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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Constitutionalism


1. Unless otherwise indicated, the term "constitutional" (and its cognate terms "constitutionalism", "constitution", and so on) should henceforth be understood to carry this richer meaning.

2. Whether Locke and Hobbes are properly invoked in this way is perhaps open to question. There is reason to believe that Locke's argument defends political, as opposed to strictly legal, limitations upon the sovereign. But as we shall see, constitutionalism seems to require legal limitation. It might be argued that effective political limitation requires legal limitation as well, but this does not seem strictly necessary. More on this later.

3. "For to be subject to laws is to be subject to the commonwealth - that is to the sovereign - that is, to himself, which is not subjection but freedom from the laws." (Leviathan, Ch. 29, 255)

4. What Parliament does "no authority upon Earth can undo." (Sir William Blackstone)

5. See Hart, The Concept of Law, pp 73-78. For Austin, see The Province of Jurisprudence Determined, Lecture VI.

6. Leviathan, Part 1, Ch. 13. Although Hobbes's sovereign is constitutionally unlimited, Hobbes insisted that individuals retained the right to self-preservation. It would be incoherent, Hobbes thought, for individuals to give up that right the protection of which is the very reason people have for creating a sovereign power. Although individuals retain the right to self-preservation, it is also true that Hobbes' unlimited sovereign has the right to take anyone's life if, in the sovereign's judgment, this is necessary to preserve the well being of the commonwealth.

7. Constitutional conventions are explored in Sec. 6 below. Although entrenchment is an almost universal characteristic of modern constitutions, and although one could plausibly argue that it is practically desirable, it may not be absolutely necessary. Some constitutional norms are ordinary statutes amenable to introduction and change by ordinary legislative procedures. Indeed, some constitutions are almost wholly statutory, e.g. the 1848 Italian Constitution and the constitution of New Zealand.

8. See, e.g., J. Rubenfeld, "Legitimacy and Interpretation."

9. As quoted in John Chipman Gray, "A Realist Conception of Law," p. 12.

10. It is arguable that the people of the United Kingdom, in virtue of their membership in the European Community and the fact that British Courts now enforce, as binding, Community law, have in fact relinquished their unlimited sovereignty. If the law of member states (e.g. France, Denmark, and the UK) must now be consistent with Community law, and the latter is immune from legislative change or repeal through legislative acts on the part of member governments, then it can be argued that the sovereignty of the member states within the European Community has been replaced by the sovereignty of "the people of Europe."

11. Henceforth, and unless otherwise indicated, all uses of the word "constitution" (and cognate terms) should be understood as referring to constitutional law.

12. Hercules is first introduced by Dworkin in Ch. 4 of Taking Rights Seriously and reappears in subsequent writings, most notable, Law's Empire.

13. Critical theories come in a variety of forms, the most influential ones being the Critical Legal Studies movement and feminist jurisprudence.

14. "I no longer believe that constitutional theory constrains, or is supposed to constrain judges. serves primarily to provide a set of rhetorical devices that judges can deploy as they believe effective." (Mark Tushnet, "Constitutional Interpretation, Character and Experience, p. 759.)

15. See, e.g. Nadine Strossen, Defending Pornography.

Copyright © 2001 by
Wil Waluchow
McMaster University

First published: January 10, 2001
Content last modified: January 10, 2001