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Cosmology and Theology

Reasoning known as the cosmological argument (Burrill 1967; Craig 1979, 1980; Hepburn 1967) tries to justify belief in God by pointing to the existence of the cosmos, its causal orderliness, and alleged evidence of its being in some sense designed to include life and intelligence. [Often the appeal to such evidence is instead called the argument from design, or the teleological argument.] Some cosmologists believe, however, that the existence and order of the cosmos can be accounted for scientifically. Its life-permitting character might itself, they consider, be explained through its being divided into multiple domains worth the name of "universes". These could vary randomly in their features, ours being one of the perhaps very rare ones in which life had any chance of evolving. As the anthropic principle reminds us, only the life-permitting universes could give rise to observers. They should hesitate before concluding that an omnipotent, omniscient, all-creating person had made their surroundings life-permitting.

Philosophers, too, have doubted that so remarkable a person would be needed to explain such affairs, or that this person's own existence could be any less in need of explanation. They may here conceive God in a way not everybody would accept, interactions between cosmology and theology often depending on which picture of God is preferred. Such interactions include discussions of the nature of time and of the human mind, and of whether intelligent life is widespread in the cosmos.

Why is there a Cosmos?

People disagree over whether the sheer existence of the cosmos could call for explanation. Some have held that it always would, no matter how long the cosmos had existed; others that it never would; and still others that this would depend on whether the cosmos had existed eternally, or else on the nature of time.

It is nowadays usually believed that our universe came out of a Big Bang, a violent explosion occurring perhaps fifteen billion years ago. Thinking that the Bang could be explained only by God, the atheistic Hoyle (1950) preferred a universe existing eternally in a Steady State: it expanded, but new hydrogen atoms constantly materialized to keep the average cosmic density the same. Although at first offering no explanation for the new atoms, he thought them much less of a difficulty than the materialization of everything at once. Among theists, Pius XII (1952) then agreed that a Bang could indeed be counted as specially strong evidence of God's creative activity, yet many theologians protested that this activity should not be particularly associated with any first moment of a universe's existence. Tables, for instance, would vanish immediately if God failed to "conserve" their existence through exercise of his creative power.

When Hawking (1987, 1988) suggested that his own cosmology left "no place for a creator" since it made "What happened before the Bang, to cause it?" comparable to "What's Earth like to the north of the North Pole?", the theologians renewed their protests. They accompanied them with quotations from Saint Augustine, who had written that God created time and the world together. It is a theological commonplace, though, that God could be described as "creator" even of an eternally existing world. Both in theology and in philosophy, talk of creation or causation does not necessarily assume the temporal priority of creative or causal agencies. Descartes emphasized that in calling God "the cause of himself" he meant only that God's eternal existence was guaranteed by God's nature.

G.Gamow and W.B.Bonnor (both reprinted in Leslie ed. 1990) had meanwhile joined Hoyle in his eagerness to avoid a cosmic beginning. Gamow's article of 1954 favoured a universe which had contracted for infinitely long before rebounding in a Big Bang, whereas Bonnor's of 1960 proposed infinitely many oscillations, the rebounds always occurring before the cosmic material reached infinite densities, which Bonnor called "signs of error". In contrast, Milne (1952) welcomed the Bang as evidence of God's hand. He maintained, too, that the universe at the time of its creation had to be point-like and therefore infinitely dense. Creation of a spatially extended universe was a logical impossibility.

This last contribution to the debate was an outright blunder, there being no contradiction in the idea of creating something extended. Other contributions are harder to evaluate, for intuitions about what should be viewed as a universe's "natural state" -- where this means something not calling for explanation by a divine person or any other external factor -- can be defended or attacked only very controversially. Grünbaum (1990, and in Leslie ed. 1990) thinks it perverse to imagine that tables or the entire universe would disappear if God did nothing to prevent this; in his firm opinion, to discover what happens naturally we must look to see what actually occurs; while Hume (1739) holds that no cause would be needed even for the abrupt entry of a universe into a time which had previously been flowing. Yet one main message which many find in Hume's writings is that we can never learn anything from experience unless helped by various unprovable basic principles: for instance, that the future is likely to resemble the past. Now, one such basic principle might be the need to deny that anything -- let alone an entire universe -- could come to exist for no reason whatever. True enough, quantum theory is often thought to tell us that the universe is indeterministic in some absolute way, but not even this would be a clear declaration that its existence could be utterly reasonless. Again, people can accept quantum laws without thinking that their operation is "natural" in the technical sense of not being a product of God's will.

If we saw a problem in a universe's existence, could it be removed by taking that universe to have existed for infinite past time? Some argue that this would allow its presence at any one instant to be explained by its presence at earlier instants; yet would they then say the same about, e.g., the notion that a particular book had existed eternally? Presumably not. Those Moslems who think the Koran eternal typically consider its existence due to an eternal divine decree. "It exists because it always has done" is not what they think. Moreover, there might be some force in the Kalam Cosmological Argument (Craig 1979) which opposes the world's eternity on the grounds that no infinite series of years could have been traversed to reach the present day. [A complicating factor is that whether the Big Bang's earliest, hottest stages were of finite or infinite duration might depend on one's choice of clock. What if infinitely many events occurred during those stages? The clocks most appropriate to timing the events might then show the stages as taking infinitely long to unfold. As measured by ours, such clocks would tick ever more slowly as the universe cooled.]

A better approach could be that of the quantum cosmologists, Vilenkin (1982) and Hawking (1987) for example, who speculate that quantum theory can give probabilities for worlds of certain kinds to exist. Many recent cosmological models have been inspired by E.P.Tryon's idea of 1973 (Leslie ed. 1990) that even very large universes could begin their existence by taking advantage of quantum indeterminism. Each universe would "cost" little or nothing since the energy tied up in all its particles could be cancelled by their gravitational potential energy, which is standardly treated as negative energy. They could therefore be akin to the quantum fluctuations in which individual particles such as electrons exist fleetingly by "borrowing" energies too small to upset quantum theory's rather disorderly balance sheets. It is at present unclear whether this could make sense except against the background of an already existing space, or at least a "space-time foam" lacking clear distinctions between space and time (see Atkins 1992; Craig and Smith 1993; Halliwell 1992; Russell, Murphy and Isham eds. 1996). A common verdict, though, is that even if no such background were needed, there could still be a problem of why quantum laws applied.

Causal Orderliness

Some read Kant as arguing that various principles which we apply to the world, for instance when we view it as causally ordered throughout, are valid only as giving insight into how we necessarily see things. Could this mean that the world was not itself ordered causally, the situation instead being that our unconscious minds were super-geniuses regulating everything we fancied we saw, to ensure that it all obeyed the laws of nature (quantum electrodynamics, general relativity, or whatever)? This would be bizarre, which leads many of Kant's admirers to suspect that he intended something more subtle. Admittedly the laws which people tend to regard as inviolable may some day break down; that is a possibility which cosmologists find easy to defend, familiar as they are with the idea of cosmic "phase transitions" comparable to the change from ice to water and then to steam; but none the less, it remains obvious that the world up to the present moment has had considerable causal orderliness. Now, is this something that calls for explanation?

In the mid twentieth century a widespread opinion was that explaining any one causal law, for instance that heated water changes to steam, could proceed only by appeal to some more basic causal law such as that faster-moving molecules find it easier to break free from one another. The very most basic laws could not possibly be explained, therefore. They would concern mere regularities: as a matter of brute fact, events of one kind would always (or very often) be succeeded by events of some other kind. Discussing the idea that various individuals can know hidden cards by "extra-sensory perception", A.J.Ayer (1970) writes that the only thing which would be remarkable here would be someone's being "consistently rather better at guessing cards than the ordinary run of people"; the fact of doing "better than chance" would prove "nothing at all". If everybody just did know all about playing cards without looking at them, then there would be no mystery in this.

Recently, many philosophers have found such an approach dissatisfying. It is usually ascribed to Hume (1739), yet Hume suggests that causation's patterns would have characterized various events which did not actually occur. As a matter of causal necessity, a window (for example) would have broken had a brick been thrown at it, or would have remained intact had a mere peanut been thrown. This is often thought obviously right, the problem then being how causal patterns could have a necessity which was not just a matter of what always in fact occurred.

Might physics and cosmology throw light on any such problem? Quantum theory suggests to many people that we should think in terms of propensities, tendencies, rather than of absolutely firm necessities (a brick might "quantum-tunnel" across a window without smashing it, but this would be exceedingly unlikely) and that the Big Bang grew from a "quantum foam" in which causation as ordinarily conceived could not have acted since there was no firm direction of time. But all this leaves the fundamental issue largely untouched. Why does our world ever obey anything worth the name of a physical law? Or, to express the point differently (Wigner 1960), why "the unreasonable effectiveness of mathematics in the natural sciences"? Why does our world have the kind of elegance which made Jeans (1930) talk of a mathematically minded creator? While no logically possible world could violate mathematical principles, it is easy enough to imagine worlds in which they had little application.

When authors present a divine person or divine creative principle as responsible for the world's existence, they sometimes view causal orderliness as a matter directly attributable to this person or principle (Swinburne 1968 and 1979; Leslie 1979). Whitehead proposed instead (1938) that all things in nature in some sense strive to achieve aims, even atomic particles enjoying some very low level of awareness -- a theme echoed by the physicist D.Bohm (Bohm and Hiley 1993, chapter 15).

Note that the alleged problem of why there are causal laws is rather different from the alleged problem of why anything ever moves or changes, which is what led Aristotle to propose a divine prime mover.

Design and Fine Tuning

Living organisms provide seemingly overwhelming evidence of divine design, their parts forming immensely complicated mechanisms which permit them to survive and to reproduce themselves. To say "That's how they just happen to be" would be silly, although Philo in Hume's Dialogues(1779), sometimes thought to speak for Hume himself, may at times be guilty of saying it. Had Darwin said it, then he would never have discovered his famous way of undermining the seemingly overwhelming evidence: his theory of evolution, that is to say. Darwin's theory is now known to be right, so supporters of design seek their evidence elsewhere. They point to how the world's laws combine to make Darwinian evolution possible (Henderson 1913 supplies an early example of this). Why, they ask, is there a friendly environment in which extremely complex living machinery could appear after long ages, through selective inheritance of more and more complicated genes?

They can here direct our attention not just to the general fact of causal orderliness as discussed above but also (Leslie 1989, chapter 3) to the fortunate effects of particular causal principles. Consider, for instance, the principles met with in quantum theory. As well as allowing apparently dissipated wave-energy to concentrate itself so that it can do useful work, quantum laws ensure that atoms come in standardized types, making the genetic code possible. Similar things can next be said of the laws of special relativity, and of various laws controlling elementary particles.

However, much more attention has been directed towards the apparent "fine tuning" of fundamental cosmic parameters: the strengths of physical forces, the masses of elementary particles, the expansion speed and degree of turbulence at early moments in the Big Bang, and so forth (Barrow and Tipler 1986; Davies 1982; Ellis 1993; Leslie 1989, chapter 2; Leslie ed. 1990; Polkinghorne 1986; Rolston 1987). For example, it appears that electromagnetism, gravity, and the two main forces which control the atomic nucleus, had all of them to have strengths which fell inside very narrow limits if there were to be any stars of the long-living, steadily burning sort: the sort which encourage life to evolve. Again, life's complex chemistry appears possible only thanks to very precise adjustment of the masses of the neutron, the proton and the electron.

For there to be life of any readily imaginable kind, anything up to several dozen factors can appear to have needed fine tuning. Because the number of factors to be listed seems so large, this supposed evidence of design can survive many doubts about what exactly should be on the list. Take the case of the early cosmic expansion speed. It is often held that cosmic inflation, a brief burst of tremendously rapid expansion occurring early in the Bang, resulted in a universe whose subsequent more leisurely expansion was in no need of tuning. Yes, the expansion speed after inflation had to fall inside very narrow limits for stars to be able to form but, it is often said, inflation more or less forced the speed to fall inside those limits. To this we might reply that inflation itself stood in need of very delicate tuning, yet we could instead simply drop the expansion speed from the list, pointing out that plenty of other items remained on it. [We could find the list impressive without claiming knowledge of all logically possible universes, most of them presumably with properties very distant from those of our universe, and of what proportion of these possible universes were life-permitting. Imagine that a bullet hits a fly surrounded by a large empty area. The bullet's trajectory needed fine tuning to achieve this result, which can help to show that a marksman was at work. It can help to show it regardless of whether distant areas are all of them so covered with flies that any bullet striking them would hit one. The crucial point is that the local area contained just the one fly.]

It is sometimes held that we could avoid belief in fine tuning by believing instead in various exotic life-forms (Feinberg and Shapiro 1980). Rather than being based on chemistry (which means, in effect, on electromagnetism), intelligent organisms might be based on the strong nuclear force so that they could inhabit neutron stars. Alternatively, they might be plasma beings inside the sun, or complex patterns in frozen hydrogen, or intricately organised interstellar gas clouds. None of these intelligent life-forms would dream of arguing that chemistry, something possible only through fine tuning, was necessary to intelligent life. Yet people willing to believe in such strange life-forms could still say that much tuning was required for there to be neutron stars, suns, planets covered with frozen hydrogen or interstellar clouds. It is often reasoned (see Rozental 1988 in particular) that a universe taken at random from among the apparent physical possibilities would almost certainly lack such objects. It would be likely either to collapse in a Big Crunch after a very brief, intensely hot career, or else to expand so fast that any matter which it contained soon became too rarefied to form clouds, let alone stars and planets. It could well consist almost entirely of light rays or black holes.

Various other doubts about fine tuning and the need to explain it are fairly easily dismissed. For instance, it seems wrong to reason (i) that no possible evidence of design could have any force because we can see only the one universe, and therefore cannot know whether its patterns are at all extraordinary, or (ii) that all possible patterns would be equally probable, just like all possible hands of cards, or (iii) that probabilities depend on repetitions being possible whereas the universe is unrepeatable: a universe can occur only once. Such reasoning delivers the strange conclusion that not even the words "God designed all this", written on every rabbit, tree and snowflake, could be in special need of explanation. It forgets such facts as that a hand of cards which includes four queens, four kings and four aces can, thanks to the possibility of cheating, be considerably more probable than many others. And the claim "that a universe can occur only once" itself runs into trouble: see the next section, "Multiple Universes".

Again, it would surely be wrong to protest that fine tuning needs no explanation "since if the universe hadn't been tuned in appropriate ways, then there'd not have been anybody to consider the affair". What would you think of the man who, untouched by all the bullets of a fifty-marksman firing squad, failed to suspect that the marksmen had wanted to miss him, commenting instead "that he'd otherwise not be alive to discuss anything"?

A divine designer's influence might be limited to creating a universe with life-permitting laws and fine-tuned force strengths, particle masses, etcetera. Some (e.g., Ward 1996b) argue, however, that God could be expected to influence the course taken by Darwinian evolution, ensuring that various crucial events occurred in favourable ways. [Assuming that quantum physics makes the reign of natural law into something only probabilistic, not deterministic, then there is actually some difficulty in deciding whether God, by ensuring that such and such an event occurred in the most favourable of various ways which quantum physics allowed, would be "intervening miraculously".] Also, it is sometimes thought that God created a universe in which the evolution of intelligent, truly conscious minds, and the workings of those minds during free decision-making, are at least in part inexplicable by physical laws (Swinburne 1986).

Multiple Universes

If by "universe" you mean Absolutely Everything, then there must be just a single universe. However, people often picture the cosmos as containing numerous huge domains, very varied in their characters and largely or entirely isolated from one another. Now, "universes" is what they typically call them nowadays. Understood in this way, universes can be used to explain any observed fine tuning without introducing a divine designer. While most universes could well be hostile to intelligent life, observers would clearly have to find themselves in the life-permitting ones.

Numerous universe-generating mechanisms have been proposed (Atkins 1992; Barrow and Tipler 1986; Barrow 1988; Halliwell 1992; Leslie 1989; Leslie ed. 1990; Linde 1990; Rees 1997; Rozental 1988; Smolin 1997). Universes could be successive cycles of an oscillating cosmos (Big Bang, Big Crunch, Big Bang, etcetera). They could be huge areas of a gigantic, perhaps infinite cosmos. They could be the "worlds" of Many-Worlds Quantum Theory, which says that reality continually branches, every alternative allowed by quantum laws occurring in some branch or other. They could be quantum fluctuations in a pre-existing space or in a space-time foam. Or they might "quantum-tunnel from nothing" (if that makes sense), or bud off from other universes, or form bubbles in which expansion speeds had slowed inside a cosmos which was perpetually inflating. They could even be born in the depths of black holes, then expanding into spaces of their own without disturbing their parent universes.

All this could help an opponent of divine design only if the universes differed widely so that sooner or later, somewhere, one or several of them might be expected to be fine tuned in life-permitting ways. Difference-generating mechanisms are easily invented, however. An early suggestion was that an oscillating cosmos would "forget" its properties in the quantum-fuzzy depths of its Big Crunches. Among many later suggestions, perhaps the most plausible is that tiny domains form in the cosmos like ice crystals on a pond, each domain then being enormously enlarged (to "universe size") by cosmic inflation so that living beings deep inside it cannot see the other domains. Wide differences between the domains can readily be attributed to scalar fields. Having no directionality such as makes a magnetic field obvious to a compass needle, scalar fields are hard to detect, yet it is now standardly considered that such fields tore apart the initially unified forces of nature (electromagnetism and the nuclear forces, for instance) and gave them their various strengths, also causing various types of particle to become massive to differing degrees. Appearing early in the Big Bang, the scalar fields could have differed randomly from place to place because different field intensities were more or less equal in their potential energies (which are what physical systems try to minimize, like balls rolling down into valleys).

Belief in multiple domains, alias universes, and in the likelihood that they differ widely, is nowadays extremely common among cosmologists. It is considered quaint to assume that all of reality must be like the region visible to human telescopes. This would have pleased Hume's Philo, who cautioned us against any such assumption (Hume 1779). A reality consisting of infinitely many, very varied universes may actually be thought simpler than the alternatives. Why, after all, should a universe-generating mechanism operate only a limited number of times? And if it operated again and again, why should it produce identical results on each occasion?

This does not mean that belief in divine design must be abandoned. While the manner in which our universe appears "fine tuned for permitting life to evolve" could encourage a story about many widely differing universes, it could equally well support belief in a designer. The fact remains, though, that the designer does not supply the sole plausible explanation for any fine tuning. This is largely because universes, like ice crystals, could differ widely while remaining identical in the fundamental laws they obeyed.

The Anthropic Principle

In the early 1970s, Brandon Carter stated what he called "the anthropic principle": that what we can expect to observe "must be restricted by the conditions necessary for our presence as observers" (Leslie ed. 1990). Carter's word "anthropic" was intended as applying to intelligent beings in general. The "weak" version of his principle covered the spatiotemporal districts in which observers found themselves, while its "strong" version covered their universes, but the distinction between spatiotemporal districts and universes, and hence between the weak principle and the strong, could not always be made firmly: one writer's "universe" could sometimes be another's "gigantic district". Moreover, the necessity involved was never -- not even in the case of the "strong anthropic principle" -- a matter of saying that some factor, for instance God, had made our universe utterly fated to be intelligent-life-permitting, let alone intelligent-life-containing. However, all these points have often been misunderstood and, at least when it comes to stating what words mean, errors regularly repeated can cease to be errors. Has Carter therefore lost all right to determine what "anthropic principle" and "strong anthropic principle" really mean? No, he has not, for his suggestion that observership's prerequisites might set up observational selection effects is of such importance. Remember, it could throw light on any observed fine tuning without introducing God. Everything is thrust into confusion when people say that belief in God "is supported by the anthropic principle", meaning simply that they believe in fine tuning and think God can explain it. As enunciated by Carter, the anthropic principle does not so much as mention fine tuning.

Being aware of possible "anthropic" observational selection effects can encourage one set of expectations, and belief in God another set. If suspecting that Carter's anthropic principle has practical importance, you will be readier to believe (i) that there exist multiple universes and (ii) that their characteristics have been settled randomly, some mechanism such as cosmic inflation ensuring that all was settled in the same fashion throughout the region visible to our telescopes. True, the believer in God can accept these things too, yet he or she may feel far less pressure to accept them. Even if there existed only a single universe, God could have fine tuned it in ways that encouraged intelligent life to evolve.

A possible argument for preferring the God hypothesis runs as follows. A physical force strength or elementary particle mass can often seem to have required tuning to such and such a numerical value, plus or minus very little, for several different reasons. Random variations from universe to universe might explain why it took any particular value somewhere or other, yet how could they account for the fact that one and the same value satisfied many different requirements? Why is such consistency possible? Why does electromagnetism, for example, not need to have one strength to allow atoms to be stable, and another strength for stars to burn at a life-encouraging rate, and yet another to permit carbon (quite probably crucial to life) to be produced plentifully? Here a religiously minded physicist could think in terms of many possible fundamental theories, God selecting a theory which permitted life's requirements to be fulfilled without contradictions.


It is sometimes protested that God cannot adequately explain the existence and orderliness of the cosmos, for the following reason: that God's own existence, and the orderliness which would have to characterize his mind before he could bring order to anything else, would in turn need explanation. How might theists reply?

It might seem that an infinitely knowledgeable divine mind would be infinitely harder to explain than any finite cosmos or than one which, while infinite in both time and space, was still limited in, for example, the number of its dimensions -- whereas the divine mind would know every possible universe, including those with a million billion dimensions. Again, such a mind might be thought to go infinitely far beyond any evidence we could collect. [If you saw a pound of butter rising on a balance pan, would you conclude that it was being outweighed by an infinitely heavy weight?] It can be replied, however, that an all-knowing mind would be in a way extremely simple, as can be seen by how a single word -- "everything" -- can describe what it knows; and such an all-knowing mind, it could next be said, might well be expected to create a complex cosmos for the sake of all the living beings in it. But while the combination of the cosmos and a divine creator might be considered simple for reasons such as these, there remains the difficulty that a complete and utter blank could well be thought simpler still. Note that the "ontological argument" which tries to prove God's existence from his mere notion is generally dismissed today. There would seem to be no contradiction in the idea that a perfect being was a logical possibility only, not an actual existent.

On the other hand, logical possibilities can be real without being actual existents, and once this is appreciated their reality can be seen to be guaranteed. If God or anything else is a logical possibility, then that is an unconditional fact. It is eternally the case, non-fictitious, genuine, real, that this or that is indeed a logical possibility. [How odd it would be to fancy that thinkers, for instance, could become really logically possible only after they had come into existence and developed logics! Before thinkers evolved, the sun which helped them to evolve was logically possible, surely. It was not like a round square, and nor were the thinkers.] Furthermore, some logical possibilities are such that their failure to be actualized -- their absence from the realm of actually existing things -- can be thought needed, ethically required, in an eternal and unconditional way. Take the case of a logically possible world consisting solely of people in torment. To declare that the actual existence of such a world would be evil is the same as calling its non-existence needed or ethically required, and it could seem utterly wrong to add "just so long as there exists somebody who is contemplating the affair, somebody with a moral duty to prevent the existence of such a world". Likewise, to say that a world full of interest and happiness would be a good thing is to say that the existence of such a world is ethically required, and would (presumably) be so regardless of whether anyone ever contemplated that fact. Might we point to these matters when trying to account for the existence of God or of the cosmos?

Certainly, the concept of an ethical requirement is distinct from that of a requirement which is fulfilled; yet cannot a flower be red, despite how the concept of redness differs from that of being a flower? Flowers are "the right sort of reality" for being red. They are "in the right ball park". The idea of a red flower is not conceptually confused. And rather similarly, it can be argued, a requirement for the existence of something, for instance a divine mind, might be the right sort of reality to carry responsibility for this something's actual existence, even if it were an ethical requirement. There is no conceptual confusion here. So long as it was recognized that no logical necessity was involved, it could actually be suspected that some ethical requirement (or consistent set of requirements) carried such responsibility necessarily. Compare, perhaps, the necessity that red as we experience it (say, in an after-image produced by a bright light) is nearer to purple than to blue. This can be argued to be an absolute necessity, without being a logical necessity. Again, it can be argued that various states of mind are necessarily in themselves worth having, without this being logically demonstrable.

An ethical requirement is, at any rate, what Ewing (1973, chapter 7) proposes as the ground of a divine person's reality. As a matter of necessity -- necessity which is absolute despite not being provable by logicians -- the unconditionally real ethical need for a divine mind to exist is adequate, Ewing suggests, to ensure its eternal existence. And a very similar theme is central to the long neoplatonic tradition in theology. This treats "God" as the name not of any mind, but of the supposed fact that the world owes its existence to its ethical requiredness (Leslie 1979, 1989 chapter 8; Mackie 1982, chapter 13; Levine ed. 1997; Tillich 1953-63).

Ewing's picture may at times be hard to separate from that of the neoplatonists. For suppose we joined the pantheist Spinoza in thinking (to take an interpretation of his writings which can seem to make sense of them) that all the complexities of the cosmos are simply the complex thoughts of a divine mind, so that your consciousness and mine, or the consciousness of a bird or of a bat, is just the divine knowledge of what it is like -- exactly what it feels like -- to be particular living beings with strictly limited power and knowledge. Suppose we also adopted the belief (which can again be the suggested by Spinoza's writings) that the divine mind exists because this is ethically required, rather than through any logical necessity which has nothing to do with good or bad. There might then be no real difference, so far as concerned the situation in which we believed, between our declaring (a) that God was a divine mind, as Ewing thought, or (b) that God was the cosmos, as Spinoza thought, or (c) that, as neoplatonists think, God is a creative force or principle: the principle that a supreme ethical requirement (or consistent set of requirements) is responsible for the existence of the cosmos.

Sure enough, this disregards distinctions which have appeared important to many people. For many variants on pantheism and on neoplatonism, consult Forrest (1996), Laird (1940), Levine (1994) and Whitehead (1938). Sometimes Spinoza's eternal and all-knowing divine mind is replaced by one which constantly improves its power and its knowledge. Sometimes God is thought to some degree separate from the cosmos, instead of just being the cosmos or the creative ethical requiredness of the cosmos. Sometimes the notion that the natural world is alive, and that it strives after value, plays a greater role than the idea that value is actually achieved. Sometimes identification of the cosmos with God is oddly taken to imply the illusoriness of most of the things we think we see.

Time and the Human Mind

Believing (as Spinoza appears to) that we are all parts of a divine mind, we might think we could answer the theological problem of evil: the problem of why the cosmos contains so many items which can seem so very unsatisfactory. Knowing everything, or (if this is different) everything in the least worth knowing, a divine mind could know many things which might be very little worth knowing if they were taken in isolation. It might know, for example, not only all the detailed structure of innumerable universes, but also exactly how it would feel to be each of the intelligent living beings in those universes. Knowing this eternally, it could none the less know what it felt like to be engaged in actual struggles, in constant ignorance of what the next moment would bring: see Williams (1951) to gain further insight into the theory about time's flow which would be involved here, a theory often adopted because it appears to reflect Einstein's theory of relativity. While such items of knowledge might be nowhere near the best that it possessed, the divine consciousness could still be better for not being ignorant of them.

A competing approach to the problem of evil is often preferred, though. Instead of viewing themselves as elements of a divine mind, many religious people think they exist separately from that mind and are given absolutely free choice of whether to join it in a heavenly hereafter.

Absolutely free choice, as they conceive it, depends on time's flowing in a way which Einstein rejected when he wrote of the world as having "a four-dimensional existence". [Suppose that you are about to choose "with absolute freedom" whether to give up smoking. It cannot already be true, they say, that "at points a little further along the fourth dimension" you are lighting a cigarette.] It probably also demands a fairly strong division between the operations of human minds and those of material objects.


Belief in God need not involve believing that our universe is crammed with intelligent life from side to side and from start to finish, or that God will save humans from driving themselves to extinction through polluting their planet or by germ warfare, or perhaps (Rees 1997, chapter 12) by experiments at extremely high energies. The fraction of our universe which we can see contains many hundred million trillion sun-like stars. Even if only a small proportion of these had hospitable planets, intelligent beings could well exist in tremendously many places. What is more, the universe as a whole might be very much larger, perhaps infinitely larger, and there may be up to infinitely many other universes. Wishing for intelligent beings to exist in large numbers, a divine person could have them without ensuring that humans survived long enough to colonize their entire galaxy.

We have failed to detect extraterrestrials, although calculations suggest that an intelligent species could spread across its galaxy in a few million years. This, together with our observed position in the midst of a population explosion, might reinforce whatever other grounds we had for thinking that rapid extinction, not galactic colonization, was the likely fate of an intelligent species. Suppose human extinction occurred during the next century. Roughly ten per cent of all humans who had ever been born would be alive when it occurred. On the other hand, if humans spread right across their galaxy then perhaps well under a thousandth of one per cent would have lived during that period. This may be found disturbing. [The point is that one ought to hesitate before adopting theories whose truth would have made one's own observations highly unlikely, when other theories would have made them fairly likely. It is a point first noted by Brandon Carter; for a discussion drawing very pessimistic conclusions from it, see Gott (1993). Various reasons in favour of guarded optimism are given by Leslie (1996), reasons centred on the fact that our universe is probably indeterministic, so that the number of humans who will ever have lived is something which has not yet been fixed.]

For religious people asking whether humans will soon be extinct, here is a point to bear in mind. If you hope to solve the theological problem of evil, then you have to assume that there are strong reasons against divine intervention to prevent calamities.


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causation: in science | consciousness | cosmological argument | Descartes, René | determinism: causal | Einstein, Albert: philosophy of science | evil, problem of | existence | free will | God | Hume, David | infinity | Kant, Immanuel | laws of nature | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | materialism | metaphysics | mind: philosophy of | modality, metaphysics of | monism | natural religion | Newton, Isaac: views on space, time, and motion | panpsychism | pantheism | physicalism | Platonism: in metaphysics | possible worlds | principle of sufficient reason | quantum mechanics | rationalism vs. empiricism | religion: philosophy of | science, philosophy of | space and time: being and becoming in modern physics | Spinoza, Baruch [Benedict] | theism | time | truth: necessary vs. contingent | Whitehead, Alfred North

Copyright © 1998 by
John Leslie

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First published: July 2, 1998
Content last modified: July 2, 1998