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Contemporary Approaches to the Social Contract

The idea of the social contract goes back, in a recognizably modern form, to Thomas Hobbes, but is most notably embodied, in our times, in the work of John Rawls. The basic idea is a simple one. What makes some particular system of collectively enforced social arrangements legitimate is that it is the object of an agreement for the people who are subject to it. (As in the case of public justification, the key phrase, ‘the object of an agreement’, is multiply ambiguous.) In the case of a literal contract--say for an exchange of goods--each of the parties has reason to honor the terms of the contract either in the (bare) fact of having agreed to its terms (under certain circumstances) or in the fact of its terms being agreeable ones. Similarly, in the case of a social contract in the manner of Hobbes or Rawls, each of the parties has reason to honor h/er responsibilities under the terms of the contract--e.g. to pay taxes, conform to laws, participate in decision-making, etc.--either on account of h/er agreement to do so, or, perhaps, on account of its being reasonable that s/he do so. (These are what Michael Lessnoff calls the voluntaristic and rationalistic readings of the contract.) In its modern guises, contractarianism is not intended as an account of the historical origins of current social arrangements, but, instead, as an answer to, or framework for answering, questions about legitimacy and political obligation. Important issues associated with contractarianism include the binding force of hypothetical agreements, the reduction (or not) of ethico-political to instrumental reasoning, and the compatibility of contractarianism with fairness and liberty.

Hypothetical Contracts?

Contemporary contractarianism is, characteristically, doubly hypothetical. Certainly, no prominent theorist thinks that questions of legitimacy and obligation are settled by an actual survey of attitudes towards existing social arrangements, and are not settled until such a survey has been carried out. The question, then, is NOT "Are these arrangements the object of an actual agreement amongst ‘stakeholders’?" (If this were the question, the answer would typically be "No".) The question, rather, is "Would these arrangements be the object of an agreement if ‘stakeholders’ were surveyed?" Although both of the questions are, in some sense, susceptible to an empirical ‘reading’, only the latter is in play in present-day theorizing. The contract nowadays is always hypothetical in at least this first sense.

There is a reading of the (first-order) hypothetical question "Would the arrangements be the object of agreement if___" which, as indicated, is still resolutely empirical in some sense. This is the reading where what's required of the theorist is that s/he try to determine what an actual survey of actual ‘stakeholders’ would reveal about their actual attitudes towards their system of social arrangements. (We don't really perform the survey, but we do perform it ‘in imagination’.) But there is another reading that is more widely accepted in the contemporary context. On this reading, the question, really, is no longer a hypothetical question about actual reactions; it is, rather, a hypothetical question about hypothetical reactions--it is, as I have said, doubly hypothetical. Framing the question is the first hypothetical element: "Would it be the object of agreement if they were surveyed?" Framed by this question is the second hypothetical element, one which involves the so-called ‘stakeholders’, who are no longer treated ‘empirically’, i.e. taken as given, but are, instead, themselves considered from a hypothetical point of view--as they would be if (typically) they were better informed or more impartial, etc. The question for most contemporary contractarians, then, is, roughly, this. "If we surveyed the ‘idealized surrogates’ of the actual ‘stakeholders’ in this polity, would current social arrangements be the object of an agreement for them?" A "Yes" answer confers legitimacy and imposes obligations; a "No" answer signals illegitimacy and relieves us of or shows the purely ‘historical’ status of obligations that we might now submit to.

Of course, questions arise--and have been raised most notably by Ronald Dworkin--about how a (doubly) hypothetical agreement can bind any actual person. The point of second-stage hypotheticalizing is, inter alia, that, as I actually am, I would not agree to be bound by some system of social arrangements S. Suppose that it could be shown, however, that my ‘surrogate’ (a better informed, more impartial version of me) would agree to be bound by S. What has that to do with me? Where this second-stage hypotheticalization is employed, it seems to be proposed that I can be bound by agreements that others, different from me, would have made. It is like saying that I ought to be bound to respect S on account of your having agreed to be bound by S. While it might (though it needn't) be reasonable to suppose that I can be bound by agreements that I would myself have entered into if given the opportunity, it is just crazy to think that I can be bound by agreements that, demonstrably, I wouldn't have made even if I had been asked.

Rawls's solution to this problem reflects the complexity of his original position argumentation and the idea of reflective equilibrium which it depends on. In effect, Rawls identifies two contracts, one framing the other. The ‘first’ contract is one that, as we actually are, each of us makes with the ‘surrogate’ who is to represent us in second-stage contractual reasoning. As I am, I agree that the question is NOT "Do I agree as I actually am to S?" but, instead, "Would I agree if I were ___ to S?", or, in other words, "Will I be bound by agreements that will be made in respect of S by my ‘idealized surrogate’ (or better self)?" Once I have answered "Yes" (of course hypothetically; there is no actual survey) to the first, framing question, I will be bound to the demands of S so long as my idealized surrogate--the subject of the second, framed (and still hypothetical) contractual question--says "Yes" to the system S of social arrangements. (This is what Rawls means when he characterizes the parties to the original position as ‘trustees’ for the interests of ‘you and me’.) Crudely, the reasoning runs as follows. I agree to be represented by X for certain purposes; X agrees that the system S is a legitimate one; hence I am bound by this system, for my ‘trustee’ has agreed to it on my behalf--this is one of the purposes for which s/he was to represent me. As Rawls says (A Theory of Justice, p.587): "Finally, we may remind ourselves that the hypothetical nature of the original position invites the question: why should we take any interest in it, moral or otherwise. Recall the answer: the conditions embodied in the description of this situation are ones that we do in fact accept."


Contemporary contractarians tend to be constructivists in the sense that they recognize no independent and determinate external standard of legitimacy that the contractual device is intended to approximate, but, rather, make the truth-maker for "S is legitimate" that S was the object of an agreement (for ‘stakeholders’ or their surrogates). Crudely, being agreed to makes a regime legitimate; it is not that being agreed to is evidence for legitimacy otherwise conceived.

Within this constructivist framework, there are two main schools of contractarian thinking, which reflect differences which were already apparent between Hobbes's approach and John Locke's.

On the one hand, we have those contractarians, such as David Gauthier and James Buchanan, who think that legitimacy of regimes is determined by their prudential acceptability from the diverse points of view that are represented in relevant communities. On this account, the basis for an individual's agreement, and hence for h/er judgment that the regime is a legitimate one is that enforcement of the regime's demands contributes to the realization of h/er aspirations. On this account, to say "S is legitimate" is to say, more or less, that S is good for its various members. This is a prudential account of legitimacy and, if we think that prudence is a more ‘basic’ idea than the ideas of ‘morality’, then this approach is reductionistic in the sense that it derives ethico-political notions like ‘legitimacy’ and ‘obligation’ from non-ethico-political notions such as acceptance-grounded-on-prudence. Insofar as there is some problem in understanding how genuinely ethico-political reasons can also function as motives (alleged to be a problem on cognitivist interpretations), such a reductionistic strategy may be appealing; there is alleged to be little trouble understanding how purely prudential reasons can serve as motives--though, of course, this is a common assumption, rather than a demonstrated conclusion.

On the other hand, some contractarians, most notably Rawls, already build ethico-political assumptions into their particular approach to hypotheticalization. The kinds of ‘surrogates’ which ‘you and I’ commission to act as our agents in reasoning about legitimacy are, on Rawls's account, already so situated that their deliberations will be framed by ethico-political considerations. (See the article "Original Position". The agents' deliberations are carried out in purely prudential terms, but they are subject to the ‘veil of ignorance’, which itself embodies important ethico-political notions.) Indeed, it can fairly be said that any approach to contractarian thinking that substitutes ‘impartial’ surrogates for concrete individuals is anti-reductionist in this way. (As Rawls himself points out, some broadly utilitarian approaches to legitimacy can be conceptualized as involving a hypothetical contract. The assumptions that John Harsanyi, for instance, makes in developing his version of the social contract make his approach an anti-reductionistic one.)


Bruce Ackerman has mounted a profound challenge to contractarian thinking. It works, crudely, on the idea that the premises of a course of contractarian reasoning can be manipulated so as to yield (more or less) any conclusion that the theorist has some antecedent interest in producing. The argument goes as follows. Each version of contractarianism must specify three features: (i) the chooser c, (ii) the situation of choice C, and (iii) the alternatives A from which a choice is made. If c chooses S from A in C, then this establishes the legitimacy of S only relative to the specification of chooser, situation, and choice-set, and hence could be overturned, absent further constraints on the situation, by alternative specifications. Most obviously, if the choice-set is arbitrarily confined to S and various alternatives that are chosen by the theorist for their utterly unacceptable character, then any selection of S from A is meaningless as a legitimator. (The trick could be worked as easily, though not as transparently perhaps, by restricting the characterization of c or of C.) Perhaps the solution to this problem is simply to lift all restrictions on C, A, and c, hence banishing all arbitrary elements. If all the alternatives are canvassed and if the chooser isn't biased for or against any of them, then, surely, the fact that h/er choice was S does indeed confer legitimacy. However, as Ackerman points out, this won't work either, for, with no limits on A, and with no biasing--and hence distinguishing--characteristics built into c, there can be no choice at all.

Ackerman only considers two possibilities: (i) that contractarian thinking is unrestricted--but, if so, utterly empty; (ii) that contractarian thinking is ‘rigged’--but, if so, utterly devoid of normative force. However, there may be a non-arbitrary, non-empty form of such reasoning. This, anyway, is what Rawls thinks. He certainly doesn't permit ‘unrestricted’ reasoning about legitimacy; his deliberators in the original position are (surrogate) maximizers of social primary goods, reasoning in accordance with certain ethico-politically significant constraints--a veil of ignorance embodying a concept of justice. On the other hand, although the course of reasoning does make concrete assumptions about choosers, choice-situations, and choice-sets, the assumptions it makes, or so Rawls claims, are ones that we share. So while they might be arbitrary sub specie aeternitatis, they are not arbitrary from the point of view of the concrete individuals on whose behalf they are made. As these individuals see it, these particular assumptions are ‘privileged’ at least in the sense that they represent current community attitudes about justice. A demonstration of legitimacy is relative to these assumptions, but, since they are the best the community can do, there is nothing untoward about this. (This raises, but does not solve, the problem of ‘ideology’--i.e. that the community's very notion of justice is already corrupted. Notice that, within a constructivist framework, this judgment can itself be made only from the point of view of another community's concept of justice--a concept that might itself also be ‘corrupted’.)

Robert Nozick also mounts a powerful challenge to contractarian thinking, at least of the kinds that Rawls represents. His argument proceeds in three stages. (1) Nozick distinguishes ‘end-state principles’ of social life from ‘historical principles’. An end-state principle says, in effect, that a situation S is legitimate only if it approximates a particular canonical state of affairs S*. An historical principle, on the other hand, says that any state is legitimate, whatever it might be substantively, so long as it has been reached from previous states by processes which are themselves legitimate. (2) Nozick notes that end-state judgments of legitimacy are very volatile in changing circumstances, and, hence, that ensuring continued legitimacy could, on this account, involve such arbitrarily large restrictions of liberty as to be unacceptable. (3) Nozick then notes that contractarian thinking, at least of the Rawlsian kind, delivers up end-state principles of legitimacy, and hence must be rejected--on account of point (2).

Nozick's argument is most vulnerable on point (2). It is true that Rawls's particular argument does yield an end-state principle in the form of the ‘difference principle’. And it certainly seems likely that continued legitimacy, by this standard, might require large impositions on individuals' liberties. But these considerations only establish that liberty and fairness may need to be traded off against one another in uncongenial ways, as Isaiah Berline had, of course, long ago pointed out; they do not establish a decisive objection to the contractarian approach.


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ethics: deontological | justification, political: public | liberalism | original position

Copyright © 1996, 1997 by
Fred D'Agostino

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First published: March 3, 1996
Content last modified: July 28, 1997