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Confucius (551-479 BCE), according to Chinese tradition, was a thinker, political figure, educator, and founder of the Ru School of Chinese thought. His teachings, preserved in the Analects, form the foundation of much of subsequent Chinese speculation on the education and comportment of the ideal man, how such an individual should live his live and interact with others, and the forms of society and government in which he should participate. Fung Yu-lan, one of the great 20th century authorities on the history of Chinese thought, compares Confucius' influence in Chinese history with that of Socrates in the West.
The sources for Confucius' life are later and do not carefully separate fiction and fact. Thus it is wise to regard much of what is known of him as legendary. Many of the legends surrounding Confucius at the end of the 2nd century BCE were included by the Han dynasty court historian, Sima Qian (145-c.85 BCE), in his well-known and often-quoted Records of the Grand Historian (Shiji). This collection of tales opens by identifying Confucius' ancestors as members of the Royal State of Song. It notes as well that his great grandfather, fleeing the turmoil in his native Song, had moved to Lu, somewhere near the present town of Qufu in southeastern Shandong, where the family became impoverished. Confucius is described, by Sima Qian and other sources, as having endured a poverty-stricken and humiliating youth and been forced, upon reaching manhood, to undertake such petty jobs as accounting and caring for livestock. Sima Qian's account includes the tale of how Confucius was born in answer to his parents' prayers at a sacred hill (qiu) called Ni. Confucius' surname Kong (which means literally an utterance of thankfulness when prayers have been answered), his tabooed given name Qiu, and his social name Zhongni, all appear connected to the miraculous circumstances of his birth. This casts doubt, then, on Confucius' royal genealogy as found in Sima Qian. Similarly, Confucius' recorded age at death, seventy-two, is a magic number with far-reaching significance in early Chinese literature. We do not know how Confucius himself was educated, but tradition has it that he studied ritual with the Daoist Master Lao Dan, music with Chang Hong, and the lute with Music-master Xiang. In his middle age Confucius is supposed to have gathered about him a group of disciples whom he taught and also to have devoted himself to political matters in Lu. The number of Confucius' disciples has been greatly exaggerated, with Sima Qian and other sources claiming that there were as many as three thousand of them. Sima Qian goes on to say that, Those who, in their own person, became conversant with the Six Disciplines [taught by Confucius], numbered seventy-two. The 4th century BCE Mencius and some other early works give their number as seventy. Perhaps seventy or seventy-two were a maximum, though both of these numbers are suspicious given Confucius' supposed age at death.
At the age of fifty, when Duke Ding of Lu was on the throne, Confucius' talents were recognized and he was appointed Minister of Public Works and then Minister of Crime. But Confucius apparently offended members of the Lu nobility who were vying with Duke Ding for power (or was it the duke himself that Confucius had rubbed the wrong way?) and he was subsequently forced to leave office and go into exile. As in other ancient cultures, exile and suffering are common themes in the lives of the heroes of the early Chinese tradition. In the company of his disciples, Confucius left Lu and traveled in the states of Wei, Song, Chen, Cai, and Chu, purportedly looking for a ruler who might employ him but meeting instead with indifference and, occasionally, severe hardship and danger. Several of these episodes, as preserved in the Records of the Grand Historian, appear to be little more than prose retellings of songs found in the ancient Chinese Book of Songs, Confucius' life is thus rendered a re-enactment of the suffering and alienation of the personas of the poems.
In any case, by most traditional accounts, Confucius returned to Lu in 484 BCE and spent the remainder of his life teaching, putting in order the Book of Songs, the Book of Documents, and other ancient classics, as well as editing the Spring and Autumn Annals, the court chronicle of Lu. Sima Qian's account also provides background on Confucius' connection to the early canonical texts on ritual and on music (the latter of which was lost at an early date). Sima Qian claims, moreover, that, In his later Years Confucius delighted in the Yithe famous, some might say infamous, divination manual popular to this day in China and in the West. The Analects passage which appears to corroborate Sima Qian's claim seems corrupt and hence unreliable on this point. Confucius' traditional association with these works led them and related texts to be revered as the Confucian Classics and made Confucius himself the spiritual ancestor of later teachers, historians, moral philosophers, literary scholars, and countless others whose lives and works figure prominently in Chinese intellectual history.
Book X of the Analects consists of personal observations of how Confucius comported himself as a thinker, teacher, and official. Some have argued that these passages were originally more general prescriptions on how a gentleman should dress and behave that were relabeled as descriptions of Confucius. Traditionally, Book X has been regarded as providing an intimate portrait of Confucius and has been read as a biographical sketch. The following passages provide a few examples.
Confucius, at home in his native village, was simple and unassuming in manner, as though he did not trust himself to speak. But when in the ancestral temple or at Court he speaks readily, though always choosing his words with due caution. (Lunyu 10.1)
When at court conversing with the officers of a lower grade, he is friendly, though straightforward; when conversing with officers of a higher grade, he is restrained but precise. When the ruler is present he is wary, but not cramped. (Lunyu 10.2)
On entering the Palace Gate he seems to contract his body, as though there were not sufficient room to admit him. If he halts, it must never be in the middle of the gate, nor in going through does he ever tread on the threshold. (Lunyu 10.4)
When fasting in preparation for sacrifice he must wear the Bright Robe, and it must be of linen. He must change his food and also the place where he commonly sits. He does not object to his rice being thoroughly cleaned, nor to his meat being finely minced. (Lunyu 10.7, 10.8)
When sending a messenger to enquire after someone in another country, he bows himself twice while seeing the messenger off. (Lunyu 10.15)
In bed he avoided lying in the posture of a corpse On meeting anyone in deep mourning he must bow across the bar of his chariot. (Lunyu 10.24, 10.25)
Analects passages such as these made Confucius the model of courtliness and personal decorum for countless generations of Chinese officials.
By the 4th century BCE, Confucius was recognized as a unique figure, a sage who was ignored but should have been recognized and become a king. At the end of the 4th century, Mencius says of Confucius: Ever since man came into this world, there has never been one greater than Confucius. And in two passages Mencius implies that Confucius was one of the great sage kings who, according to his reckoning, arises every five hundred years. Confucius also figures prominently as the subject of anecdotes and the teacher of wisdom in the writing of Xunzi, a third century BCE follower of Confucius' teachings. Indeed chapters twenty-eight to thirty of the Xunzi, which some have argued were not the work of Xunzi but compilations by his disciples, look like an alternative, and considerably briefer, version of the Analects.
Confucius and his followers also inspired considerable criticism from other thinkers. The authors of the Zhuangzi took particular delight in parodying Confucius and the teachings conventionally associated with him. But Confucius' reputation was so great that even the Zhuangzi appropriates him to give voice to Daoist teachings.
Confucius' teachings and his conversations and exchanges with his disciples are recorded in the Lunyu or Analects, a collection that probably achieved something like its present form around the second century BCE. While Confucius believes that people live their lives within parameters firmly established by Heavenwhich, often, for him means both a purposeful Supreme Being as well as nature and its fixed cycles and patternshe argues that men are responsible for their actions and especially for their treatment of others. We can do little or nothing to alter our fated span of existence but we determine what we accomplish and what we are remembered for.
Confucius represented his teachings as lessons transmitted from antiquity. He claimed that he was a transmitter and not a maker and that all he did reflected his reliance on and love for the ancients. (Lunyu 7.1) Confucius pointed especially to the precedents established during the height of the royal Zhou (roughly the first half of the first millennium, BCE). Such justifications for one's ideas may have already been conventional in Confucius' day. Certainly his claim that there were antique precedents for his ideology had a tremendous influence on subsequent thinkers many of whom imitated these gestures. But we should not regard the contents of the Analects as consisting of old ideas. Much of what Confucius taught appears to have been original to him and to have represented a radical departure from the ideas and practices of his day.
Confucius also claimed that he enjoyed a special and privileged relationship with Heaven and that, by the age of fifty, he had come to understand what Heaven had mandated for him and for mankind. (Lunyu 2.4). Confucius was also careful to instruct his followers that they should never neglect the offerings due Heaven. (Lunyu 3.13) Some scholars have seen a contradiction between Confucius' reverence for Heaven and what they believe to be his skepticism with regard to the existence of the spirits. But the Analects passages that reveal Confucius's attitudes toward spiritual forces (Lunyu 3.12, 6.20, and 11.11) do not suggest that he was skeptical. Rather they show that Confucius revered and respected the spirits, thought that they should be worshipped with utmost sincerity, and taught that serving the spirits was a far more difficult and complicated matter than serving mere mortals.
Confucius' social philosophy largely revolves around the concept of ren, compassion or loving others. Cultivating or practicing such concern for others involved deprecating oneself. This meant being sure to avoid artful speech or an ingratiating manner that would create a false impression and lead to self-aggrandizement. (Lunyu 1.3) Those who have cultivated ren are, on the contrary, simple in manner and slow of speech. (Lunyu 13.27). For Confucius, such concern for others is demonstrated through the practice of forms of the Golden Rule: What you do not wish for yourself, do not do to others; Since you yourself desire standing then help others achieve it, since you yourself desire success then help others attain it. (Lunyu 12.2, 6.30). He regards devotion to parents and older siblings as the most basic form of promoting the interests of others before one's own and teaches that such altruism can be accomplished only by those who have learned self-discipline.
Learning self-restraint involves studying and mastering li, the ritual forms and rules of propriety through which one expresses respect for superiors and enacts his role in society in such a way that he himself is worthy of respect and admiration. A concern for propriety should inform everything that one says and does:
Look at nothing in defiance of ritual, listen to nothing in defiance of ritual, speak of nothing in defiance or ritual, never stir hand or foot in defiance of ritual. (Lunyu 12.1)Subjecting oneself to ritual does not, however, mean suppressing one's desires but instead learning how to reconcile one's own desires with the needs of one's family and community. Confucius and many of his followers teach that it is by experiencing desires that we learn the value of social strictures that make an ordered society possible (See Lunyu 2.4.). Nor does Confucius' emphasis on ritual mean that he was a punctilious ceremonialist who thought that the rites of worship and of social exchange had to be practiced correctly at all costs. Confucius taught, on the contrary, that if one did not possess a keen sense of the well-being and interests of others his ceremonial manners signified nothing. (Lunyu 3.3). Equally important was Confucius' insistence that the rites not be regarded as mere forms, but that they be practiced with complete devotion and sincerity. He [i.e., Confucius] sacrificed to the dead as if they were present. He sacrificed to the spirits as if the spirits were present. The Master said, I consider my not being present at the sacrifice as though there were no sacrifice. (Lunyu 3.12)
While ritual forms often have to do with the more narrow relations of family and clan, ren, however, is to be practiced broadly and informs one's interactions with all people. Confucius warns those in power that they should not oppress or take for granted even the lowliest of their subjects. You may rob the Three Armies of their commander, but you cannot deprive the humblest peasant of his opinion. (Lunyu 9.26) Confucius regards loving others as a calling and a mission for which one should be ready to die (Lunyu 15.9).
Confucius' political philosophy is also rooted in his belief that a ruler should learn self-discipline, should govern his subjects by his own example, and should treat them with love and concern. If the people be led by laws, and uniformity among them be sought by punishments, they will try to escape punishment and have no sense of shame. If they are led by virtue, and uniformity sought among them through the practice of ritual propriety, they will possess a sense of shame and come to you of their own accord. (Lunyu 2.3; see also 13.6.) It seems apparent that in his own day, however, advocates of more legalistic methods were winning a large following among the ruling elite. Thus Confucius' warning about the ill consequences of promulgating law codes should not be interpreted as an attempt to prevent their adoption but instead as his lament that his ideas about the moral suasion of the ruler were not proving popular.
Most troubling to Confucius was his perception that the political institutions of his day had completely broken down. He attributed this collapse to the fact that those who wielded power as well as those who occupied subordinate positions did so by making claim to titles for which they were not worthy. When asked by a ruler of the large state of Qi, Lu's neighbor on the Shandong peninsula, about the principles of good government, Confucius is reported to have replied: Good government consists in the ruler being a ruler, the minister being a minister, the father being a father, and the son being a son. (Lunyu 12.11) If I claim for myself a title and attempt to participate in the various hierarchical relationships to which I would be entitled by virtue of that title, then I should live up to the meaning of the title that I claim for myself. Confucius' analysis of the lack of connection between actualities and their names and the need to correct such circumstances is usually referred to as Confucius' theory of zhengming. Elsewhere in the Analects, Confucius says to his disciple Zilu that the first thing he would do in undertaking the administration of a state is zhengming. (Lunyu 13.3). Xunzi composed an entire essay entitled Zhengming. But for Xunzi the term referred to the proper use of language and how one should go about inventing new terms that were suitable to the age. For Confucius, zhengming does not seem to refer to the rectification of names (this is the way the term is most often translated by scholars of the Analects), but instead to rectifying behavior of people so that it exactly corresponds to the language with which they identify and describe themselves. Confucius believed that this sort of rectification had to begin at the very top of the government, because it was at the top that the discrepancy between names and actualities had originated. If the ruler's behavior is rectified then the people beneath him will follow suit. In a conversation with Ji Kangzi (who had usurped power in Lu), Confucius advised: If your desire is for good, the people will be good. The moral character of the ruler is the wind; the moral character of those beneath him is the grass. When the wind blows, the grass bends. (Lunyu 12.19)
For Confucius, what characterized superior rulership was the possession of de or virtue. Conceived of as a kind of moral power that allows one to win a following without recourse to physical force, such virtue also enabled the ruler to maintain good order in his state without troubling himself and by relying on loyal and effective deputies. Confucius claimed that, He who governs by means of his virtue is, to use an analogy, like the pole-star: it remains in its place while all the lesser stars do homage to it. (Lunyu 2.1) The way to maintain and cultivate such royal virtue was through the practice and enactment of li or ritualsthe ceremonies that defined and punctuated the lives of the ancient Chinese aristocracy. These ceremonies encompassed: the sacrificial rites performed at ancestral temples to express humility and thankfulness; the ceremonies of enfeoffment, toasting, and gift exchange that bound together the aristocracy into a complex web of obligation and indebtedness; and the acts of politeness and decorumsuch things as bowing and yieldingthat identified their performers as gentlemen. In an influential study, Herbert Fingarette argues that the performance of these various ceremonies, when done correctly and sincerely, involves a magical quality that underlies the efficacy of royal virtue in accomplishing the aims of the ruler.
A hallmark of Confucius' thought is his emphasis on education and study. He disparages those who have faith in natural understanding or intuition and argues that the only real understanding of a subject comes from long and careful study. Study, for Confucius, means finding a good teacher and imitating his words and deeds. A good teacher is someone older who is familiar with the ways of the past and the practices of the ancients. (See Lunyu 7.22) While he sometimes warns against excessive reflection and meditation, Confucius' position appears to be a middle course between studying and reflecting on what one has learned. He who learns but does not think is lost. He who thinks but does not learn is in great danger. (Lunyu 2.15) Confucius, himself, is credited by the tradition with having taught altogether three thousand students, though only seventy are said to have truly mastered the arts he cherished. Confucius is willing to teach anyone, whatever their social standing, as long as they are eager and tireless. He taught his students morality, proper speech, government, and the refined arts. While he also emphasizes the Six Arts -- ritual, music, archery, chariot-riding, calligraphy, and computation -- it is clear that he regards morality the most important subject. Confucius' pedagogical methods are striking. He never discourses at length on a subject. Instead he poses questions, cites passages from the classics, or uses apt analogies, and waits for his students to arrive at the right answers. I only instruct the eager and enlighten the fervent. If I hold up one corner and a student cannot come back to me with the other three, I do not go on with the lesson. (Lunyu 7.8).
Confucius' goal is to create gentlemen who carry themselves with grace, speak correctly, and demonstrate integrity in all things. His strong dislike of the sycophantic petty men, whose clever talk and pretentious manner win them an audience, is reflected in numerous Lunyu passages. Confucius finds himself in an age in which values are out of joint. Actions and behavior no longer correspond to the labels originally attached to them. Rulers do not rule and subjects do not serve, he observes. (Lunyu 12.11; cf. also 13.3) This means that words and titles no longer mean what they once did. Moral education is important to Confucius because it is the means by which one can rectify this situation and restore meaning to language and values to society. He believes that the most important lessons for obtaining such a moral education are to be found in the canonical Book of Songs, because many of its poems are both beautiful and good. Thus Confucius places the text first in his curriculum and frequently quotes and explains its lines of verse. For this reason, the Lunyu is also an important source for Confucius' understanding of the role poetry and art more generally play in the moral education of gentlemen as well as in the reformation of society.
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First published: July 3, 2002
Content last modified: July 3, 2002