict about death is that death can harm us indirectly, by being partly responsible for our having desires that will be thwarted, or potential that will go unrealized, in which case we are harmed directly, during such time as we have desires or potential that death prevents our attaining. Does this verdict force us to reassess our earlier suggestion that death directly harms us when it occurs? Not necessarily. For death (unlike posthumous events) might directly harm us twice: when it occurs and obliterates us, and when, because of death, it is true of us that we will not realize our potential.

There is another way to extend Pitcher's idea. We might object to the state of death because of its non-causal impact on us, since coming to be dead makes it true of us that we have desires that will be ignored. But instead of saying that being dead is objectionable, it seems better to say something else, once we notice that the state of death is simply the state of nonexistence initiated by the event of death. Perhaps being dead is powerless to harm us since any harm that might be associated with it is entailed in, and brought about by, death itself, which is responsible for limiting the duration of our lives, and all that that entails.

In sum, if we reject the present bad view of harm in favor of the absent good view, we can say that death is responsible for destruction harms and indirect preclusion harms at the moment it occurs, and for direct preclusion harms while we have the potential to acquire salient goods. We can also say that post-mortem events are responsible for direct and indirect preclusion harms.

4. What Is a Misfortune?

As we have seen, proponents of the harm thesis are committed to condemning a thing as bad when it deprives us of goods. Stated in this rough way, the good-deprivation criterion has considerable plausibility. Nonetheless, it requires development, and those who wish to refine it further will face three issues: First, should we adopt a subjectivist or an objectivist account of the good? Second, which of those goods an event or state of affairs precludes contributes to the harmfulness of that event? Third, how is harm related to misfortune?

4.1 Objective Versus Subjective

In clarifying what is good for a person, should our account be objectivist or subjectivist or some sort of mixture of the two? Nagel's well-known version of the good-deprivation criterion is objectivist. By contrast, subjectivists might say that things are good for us to the extent that they satisfy relevant desires (which desires these are must then be specified). Such theorists are likely to accept the thwarted desire criterion for misfortune, according to which something is bad for us insofar as it prevents us from satisfying relevant desires. To satisfy a desire here means to attain its object, not to gain pleasure from attaining its object, and to thwart a desire here means to block the attainment of its object, not to produce a feeling of frustration by such blocking. Bernard Williams is among those who defend this criterion. It was prefigured in the views of ancient Indian theorists -- for example, in Gautama's view that the cause of suffering is thwarted desire.

4.2 Harmfully Precluded Goods

The second question facing proponents of the good-deprivation view is: Which of those goods an event or state of affairs precludes (which of those desires an event thwarts) contributes to the harmfulness of that event? Not all of the goods an event puts out of reach would be attained or even accessible if the event did not occur. Losing my arms precludes my becoming a baseball star; yet, it would be odd to hold my failure to attain stardom against my injury since I would not have attained stardom uninjured. So apparently the relevant goods are limited to those we would have enjoyed had the event not occurred. And this is Nagel's strategy (refined by McMahan 1988 and Feldman 1991): he wants to measure the harmfulness of mortality in terms of goods immortality brings us. The position is that an event or state of affairs E is harmful to me if and only if I would be worse off if E held than I would be had E not held, and that the degree of harmfulness of E is measured in terms of how much worse off I would be if E held than I would be had E not held. Given this counterfactual criterion for harm, a good G is relevant to whether an event or state of affairs E is harmful to me if and only if:
  1. If E held I would lack G, and
  2. If E had not held, I would have had G.

Accordingly, the loss of my arms is harmful, since I am worse off without them, which means that there is a good, such as my capacity to use tools, that meets (1) and (2). But my becoming a baseball star is not relevant to the harmfulness of the loss of arms, since it is disqualified by (2): even if I kept my arms, I would not become a baseball star.

Unfortunately, there is a problem with the counterfactual criterion. It works well when we evaluate losses, such as the loss of my arms. But it often fails when we evaluate lacks. Consider, for example, my lack of genius: does it harm me? It does preclude my enjoying goods great intelligence would make possible, such as the ability to discover profound truths about the universe. So it meets (1). It meets (2) as well: if I failed to lack genius -- that is, if I were a genius -- I would enjoy the goods genius brings. However, it is peculiar to say that I am harmed by my lack of genius. Why is this?

4.3 Misfortune Versus Harm

The explanation we need involves clarifying the relationship between harm and misfortune. Let us begin with some observations: it is no misfortune for me not to enjoy the goods genius would bring me, and it is no misfortune to be deprived of goods when their absence is not a misfortune for me. Also, lacking genius is not in itself a misfortune, and yet genius is a great good. Similar points can be made about extraordinary beauty or God-like powers of various sorts: while these are great gifts, lacking them is no misfortune. (This is not to deny that beauty could come to be important to a person who makes it the focus of life, so that losing it would be a misfortune, even if never having it would not have been.) So it need not be a misfortune to lack great goods. And it is false that, the greater the good, the greater the misfortune we suffer in being denied it.

Nagel may be making a similar point when he writes, “the question is whether we can regard as a misfortune any limitation, like mortality, that is normal to the species” (Fischer 1993, p. 68). It is not clear what Nagel is saying, because limitations that are typical to a species might be ruled out as misfortunes on the grounds that lacking them is not really humanly good. Following Aristotle, we could define what is humanly good in terms of what enables an exemplary yet actual human being to live as well as possible. Lacking the limitations of the exemplary human being, we might add, is not humanly good, and having them is not a misfortune. Great beauty, Aristotle would say, is humanly good, but superhuman strength, of which even the best of us is incapable, is not. However, this is not the view we have defended. Our point is that a feature could be a genuine good for a human being, yet lacking it might be no misfortune.

How can lacking a great good fail to be a misfortune? Because some goods are less important for us than others, and it is a misfortune to be deprived of a good if and only if it is important for us to have it. But when is it important for us to have a good? The answer lies in the fact that it is one thing for a life to be (merely) good, and quite another for it to be the best (physically? conceptually?) possible life; some qualities are requisite for a merely good life, or a life that meets the minimal conditions for happiness, while others are essential to the optimal life, or one that provides for a degree of happiness that cannot be exceeded. Failing to have (something essential to) a good life (or minimal happiness) is a misfortune, yet failing to have (what makes for) the best possible life (or maximal happiness) surely is not. So it is plausible to say that the goods it is important to have, and whose absence constitutes a misfortune, are essential goods: items essential to a (merely) good life, or a life of (mere) happiness. (Of course, given the flexibility of the term ‘misfortune,’ some hedging is in order. Perhaps things need not go so far as to deprive us of an essential good to be a misfortune; perhaps it is enough that they significantly impair our chances of attaining the essentials.)

The explanation of why it is awkward to speak of harm when certain good possibilities, such as enjoying God-like powers, are not actualized, is that we tend to use the term ‘harm’ to refer to misfortune, and often it is not a misfortune for us when good possibilities fail to be actualized (since the failure does not bear on our having essential goods). The awkwardness is exacerbated, however, because we also want to use the term ‘harm’ to refer to things that are bad for us, and ‘bad’ covers a lot of territory: When, on the whole, something makes us worse off in any way or to any degree, no matter how trivial, it is common to call it a bad thing; we also say, of a good state of affairs that does not actually hold, that its failure to hold is a bad thing, since we would be better off if it did. Our use of the terms ‘bad’, ‘harm,’ and ‘misfortune’ thus makes it difficult for us to express the fact that the nonactualization of a good possibility might be no misfortune, even though it is harmful since bad, and bad only in the sense that we would be better off if the possibility were actual.

We have a choice to make. We may apply the terms ‘harm’ and ‘bad’ to any overall worsening of our condition, or to any failure to make our overall condition better. If we do, however, we cannot say that all harms are misfortunes.

5. When Is Death a Misfortune?

What is the upshot for death? Clearly some deaths deprive people of essential goods, and are therefore misfortunes. But are all deaths misfortunes?

5.1 Premature Death Is a Misfortune

By applying the thwarted desire criterion, we can reinforce the conclusion that death is not always a misfortune. Perhaps it is not bad to die at an advanced enough age, for people who live long enough may be ground down by life until they give up many of their goals. Also, they will have attained many of their aspirations. If already satisfied, or given up, a desire cannot be thwarted, even by death, so as we lose our motivation for living, death ceases to be objectionable to us. Perhaps death is bad for us only if premature in the sense that it comes when we are still in the grip of desires that propel us forward in life, and only if satisfying our desires is a real prospect.

We are left to wonder whether death would ever cease to be objectionable were we not ravaged by bad health and other setbacks. Williams argues that it would be bad to live forever, even under the best of circumstances. His view is based on an assumption about the relationship between our identities and the desires that motivate us to live.

Consider a woman who wants to die. She might still take the view that if she is to live on, then she should be well fed and clothed. She wants food and clothing on condition she remain alive. In this sense her desires are conditional, and do not give her reason to live. Contrast a father who is committed to rearing a beloved daughter: he desires unconditionally that the child do well, and his desire gives him reason to live, because he can rear his child only if he survives. In this sense, his desire is categorical, or unconditional. Williams thinks that categorical desires are essential to identity, and give meaning to life. Through categorical desires, we are attached to projects or relationships that are definitive of the self; faced with their destruction, we would feel our lives are meaningless, and that in an important sense we cannot survive as the persons we once were.

The bearing on death, according to Williams, is, first, that people have good reason to condemn a death that is premature in the sense that it thwarts their categorical desires. Second, mortality is good, since people who live long enough eventually will lose the categorical desires with which they identify. Life will lose its novelty, and oppressive boredom will set in. To avoid ennui, superseniors would have to replace their fundamental desires, again and again. But this is to abandon their identities; it is tantamount to death.

As Williams says, lives of unimaginative routine will eventually grow stale if extended long enough. Of course, this is not supposed to comfort ordinary mortals, most of whom will die long before routine undermines the joy in living. However, as several theorists, including Nagel (1986, p. 224, n. 3) Glover (1977, p. 57), and Fischer (1993, p. 11) have suggested, it is not obvious that life must become dull. Williams may have overlooked how rich and complex life can be, especially for superseniors who pursue multiple open-ended projects in the company of other superseniors. His response to this kind of criticism is that even rich and open-ended projects eventually will become routine (say after a few billion years), so our pursuits must be replaced periodically if we are to remain interested in life. But to phase in wholly new projects is to lose our identity.

Williams's response faces objections. First, we might avoid boredom by adding to our pursuits, and varying the way we approach them, without abandoning certain core interests that define us. Second, Williams is working with a view of identity that may be too narrow. Many of us would welcome a possibility that he downplays: gradually transforming our interests and projects over time. Transformation is not death. It is distinct from, and preferable to, annihilation. Transformation would be death only if identity were wholly a matter of connectedness. However, we also think of identity as continuity: If we could live endlessly, the stages of our lives would display reduced connectedness, yet they would be continuous, which is a property that is important in the kind of survival most of us prize. Even after drinking at the fountain of eternal youth, we would tend to focus on relatively short stretches of our indefinitely extensive lives, and over these periods we would prize connectedness, since we are animated by specific projects and relationships that can be developed only if there are strong interconnections among the temporal stages of our lives. However, sometimes we would turn our attention to relatively long stretches of life, and then, prizing continuity, we would phase in new and worthwhile undertakings that build upon, and do not wholly replace, the old.

6. Can Death's Harmfulness be Reduced?

We have been asking after the objectively correct answer to the question, Is it bad to die? Instead of treating the value of death as a fact to be discovered, some argue that death need not be a misfortune, if we prepare ourselves suitably. Assuming that identity is malleable, we might identify with something durable, such as a family line or the community or the natural order, so that ‘we’ survive, and need not be harmed by, the demise of the individual (of course, the demise of the family or community or natural order would still harm us). Or, like Gautama, we might altogether abandon the notion of the self, in an attempt to convince ourselves that there is no one to die. Another approach does not specifically involve adjusting the boundaries of the self. Ancient philosophers in both the East and West noticed that if we adopt the right conception of the good life, and the right desires, we prevent death from harming us. We can even become invulnerable in an important sense: nothing that happens to us will be able to diminish the goodness of our lives; nothing will be a misfortune for us, including death. Let us see how this idea can be developed.

For invulnerability, what is needed is a view given which the things that affect the goodness of our lives are entirely in our control. To arrive at such a view, we equate goodness with our happiness (or well-being), then construe happiness negatively and in such a way that it demands nothing that is out of our control.

6.1 Two Negative Accounts of Happiness

Epicurus's brand of hedonism is quite suitable in this regard, and it is likely that its proponents consider negative, or pain avoiding, hedonism more attractive than the alternatives, including positive, or pleasure seeking hedonism, due to the superior way it facilitates the goal of invulnerability. Epicurus characterizes happiness as (a) subjective, (b) agent-relative, and (c) largely negative, in that it is understood in terms of what is absent (pain), rather than what is present. These three features help shield our happiness from aspects of the world that are not in our control and that can deprive us of any positive form of happiness, such as death and the suffering of others.

Rather than reducing it to the absence of suffering, we might instead equate happiness with the (again negative) condition of lacking thwarted desires (contrast the positive condition of having satisfied desires). These two ways of construing happiness are distinct yet closely related: Distinct since not all pain is due to thwarted desire (mashing one's thumb hurts no matter what we want), and not all desire thwartings are painful or even noticed (recall the example of the ignored will). But they are closely related since, as Gautama (and much later Epicurus) noted, the chief cause of suffering is thwarted desire: usually, we suffer from an event only when we wanted it not to happen.

6.2 Becoming Invulnerable Through Desire Adaptation

To convince ourselves that death cannot harm us, either of two strategies will serve (Luper 1987, 1996). First, we could adopt Epicurus's negative hedonism, and adjust our attitudes accordingly. Second, we could adopt the no-thwarted desires view of happiness, then thanatize our desires, in this sense: abandon all desires that death might thwart . Epicurus does not distinguish between the two approaches, yet they differ. Negative hedonism does encourage us to pare back our desires, but only so as to avoid the painful experiences associated with their being frustrated or to avoid other painful consequences of having them. In particular, it allows us to retain a desire so long as we cannot experience the events by which it might be thwarted, and so long as retaining it is not painful for other reasons. It does not prompt us to drop a desire simply because death might thwart it, since death thwarts desires in ways we cannot experience. Suffering is caused neither by death nor by the thwarting of any desires for which death is responsible. Thanatizing, by contrast, eliminates desires death might thwart. However, it allows us to retain some desires that are discouraged by negative hedonism. Consider, for example, my desire that the moon orbit the earth after I am dead: whether this desire is satisfied is not affected by my being alive or by anything I might do while alive. In this sense it is independent. Thanatizing leaves independent desires in place, yet some of them are discouraged by negative hedonism. The moon's (not) orbiting the earth after I am dead can have no causal impact on me, and hence must be a matter of indifference to me if I am a negative hedonist.

Negative hedonism and thanatizing insulate us from the view that death is harmful to us. However, both strategies leave us vulnerable to harm of other sorts. Both leave us free to make all sorts of plans, only to suffer our plans' failure. To properly assess whether it is advisable to adjust our attitudes so as to fend off the harm of death, it is useful to examine the more general project of developing invulnerability to all harms whatsoever. How might this more extensive adjustment go?

It is accomplished in two steps. First, we equate goodness with happiness, and adopt the no-thwarted desires view of happiness. Second, we eschew all except those desires we can surely satisfy. We might pursue the (autarchist) strategy of allowing ourselves only desires that we can satisfy by our own power. We might limit ourselves to the (conformist) attitude that whatever happens (or whatever happens by necessity) is what we want to happen. More extreme yet, we might adopt the (nihilist) approach of wanting nothing at all. Autarchy, conformism and nihilism stop any event from impairing our happiness. Along the way, they insulate us from the threat of death, by eliminating the desire not to die, as well as any desire whose satisfaction requires our being alive.

Unfortunately, all the strategies we have canvassed have a drawback: they leave us with an impoverished conception of happiness, of what matters. After applying these strategies, our happiness is little more than the absence of unhappiness. For example, Epicurean negative hedonists must say that nothing that happens after they die matters; in particular, they will be indifferent to the suffering of their children -- so long as it will occur after they (the parents) are dead. They are incapable of true love and friendship since these commit us to the judgment that the well-being of another matters for its own sake, while the negative hedonist thinks only one thing matters for its own sake: pain avoidance. (Admittedly, Epicurus claims that friendship is good, but he cannot have it both ways: negative hedonism rules out loving relationships of all sorts.) Arguably, similar remarks apply to people who thanatize their desires (but see Rosenbaum 1989). A thanatized parent cannot sustain real concern for the well-being of her children through independent desires, since such desires leave her indifferent to her children while there is anything that she can do to help her children. At best they can take the attitude, let my children do well so long as I cannot possibly do anything about them, which is so bizarre as to be psychologically impossible, and which falls far short of genuine concern, not to say love, since the latter guarantees the attitude, let my children do well even if I cannot possibly help them. Autarchics, conformists and nihilists are even more callous: they shrug off the suffering of their children (and everyone else) no matter when it occurs.

Moreover, in avoiding all desires that would leave them vulnerable to death, thanatics, autarchics, conformists and nihilists must give up the view that life is worth living, as well as the projects and concerns that constitute grounds for thinking that life is good, assuming that, in rational beings, the judgment that life is worthwhile prompts the desire to live, which could be thwarted at any time. Any reason to (want to) live is an excellent reason to want not to die; to avoid the latter, we must avoid the former.

However, the core idea of adapting our desires and requirements for happiness is useful, if not taken to an extreme. For what deprives us of happiness is a misfortune. Hence it is imprudent to let our happiness hinge on demands we cannot possibly meet, and better to reshape our most fundamental ideals so that they are manageable. In particular, it is prudent to take the view that we can be happy, or content, with a normal lifespan, which falls far short of immortality. $$This is not to say we should be indifferent about goals we shall never achieve, however. Most of us would be glad to live endlessly under favorable circumstances. But our attitude here should be that attaining immortality moves us well beyond mere happiness, and that being limited to a normal lifespan is not a misfortune.

Bibliography

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Epicurus | identity

Copyright © 2002 by
Steven Luper
sluper@trinity.edu

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First published: May 21, 2002
Content last modified: May 21, 2002