Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Common Knowledge
Proof of Proposition 3.1
Proposition 3.1.
Let be a finite set of states
of the world. Suppose that
( i ) Agents i and j have a common prior probability distribution
()
over the events of
such that
(
) > 0
for each
,
and
( ii ) It is common knowledge at
that i's posterior probability of event E is q_{ i}( E ) and
that j's posterior probability of E is q_{ j}( E ).
Then q_{ i}( E ) = q_{ j}( E ).
Proof.
Let
be the meet of all the agents' partitions, and let
(
)
be the element of
containing . Since
(
)
consists of cells common to every agents information partition, we can write
where each
H_{ ik}
_{i}. Since
i's posterior probability of event E is common knowledge, it is
constant on
(
),
and so
q_{ i}( E ) =
(
E  H_{ ik} ) for all k

Hence,
(
E
H_{ ik} ) = q_{ i}( E )
(
H_{ ik} )

and so

= 

= 


=


=

^{ k}

q_{ i}( E )
(
H_{ ik} )



=

q_{ i}
( E )

^{ k}

(
H_{ ik} )


=

q_{ i}( E )
(

^{ k}

H_{ ik} )



=

q_{ i}( E )
(
(
) )

Applying the same argument to j, we have
( E
(
) ) = q_{ j}( E )
(
(
) )

so we must have
q_{ i}( E ) = q_{ j}( E ).
Copyright © 2001 by
Peter Vanderschraaf
peterv@cyrus.andrew.cmu.edu
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First published: August 27, 2001
Content last modified: August 27, 2001