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Let T_{2} denote the number of messages that Joanna's e-mail system sends, and T_{1} denote the number of messages that Lizzi's e-mail system sends. We might suppose that T_{i} appears on each agent's computer screen. If T_{1} = 0, then Lizzi sends no message, that is, _{1} has occurred, in which case Lizzi's unique best response is to choose A. If T_{2} = 0, then Joanna did not receive a message. She knows that in this case, either _{1} has occurred and Lizzi did not send her a message, which occurs with probability .51, or _{2} has occurred and Lizzi sent her a message which did not arrive, which occurs with probability .49. If _{1} has occurred, then Lizzi is sure to choose A, so Joanna knows that whatever Lizzi might do at _{2},
E(u_{2}(A) | T_{2}=0) 2(.51) + 0(.49)
.51 + .49> 4(.51) + 2(.49)
.51 + .49E(u_{2}(B) | T_{2}=0 )
so Joanna is strictly better off choosing A no matter what Lizzi does at either state of the world.
Suppose next that for all T_{i} < t, each agents' unique best response given her expectations regarding the other agent is A, so that the unique Nash equilibrium of the game is (A,A). Assume that T_{1} = t. Lizzi is uncertain whether T_{2} = t, which is the case if Joanna received Lizzi's t^{th} automatic confirmation and Joanna's t^{th} confirmation was lost, or if T_{2} = t 1, which is the case if Lizzi's t^{th} confirmation was lost. Then
_{1}(T_{2} = t1 | T_{1} = t) = z =
+ (1)> ½.^{[1]}
Thus it is more likely that Lizzi's last confirmation did not arrive than that Joanna did receive this message. By the inductive assumption, Lizzi assesses that Joanna will choose A if T_{2} = t1. So
and
E(u_{1}(B) | T_{1} = t) 4z + 2(1z) = 6z + 2 < 3 + 2 = 1,
E(u_{1}(A) | T_{1} = t) = 0since Lizzi knows that _{2} is the case. So Lizzi's unique best action is A. Similarly, one can show that A is Joanna's best reply if T_{2} = t. So by induction, (A,A) is the unique Nash equilibrium of the game for every t 0.
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First published: August 27, 2001
Content last modified: August 27, 2001