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Common knowledge is a phenomenon which underwrites much of social life. In order to communicate or otherwise coordinate their behavior successfully, individuals typically require mutual or common understandings or background knowledge. Indeed, if a particular interaction results in "failure", the usual explanation for this is that the agents involved did not have the common knowledge that would have resulted in success. If a married couple are separated in a department store, they stand a good chance of finding one another because their common knowledge of each others' tastes and experiences leads them each to look for the other in a part of the store both know that both would tend to frequent. Since the spouses both love cappuccino, each expects the other to go to the coffee bar, and they find one another. But in a less happy case, if a pedestrian causes a minor traffic jam by crossing against a red light, she explains her mistake as the result of her not noticing, and therefore not knowing, the status of the traffic signal that all the motorists knew. The spouses coordinate successfully given their common knowledge, while the pedestrian and the motorists miscoordinate as the result of a breakdown in common knowledge.

Given the importance of common knowledge in social interactions, it
is remarkable that only quite recently have philosophers and social
scientists attempted to analyze the concept. David Hume (1740) was
perhaps the first to make explicit reference to the role of mutual
knowledge in coordination. In his account of convention in *A
Treatise of Human Nature,* Hume argued that a necessary condition
for coordinated activity was that agents all know what behavior to
expect from one another. Without the requisite mutual knowledge,
Hume maintained, mutually beneficial social conventions would
disappear. Much later, J. E. Littlewood (1953) presented some
examples of common-knowledge-type reasoning, and Thomas Schelling
(1960) and John Harsanyi (1967-1968) argued that something like
common knowledge is needed to explain certain inferences people make
about each other. Yet it was David Lewis (1969) who first gave an
explicit analysis of common knowledge in the monograph
*Convention.* Stephen Schiffer (1972), Robert Aumann (1976), and
Gilbert Harman (1977) independently gave alternate definitions of
common knowledge. Jon Barwise (1988, 1989) gave a precise formulation
of Harman's intuitive account. Schiffer's analysis of
common knowledge as a *hierarchy* of epistemic claims has become
standard in the philosophical and social science literature.
Lewis', Aumann's, and Barwise's accounts all imply the
hierarchical account. In some contexts, Schiffer's,
Aumann's, and Barwise's definitions of common knowledge are
more convenient to use than Lewis' original definition. More
recently, Margaret Gilbert (1989) proposed a somewhat different
account of common knowledge which she argues is preferable to the
standard account. Others have developed accounts of mutual
knowledge, *approximate common knowledge,* and *common
belief* which require less stringent assumptions than the standard
account, and which serve as more plausible models of what agents know
in cases where strict common knowledge seems impossible
(Brandenburger and Dekel 1987, Stinchcombe 1988, Monderer and Samet
1989, Rubinstein 1992). The analysis and applications of common
knowledge and related multi-agent knowledge concepts has become a
lively field of research.

The purpose of this essay is to overview of some of the most
important results stemming from this contemporary research. The
topics reviewed in each section of this essay are as follows: Section
1 gives motivating examples which illustrate a variety of ways in
which the actions of agents depend crucially upon their having, or
lacking, certain common knowledge. Section 2 discusses alternative
analyses of common knowledge. Section 3 reviews applications of
multi-agent knowledge concepts, particularly to *game
theory* (von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944), in which common
knowledge assumptions have been found to have great importance in
justifying *solution concepts* for mathematical games. Section
4 discusses skeptical doubts about the attainability of common
knowledge. Finally, Section 5 discusses the *common belief*
concept which result from weakening the assumptions of Lewis'
account of common knowledge.

- 1. Motivating Examples
- 2. Alternative Accounts of Common Knowledge
- 3. Applications of Mutual and Common Knowledge
- 4. Is Common Knowledge Attainable?
- 5. Coordination and Common
*p*-Belief - Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Certain assumptions are implicit in the preceding story. In
particular, the waiter must know that the guest knows he has spoken
the truth, and that she can draw the desired conclusion from what he
says in this context. More fundamentally, the waiter must know that
if he announces "It was my fault" to the guest, she will interpret
his intended meaning correctly and will infer what his making this
announcement ordinarily implies in this context. This in turn
implies that the guest must know that if the waiter announces "It was
my fault" in this context, then the waiter indeed knows he is at
fault. Then on account of his announcement, the waiter knows that
the guest knows that he knows he was at fault. The waiter's
announcement was meant to generate *higher-order* levels of
knowledge of a fact each already knew.

Just a slight strengthening of the stated assumptions results in
even higher levels of nested knowledge. Suppose the waiter and the
guest each know that the other can infer what he infers from the
waiter's announcement. Can the guest now believe that the waiter
does not know that she knows that he knows he is at fault? If the
guest considers this question, she reasons that if the waiter falsely
believes it is possible that she does not know that he knows he is at
fault, then the waiter must believe it to be possible that she cannot
infer that he knows he is at fault from his own declaration. Since
she knows she *can* infer that the waiter knows he is at fault
from his declaration, she knows that the waiter knows she can infer
this, as well. Hence the waiter's announcement establishes the
fourth-order knowledge claim: The guest knows that the waiter knows
that she knows that he knows he is at fault. By similar, albeit
lengthier, arguments, the agents can verify that corresponding
knowledge claims of even higher-order must also obtain under these
assumptions.

This is a variation of an example first published by Littlewood
(1953), although he notes that his version of the example was already
well-known at the
time.^{[2]}
*N* individuals enjoy a picnic supper
together which includes barbecued spareribs. At the end of the meal,
*k* 1 of these
diners have barbecue sauce on their faces. No one wants to continue
the evening with a messy face. No one wants to wipe her face if it's
not messy, for this would make her appear neurotic. And no one wants
to take the risk of being thought rude by telling anyone else that he
has barbecue sauce on his face. Since no one can see her own face,
none of the messy diners makes a move to clean her face. Then the
cook who served the spareribs returns with a carton of ice cream.
Amused by what he sees, the cook rings the dinner bell and makes the
following announcement: "At least one of you has barbecue sauce on
her face. I will ring the dinner bell over and over, until anyone
who is messy has wiped her face. Then I will serve dessert." For
the first
*k* 1 rings,
no one does anything. Then, at the
*k*^{th} ring, each of the messy individuals suddenly
reaches for a napkin, and soon afterwards, the diners are all
enjoying their ice cream.

How did the messy diners finally realize that their faces needed
cleaning? The *k* = 1 case is easy, since in this case, the
lone messy individual will realize he is messy immediately, since he
sees that everyone else is clean. Consider the *k* = 2 case
next. At the first ring, messy individual *i*_{1}
knows that one other person, *i*_{2}, is messy, but
does not yet know about himself. At the second ring,
*i*_{1} realizes that he must be messy, since had
*i*_{2} been the only messy one,
*i*_{2} would have known this after the first ring
when the cook made his announcement, and would have cleaned her face
then. By a symmetric argument, messy diner *i*_{2}
also concludes that she is messy at the second ring, and both pick up
a napkin at that time.

Let's next consider *k* = 3. Again at the first ring, each
of the messy diners *i*_{1}, *i*_{2},
and *i*_{3} knows the status of the other diners, but
not her own. The situation is apparently unchanged after the second
ring. But on the third ring, *i*_{1} realizes that
she is messy. For if *i*_{2} and
*i*_{3} were the only messy ones, then they would have
discovered this after the second ring by the argument of the previous
paragraph. Since *i*_{1} can see that all of the
diners other than *i*_{2} and *i*_{3}
are clean, she concludes that she must be messy.
*i*_{2} and *i*_{3} draw similar
conclusions at the third ring, and all clean their faces at that
time.

The general case follows by induction. Suppose that if *k* =
*j*, then each of the *j* messy diners can determine
that he is messy after *j* rings. Then if *k* =
*j* + 1, then at the *j* + 1^{st} ring, each of
the *j* + 1 individuals will realize that he is messy. For if
he were not messy, then the other *j* messy ones would have
all realized their messiness at the *j*^{th} ring and
cleaned themselves then. Since no one cleaned herself after the
*j*^{th} ring, at the *j* + 1^{st} ring
each messy person will conclude that someone besides the other *j*
messy people must also be messy, namely, himself.

The "paradox" of this argument is that for *k* > 1, like
the case of the clumsy waiter of Example 1.1, the cook's announcement
told the diners something that each already knew. Yet apparently the
cook's announcement also gave the diners useful information. How
could this be? By announcing a fact already known to every diner,
the cook made this fact *common knowledge* among them, enabling
each of them to eventually deduce the condition of his own face after
sufficiently many rings of the bell. Note that the inductive
argument the agents run through depends upon the conclusions they
each draw from several *counterfactual conditionals.* In
general, the consequences of agents' common knowledge are intimately
related to how they evaluate subjunctive and counterfactual
conditionals.^{[3]}

Does meeting one's obligations to others serve one's self-interest? Plato and his successors recognized that in certain cases, the answer seems to be "No." Hobbes (1651, pp. 101-102) considers the challenge of a "Foole", who claims that it is irrational to honor an agreement made with another who has already fulfilled his part of the agreement. Noting that in this situation one has gained all the benefit of the other's compliance, the Foole contends that it would now be best for him to break the agreement, thereby saving himself the costs of compliance. Of course, if the Foole's analysis of the situation is correct, then would the other party to the agreement not anticipate the Foole's response to agreements honored, and act accordingly?

Hume (1740, pp. 520-521) takes up this question, using an example: Two neighboring farmers each expect a bumper crop of corn. Each will require his neighbor's help in harvesting his corn when it ripens, or else a substantial portion will rot in the field. Since their corn will ripen at different times, the two farmers can ensure full harvests for themselves by helping each other when their crops ripen, and both know this. Yet the farmers do not help each other. For the farmer whose corn ripens later reasons that if she were to help the other farmer, then when her corn ripens he would be in the position of Hobbes' Foole, having already benefited from her help. He would no longer have anything to gain from her, so he would not help her, sparing himself the hard labor of a second harvest. Since she cannot expect the other farmer to return her aid when the time comes, she will not help when his corn ripens first, and of course the other farmer does not help her when her corn ripens later.

The structure of Hume's *Farmers' Dilemma* problem can be
summarized using the following tree diagram:

This tree is an example of a

Figure 1.1a

In the Farmers' Dilemma game, following the
*C*^{1},*C*^{2}-path is strictly better
for both farmers than following the
*D*^{1},*D*^{2}-path. However, Fiona
chooses *D*^{1}, as the result of the following simple
argument: "If I were to choose *C*^{1}, then Alan, who is
rational and who knows the payoff structure of the game, would choose
*D*^{2}. I am also rational and know the payoff structure of
the game. So I should choose *D*^{1}." Since Fiona knows that
Alan is rational and knows the game's payoffs, she concludes that she
need only analyze the *reduced* game in the following figure:

Figure 1.1b

In this reduced game, Fiona is certain to gain a strictly higher
payoff by choosing *D*^{1} than if she chooses
*C*^{1}, so *D*^{1} is her unique best
choice. Of course, when Fiona chooses *D*^{1}, Alan,
being rational, responds by choosing *D*^{2}. If
Fiona and Alan know: (i) that they are both rational, (ii) that they
both know the payoff structure of the game, and (iii) that they both
know (i) and (ii), then they both can predict what the other will do
at every node of the Figure 1.1.a game, and conclude that they can
rule out the *D*^{1},*C*^{2}-branch of
the Figure 1.1.b game and analyze just the reduced game of
the following figure:

Figure 1.1c

On account of this *mutual knowledge,* both know that Fiona
will choose *D*^{1}, and that Alan will respond with
*D*^{2}. Hence, the
*D*^{1},*D*^{2}-outcome results if the
Farmers' Dilemma game is played by agents having this mutual
knowledge, though it is suboptimal since both agents would fare
better at the
*C*^{1},*C*^{2}-branch.^{[4]}
This argument, which in its essentials is Hume's argument, is an
example of a standard technique for solving sequential games known as
*backwards
induction.*^{[5]}
The basic idea behind backwards induction is that the agents engaged
in a sequential game deduce how each will act throughout the entire
game by ruling out the acts that are not payoff-maximizing for the
agents who would move last, then ruling out the acts that are not
payoff-maximizing for the agents who would move next-to-last, and so
on. Clearly, backwards induction arguments rely crucially upon what,
if any, mutual knowledge the agents have regarding their situation,
and they typically require the agents to evaluate the truth values of
certain subjunctive conditionals, such as "If I (Fiona) were to
choose *C*^{1}, then Alan would choose
*D*^{2}".

The mutual knowledge assumptions required to construct a backwards
induction solution to a game become more complex as the number of
stages in the game increases. To see this, consider the sequential
*Centipede* game depicted in the following figure:

At each stage

Figure 1.2

Like the Farmers' Dilemma, this game is a commitment problem for the
agents. If each agent could trust the other to choose
*R*^{i} at each stage, then they would each
expect to receive a payoff of 3. However, Alan chooses
*L*^{1}, leaving each with a payoff of only 1, as the
result of the following backwards induction argument: "If node
*n*_{4} were to be reached, then Fiona, (being
rational) would choose *L*^{4}. I, knowing this,
would (being rational) choose *L*^{3} if node
*n*_{3} were to be reached. Fiona, knowing
*this*, would (being rational) choose *L*^{2} if
node *n*_{2} were to be reached. Hence, I (being
rational) should choose *L*^{1}." To carry out this
backwards induction argument, Alan implicitly assumes that: (i) he
knows that Fiona knows he is rational, and (ii) he knows that Fiona
knows that he knows she is rational. Put another way, for Alan to
carry out the backwards induction argument, at node
*n*_{1} he must know what Fiona must know at node
*n*_{2} to make *L*^{2} her best
response should *n*_{2} be reached. While in the
Farmer's Dilemma Fiona needed only *first-order* knowledge of
Alan's rationality and *second-order* knowledge of Alan's
knowledge of the game to derive the backwards induction solution, in
the Figure 1.2 game, for Alan to be able to derive the backwards
induction solution, the agents must have *third-order mutual
knowledge* of the game and *second-order mutual knowledge* of
rationality, and Alan must have *fourth-order* knowledge of this
mutual knowledge of the game and *third-order* knowledge of
their mutual knowledge of rationality. This argument also involves
several counterfactuals, since to construct it the agents must be
able to evaluate conditionals of the form, "If node
*n*_{i} were to be reached, Alan (Fiona)
would choose *L*^{i}
(*R*^{i})", which for *i* > 1 are
counterfactual, since third-order mutual knowledge of rationality
implies that nodes *n*_{2}, *n*_{3},
and *n*_{4} are never reached.

The method of backwards induction can be applied to any sequential
game of *perfect information*, in which the agents can observe
each others' moves in turn and can recall the entire history of play.
However, as the number of potential stages of play increases, the
backwards induction argument evidently becomes harder to construct.
This raises certain questions: (1) What precisely are the
mutual or common knowledge assumptions that are required to justify
the backwards induction argument for a particular sequential game?
(2) As a sequential game increases in complexity, would we expect
the mutual knowledge that is required for backwards induction to
start to fail?

When a man loses his wife in a department store without any prior understanding on where to meet if they get separated, the chances are good that they will find each other. It is likely that each will think of some obvious place to meet, so obvious that each will be sure that it is "obvious" to both of them. One does not simply predict where the other will go, which is wherever the first predicts the second to predict the first to go, and soad infinitum.Not "What would I do if I were she?" but "What would I do if I were she wondering what she would do if she were wondering what I would do if I were she . . . ?"

Thomas Schelling,The Strategy of Conflict

Schelling's department store problem is an example of a *pure
coordination problem,* that is, an interaction problem in which
the interests of the agents coincide perfectly. Schelling (1960) and
Lewis (1969), who were the first to make explicit the role common
knowledge plays in social coordination, were also among the first to
argue that coordination problems can be modeled using the analytic
vocabulary of game theory. A very simple example of such a
coordination problem is given in the next figure:

Figure 1.3

The matrix of Figure 1.3 is an example of a *game in strategic
form.* At each outcome of the game, which corresponds to a cell in
the matrix, the row (column) agent receives as payoff the first
(second) element of the ordered pair in the corresponding cell.
However, in strategic form games, each agent chooses without first
being able to observe the choices of any other agent, so that all
must choose as if they were choosing simultaneously. The Figure 1.3
game is a game of *pure coordination* (Lewis 1969), that is, a
game in which at each outcome, each agent receives exactly the same
payoff. One interpretation of this game is that Schelling's spouses,
Liz and Robert, are searching for each other in the department store
with four floors, and they find each other if they go to the same
floor. Four outcomes at which the spouses coordinate correspond to
the strategy profiles
(*s*_{j}, *s*_{j}),
1 *j*
4,
of the Figure 1.3 game. These four profiles are strict *Nash
equilibria* (Nash 1950, 1951) of the game, that is, each agent has
a decisive reason to follow her end of one of these strategy profiles
provided that the other also follows this
profile.^{[6]}

The difficulty the agents face is trying to select an equilibrium to
follow. For suppose that Robert hopes to coordinate with Liz on a
particular equilibrium of the game, say
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}). Robert
reasons as follows: "Since there are several strict equilibria we
might follow, I should follow my end of
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) if, and only
if, I have sufficiently high expectations that Liz will follow her
end of
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}). But I can only
have sufficiently high expectations that Liz will follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2} ) if she has
sufficiently high expectations that I will follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}). For her to have
such expectations, Liz must have sufficiently high (second-order)
expectations that I have sufficiently high expectations that she will
follow (*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}), for if Liz
doesn't have these (second-order) expectations, then she will believe
I don't have sufficient reason to follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) and may
therefore deviate from (*s*_{2},
*s*_{2}) herself. So I need to have sufficiently high
(third-order) expectations that Liz has sufficiently high
(second-order) expectations that I have sufficiently high
expectations that she will follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2} ). But this
implies that Liz must have sufficiently high (fourth-order)
expectations that I have sufficiently high (third-order) expectations
that Liz has sufficiently high (second-order) expectations that I
have sufficiently high expectations that she will follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}), for if she doesn't,
then she will believe I don't have sufficient reason to follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}), and then she won't,
either. Which involves me in fifth-order expectations regarding Liz,
which involves her in sixth-order expectations regarding me, and so
on." What would suffice for Robert, and Liz, to have decisive reason
to follow (*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) is that
they each *know* that the other *knows* that . . . that
the other will follow (*s*_{2},
*s*_{2}) for any number of levels of knowledge, which
is to say that between Liz and Robert it is common knowledge
that they will follow (*s*_{2},
*s*_{2}). If agents follow a strict equilibrium in a
pure coordination game as a consequence of their having common
knowledge of the game, their rationality and their intentions to
follow this equilibrium, and no other, then the agents are said to be
following a *Lewis-convention* (Lewis 1969).

Lewis' theory of convention applies to a more general class of games than pure coordination games, but pure coordination games already model a variety of important social interactions. In particular, Lewis models conventions of language as equilibrium points of a pure coordination game. The role common knowledge plays in games of pure coordination sketched above of course raises further questions: (1) Can people ever attain the common knowledge which characterizes a Lewis-convention? (2) Would less stringent epistemic assumptions suffice to justify Nash equilibrium behavior in a coordination problem?

- 2.1 The Hierarchical Account
- 2.2 Lewis' Account
- 2.3 Aumann's Account
- 2.4 Barwise's Account
- 2.5 Gilbert's Account

Monderer and Samet (1988) and Binmore and Brandenburger (1989) give
a particularly elegant set-theoretic definition of common
knowledge. I will review this definition here, and then show that it
is logically equivalent to the ‘*i* knows that *j*
knows that … *k* knows that A’ hierarchy that
Lewis (1969) and Schiffer (1972) argue characterizes common
knowledge.^{[8]}

Some preliminary notions must be stated first. Following
C. I. Lewis (1943-1944) and Carnap (1947), propositions are formally
subsets of a set
of *state descriptions* or *possible worlds.* One can
think of the elements of
as representing Leibniz's possible worlds or
Wittgenstein's possible states of affairs. Some results in the
common knowledge literature presuppose that
is of finite cardinality. If this admittedly unrealistic assumption
is needed in any context, this will be explicitly stated in this
essay, and otherwise one may assume that
may be either a finite or an infinite set. A distinguished
actual world
_{}
is an element of
.
A proposition *A*
obtains (or is true) if the actual world
_{}
*A*. In general, we say that *A* *obtains at*
a world
if
*A*. What an agent *i* knows about the possible worlds
is stated formally in terms of a *knowledge operator*
**K**_{i}. Given a proposition *A*
,
**K**_{i}(*A*) denotes a new proposition,
corresponding to the set of possible worlds at which agent *i*
knows that A obtains. **K**_{i}(*A*) is
read as ‘*i* knows (that) *A* (is the case)’.
The knowledge operator **K**_{i} satisfies certain axioms,
including:

K1:K_{i}(A)AK2:

K_{i}()K3:

K_{i}(_{k}A_{k}) =_{k}K_{i}(A_{k})K4:

K_{i}(A)K_{i}K_{i}(A)^{[9]}

In words, K1 says that if *i* knows *A*, then
*A* must be the case. K2 says that *i* knows that some
possible world in
occurs no matter which possible world
occurs. K3 says that *i* knows a conjunction if, and only
if, *i* knows each conjunct. K4 is a *reflection axiom,*
which says that if *i* knows *A*, then *i* knows
that she knows *A*. Note that by K3, if *A*
*B* then **K**_{i}(*A*)
**K**_{i}(*B*), by K1 and K2,
**K**_{i}() =
, and by K1 and K4,
**K**_{i}(*A*) =
**K**_{i}**K**_{i}(*A*). Any
system of knowledge satisfying K1 - K4 corresponds to the modal
system S4 (Kripke 1963). If one drops the K1 axiom and
retains the others, the resulting system would give a formal account
of what an agent *believes,* but does not necessarily
*know.*

A useful notion in the formal analysis of knowledge is that of a
*possibility set.* An agent i's possibility set at a state
of the world
is the smallest set of possible worlds that *i* thinks could
be the case if
is the actual world. More precisely,

Definition 2.1

Agenti'spossibility set_{i}() at is defined asThe collection of sets_{i}() {E|K_{i}(E) }is_{i}=_{}_{i}()i'sprivate information system.

Since in words,
_{i}()
is the intersection of all propositions which *i* knows at
,
_{i}()
is the smallest proposition in
that *i* knows at
.
Put another way,
_{i}()
is the most specific information that *i* has about the possible world
.
The intuition behind assigning agents private information systems is
that while an agent *i* may not be able to perceive or
comprehend every last detail of the world in which *i* lives,
*i* does know certain facts about that world. The elements of
*i*'s information system represent what *i* knows
immediately at a possible world. We also have the following:

Proposition 2.2

K_{i}(A) = { |_{i}()A}

In many formal analyses of knowledge in the literature, possibility
sets are taken as primitive and Proposition 2.2 is given as the
definition of knowledge. If one adopts this viewpoint, then the
axioms K1 - K4 follow as consequences of the definition of knowledge.
In many applications, the agents' possibility sets are assumed
to
*partition*^{[10]}
the set, in which case
_{i}
is called i's *private information partition.*

To illustrate the idea of possibility sets, let us return to the Barbecue Problem described in Example 1.2. Suppose there are three diners: Cathy, Jennifer and Mark. Then there are 8 relevant states of the world, summarized by Table 2.1:

Table 2.1

Each diner knows the condition of the other diners' faces, but
not her own. Suppose the cook makes no announcement, after all.
Then none of the diners knows the true state of the world whatever
the actual world turns out to be, but they do know *a priori*
that certain propositions are true at various states of the
world. For instance, Cathy's information system before any
announcement is made is depicted in Figure 2.1a:

Figure 2.1a

In this case, Cathy's information system is a partition
_{1} of
defined by

_{1}= {H_{CC},H_{CM},H_{MC},H_{MM}}

where

H_{CC}= {_{1},_{2}} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both clean)

H_{CM}= {_{4},_{6}} (i.e., Jennifer is clean and Mark is messy)

H_{MC}= {_{3},_{5}} (i.e., Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean)

H_{MM}= {_{7},_{8}} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both messy)

Cathy knows immediately which cell
_{1}()
in her partition is the case at any state of the world, but does not
know which is the true state at any
.

If we add in the assumption stated in Example 1.2 that if there is at least one messy diner, then the cook announces the fact, then Cathy's information partition is depicted by Figure 2.1b:

Figure 2.1b

In this case, Cathy's information system is a partition
_{1} of
defined by

_{1}= {H_{CCC},H_{MCC},H_{CM},H_{MC},H_{MM}}

where

H_{CCC}= { _{1}}(i.e., Jennifer, Mark, and I are all clean) H_{MCC}= { _{2}}(i.e., Jennifer and Mark are clean and I am messy) H_{CM}= { _{4},_{6}}(i.e., Jennifer is clean and Mark is messy) H_{MC}= { _{3},_{5}}(i.e., Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean) H_{MM}= { _{7},_{8}}(i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both messy)

In this case, Cathy's information partition is a
*refinement* of the partition she has when there is no
announcement, for in this case, then Cathy knows *a priori* that
if
_{1}
is the case there will be no announcement and will know immediately
that she is clean, and Cathy knows *a priori* that if
_{2}
is the case, then she will know immediately from the cook's
announcement that she is messy.

A slightly more complex case occurs if we alter the Barbecue problem so that the cook makes an announcement only if he sees at least two messy diners. Cathy's possibility set is now depicted by the diagram in Figure 2.1c:

Figure 2.1c

This time, Cathy's information system does not partition
.
For Cathy knows *a priori* that at
_{5},
the cook will make his announcement, and since at
_{5}
Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean, Cathy will realize immediately
that she is messy. However, Cathy also knows *a priori* that at
_{3}, either
_{3} or
_{5}
could be the case, since at
_{3}
she does not know in advance whether or not the cook will make an
announcement. Hence
_{1}(_{5}) =
{_{5}}, but
_{1}(_{3}) =
{_{3},
_{5}}.
Similarly,
_{1}(_{6}) =
{_{6}}, but
_{1}(_{4}) =
{_{4},
_{6}}.
Jennifer's and Mark's information systems given any of the
above three scenarios are derived similarly to Cathy's
information system, and the details of this are left as an exercise
for the reader.

We can now define mutual and common knowledge as follows:

Definition 2.3

Let a set of possible worlds together with a set of agentsNbe given.1. The proposition that

Ais(first levelorfirst order)mutual knowledge for the agents ofN,K^{1}_{N}(A), is the set defined byK^{1}_{N}(A)_{iN}K_{i}(A).2. The proposition that

Aism^{th}level(orm^{th}order)mutual knowledge among the agents of N,K^{m}_{N}(A), is defined recursively as the setK^{m}_{N}(A)_{iN}K_{i}(K^{m1}_{N}(A)).3. The proposition that

Aiscommon knowledgeamong the agents ofN,K^{*}_{N}(A), is defined as the set

K^{*}_{N}(A)

^{m=1}K^{m}_{N}(A).

As a consequence of Proposition 2.2, the agents' private
information systems determine an *a priori* structure of
propositions over the space of possible worlds regarding what they
can know, including what mutual and common knowledge they potentially
have. The world
which obtains determines *a posteriori* what individual, mutual
and common knowledge agents in fact have. Hence, one can read
**K**_{i}(*A*) as ‘*i* knows
*A* at (possible world)
’,
**K**^{m}_{N}(*A*) as
‘*A* is *m*^{th} level mutual knowledge
for the agents of *N* at
’, and so on. If
obtains, then one can conclude that *i* does know *A*,
that *A* is *m*^{th} level mutual knowledge,
and so on. Common knowledge of a proposition *E* implies
common knowledge of all that *E* implies, as is shown in the
following:

Proposition 2.4

IfK^{*}_{N}(E) andEF, thenK^{*}_{N}(F).

Note that (**K**^{m}_{N}(*E*))_{m1}
is a decreasing sequence of events, in the sense that **K**^{m+1}_{N}(*E*)
**K**^{m}_{N}(*E*),
for all *m*
1. It is also easy to check that if everyone knows *E*, then
*E* must be true, that is,
**K**^{1}_{N}(*E*)
*E*. If
is assumed to be finite, then if *E* is common knowledge at
,
this implies that there must be a finite *m* such that

K^{m}_{N}(E) =

^{n=1}K^{n}_{N}(E).

The following result relates the set-theoretic definition of common
knowledge to the hierarchy of ‘*i* knows that *j*
knows that … knows *A*’ statements.

Proposition 2.5

K^{m}_{N}(A) iff(1) For all agentsHence,i_{1},i_{2}, … ,i_{m}N,K_{i1}K_{i2}…K_{im}(A)K^{*}_{N}(A) iff (1) is the case for eachm1.

The condition that
**K**_{i1}**K**_{i2}
… **K**_{im}(*A*)
for all *m*
1 and all *i*_{1}, *i*_{2}, … ,
*i*_{m}
*N*
is Schiffer's definition of common knowledge, and is often used
as the definition of common knowledge in the literature.

Lewis is credited with the idea of characterizing common knowledge
as a hierarchy of ‘*i* knows that *j* knows that
… knows that *A*’ propositions. However, it is far
less well recognized that in *Convention*, Lewis also gives an
algorithm which generates such a hierarchy from a finite set of
assumptions regarding the agents' knowledge. These assumptions
taken together constitute Lewis' official definition of common
knowledge. Lewis' presentation of this definition is informal,
and occasionally lacking in detail. It is probably for this reason
that Aumann is often credited with presenting the first finitary
method of generating the common knowledge hierarchy (Aumann 1976).
A mathematically precise account of Lewis' analysis of common
knowledge is given here, and it is shown that Lewis' analysis
does result in the common knowledge hierarchy following from a finite
set of axioms.

Lewis presents his account of common knowledge on pp. 52-57 of
*Convention*. Lewis does not specify what account of knowledge
is needed for common knowledge. As it turns out, Lewis' account
is satisfactory for any formal account of knowledge in which the
knowledge operators **K**_{i}, *i*
*N*, satisfy K1, K2, and K3. A crucial assumption in
Lewis' analysis of common knowledge is that agents know they
share the same "rationality, inductive standards and background
information" (Lewis 1969, p. 53) with respect to a state of affairs
*A*,
that is, if an agent can draw any conclusion from
*A*,
she knows that all can do likewise.
This idea is made precise in the following:

Definition 2.6

Given a set of agentsNand a propositionA, the agents ofNaresymmetric reasoners with respect toA(orA-symmetric reasoners) iff, for eachi,jNand for any propositionE, ifK_{i}(A)K_{i}(E) andK_{i}(A)K_{i}K_{j}(A), thenK_{i}(A)K_{i}K_{j}(E).^{[11]}

The definiens says that for each agent *i*, if *i* can
infer from
*A*
that *E* is the case and that everyone knows that
*A*
is the case, then *i* can also infer that everyone knows that
*E* is the case.

Definition 2.7

A propositionEisLewis-common knowledge atamong the agents of a setN= {1, … ,n} iff there is a propositionA* such thatA*, the agents ofNareA*-symmetric reasoners, and for everyiN,L1:K_{i}(A*)L2:

K_{i}(A*)K_{i}(_{jN}K_{j}(A*))L3:

K_{i}(A*)K_{i}(E)

A* is abasisfor the agents' common knowledge.L*_{N}(E) denotes the proposition defined by L1 - L3 for a setNofA*-symmetric reasoners, so we can say thatEis Lewis-common knowledge for the agents ofNiffL*_{N}(E).

In words, L1 says that *i* knows *A** at
.
L2 says that if *i* knows that *A** obtains, then
*i* knows that everyone knows that *A** obtains. This
axiom is meant to capture the idea that common knowledge is based
upon a proposition *A** that is *publicly known,* as is
the case when agents hear a public announcement. If the agents'
knowledge is represented by partitions, then a typical basis for the
agents' common knowledge would be an element
()
in the
meet^{[12]}
of their partitions. L3 says that *i* can infer from
*A** that *E*.

A human agent obviously cannot work her way mentally through an infinite mutual knowledge hierarchy. Lewis argues that this is not a problem for his analysis of common knowledge, since the mutual knowledge claims of a common knowledge hierarchy for a chain of logical consequences, not a series of steps in anyone's actual reasoning. Lewis uses an example to show how his definition of common knowledge generates the first few levels of mutual knowledge. In fact, Lewis' definition implies the entire common knowledge hierarchy, as is shown in the following result.

Proposition 2.8

L*_{N}(E)K*_{N}(E), that is, Lewis-common knowledge ofEimplies common knowledge ofE.

Aumann (1976) gives a different characterization of common knowledge
which gives another simple algorithm for determining what information
is commonly known. Aumann's original account assumes that the
each agent's possibility set forms a private information
partition of the space
of possible worlds. Aumann shows that a proposition C is common
knowledge if, and only if, C contains a cell of the meet of the
agents' partitions. One way to compute the meet
of the partitions
_{i},
*i*
*N*
is to use the idea of "reachability".

Definition 2.9

A state isreachablefrom iff there exists a sequence =_{0},_{1},_{2}, … ,_{m}= such that for eachk{0,1, … ,m1}, there exists an agenti_{k}Nsuch that_{ik}(_{k}) =_{ik}(_{k+1}).

In words, is reachable from if there exists a sequence or "chain" of states from to such that two consecutive states are in the same cell of some agent's information partition. To illustrate the idea of reachability, let us return to the modified Barbecue Problem in which Cathy, Jennifer and Mark receive no announcement. Their information partitions are all depicted in Figure 2.1d:

Figure 2.1d

One can understand the importance of the notion of reachability in
the following way: If
is reachable from
,
then if
obtains then some agent can reason that some other agent thinks that
is possible. Looking at Figure 2.1d, if
=
_{1}
occurs, then Cathy (who knows only that
{_{1},
_{2}}
has occurred) knows that Jennifer thinks that
_{5} might have occurred
(even though Cathy knows that
_{5}
did not occur). So Cathy cannot rule out the possibility that
Jennifer thinks that Mark thinks that that
_{8}
might have occurred. And Cathy cannot rule out the possibility that
Jennifer thinks that Mark thinks that Cathy believes that
_{7}
is possible. In this sense,
_{7}
is reachable from
_{1}.
The chain of states which establishes this is
_{1},
_{2},
_{5},
_{8},
_{7}, since
_{1}(_{1}) =
_{1}(_{2}),
_{2}(_{2}) =
_{2}(_{5}),
_{3}(_{5}) =
_{3}(_{8}),
and
_{1}(_{8}) =
_{1}(_{7}).
Note that one can show similarly that in this example any state is
reachable from any other state. This example also illustrates the
following immediate result:

Proposition 2.10

is reachable from iff there is a sequencei_{1},i_{ 2}, … ,i_{m}Nsuch that(1)_{im}( … (_{i2}(_{i1}())))

One can read (1) as: ‘At
,
*i*_{1} thinks that *i*_{2} thinks
that … , *i*_{m} thinks that
is possible.’

We now have:

andLemma 2.11

() iff is reachable from .

andLemma 2.12.

() is common knowledge for the agents ofNat .

Proposition 2.13(Aumann 1976)

Let be the meet of the agents' partitions_{i}for eachiN. A propositionEis common knowledge for the agents ofNat iff ()E. (In Aumann (1976),Eisdefinedto be common knowledge at iff ()E.)

If *E* =
**K**^{1}_{N}(*E*), then
*E* is a *public event* (Milgrom 1981) or a *common
truism* (Binmore and Brandenburger 1989). Clearly, a common
truism is common knowledge whenever it occurs, since in this case
*E* = **K**^{1}_{N}(*E*) =
**K**^{2}_{N}(*E*) = … , so
*E* = **K**^{*}_{N}(*E*). The proof
of Proposition 2.13 shows that the common truisms are precisely the
elements of
and unions of elements of
,
so any commonly known event is the consequence of a common truism.

Barwise (1988) proposes another definition of common knowledge that
avoids explicit reference to the hierarchy of ‘*i* knows
that *j* knows that … knows that *A*’
propositions. Barwise's analysis builds upon an informal
proposal by Harman (1977). Consider the situation of the guest and
clumsy waiter in Example 1 when he announces that he was at
fault. They are now in a setting where they have heard the
waiter's announcement and know that they are in the
setting. Harman adopts the circularity in this characterization of
the setting as fundamental, and propses a definition of common
knowledge in terms of this circularity. Barwise's formal
analysis gives a precise formulation of Harman's intuitive
analysis of common knowledge as a *fixed point.* Given a
function *f, A* is a fixed point of *f* if
*f(A)=A*. Now note that

So we have established that

K^{1}_{N}(E

^{m=1}K^{m}_{N}(E) )=

K^{1}_{N}(E)K^{1}_{N}(

^{m=1}K^{m}_{N}(E) )=

K^{1}_{N}(E) (

^{m=1}K^{1}_{N}(K^{m}_{N}(E) ) )=

K^{1}_{N}(E) (

^{m=2}K^{m}_{N}(E) )=

^{m=1}K^{m}_{N}(E)

that is,f_{E}(A) =K^{1}_{N}(EA)K^{1}_{N}(EB) =f_{E}(B)

This proposition establishes thatProposition

A monotone functionfhas a unique fixed pointCsuch that ifBis a fixed point off, thenBC.Cis thegreatest fixed point of f.

Proposition 2.14

LetC^{*}_{N}be the greatest fixed point off_{E}. ThenC^{*}_{N}(E) =K^{*}_{N}(E). ( In Barwise (1988, 1989),Eisdefinedto be common knowledge at iffC^{*}_{N}(E).)

Barwise argues that in fact the fixed point analysis is more
flexible and consequently more general than the hierachical
account. This may surprise readers in light of Proposition 2.14,
which shows that Barwise's fixed point definition is
*equivalent* to the hierarchical account. Indeed, while
Barwise (1988, 1989) proves a result showing that the fixed point
account implies the hierarchical account and gives examples that
satisfy the common knowledge hierarchy but fail to be fixed points, a
number of authors who have written after Barwise have given various
proofs of the equivalence of the two definitions, as was shown in
Proposition 2.14. In fact, there is not a true controversy, at least
with respect to the analytical results. Barwise's fixed point
account is indeed equivalent to the hierarchical and the partition
accounts given the account of knowledge characterized by (K1)-(K4)
that most practitioners accept. Barwise does not make explicit which
axioms of (K1)-(K4) he accepts, but he wishes to analyze a weaker
notion of knowledge that is not closed under logical implication, and
so he is committed to rejecting (K3). By doing so, Barwise is able to
prove the nonequivalence between the fixed point and the hierarchical
account he claims. But Barwise's result comes at a price most
analysts are not willing to pay. To formulate his results given his
very weak conception of knowledge, Barwise must use
*non-well-founded set theory* (Aczel 1988) in order to allow
him to make the necessary circular definitions. As we have seen in
this section, when one adopts the conventional analysis of knowledge
that satisfies (K1)-(K4), the equivalence of the hierarchical and the
fixed point accounts follows without the need to introduce
non-well-founded set-theoretic concepts.

Gilbert (1989, Chapter 3) presents an alternative account of common knowledge, which is meant to be more intuitively plausible than Lewis' and Aumann's accounts. Gilbert gives a highly detailed description of the circumstances under which agents have common knowledge.

Definition 2.15

A set of agentsNare in acommon knowledge situation(A) with respect to a propositionAif, and only if,Aand for eachiN,

G _{1}:iisepistemically normal, in the sense thatihas normal perceptual organs which are functioning normally and has normal reasoning capacity.^{[14]}G _{2}:ihas the concepts needed to fulfill the other conditions.G _{3}:iperceives the other agents ofN.G _{4}:iperceives that G_{1}and G_{2}are the case.G _{5}:iperceives that the state of affairs described byAis the case.G _{6}:iperceives that all the agents ofNperceive thatAis the case.

Gilbert's definition appears to contain some redundancy, since
presumably an agent would not perceive A unless A is the case.
Gilbert is evidently trying to give a more explicit account of single
agent knowledge than Lewis and Aumann give. For Gilbert, agent
*i* knows that a proposition *E* is the case if, and
only if,
*E*,
that is, *E* is true, and either *i* perceives that
the state of affairs *E* describes obtains or *i* can
infer *E* as a consequence of other propositions *i*
knows, given sufficient inferential capacity.

Like Lewis, Gilbert recognizes that human agents do not in fact have
unlimited inferential capacity. To generate the infinite hierarchy
of mutual knowledge, Gilbert introduces the device of an agent's
*smooth-reasoner counterpart.* The smooth-reasoner counterpart
*i*
of an agent *i* is an agent that draws every logical
conclusion from every fact that *i* knows. Gilbert stipulates
that
*i*
does not have any of the constrains on time, memory, or reasoning
ability that *i* might have, so
*i*
can literally think through the infinitely many levels of a common
knowledge hierarchy.

Definition 2.16

If a set of agentsNare in a common knowledge situation_{N}(A) with respect toA, then the corresponding setNof their smooth-reasoner counterparts is in aparallel situation_{N}(A) if, and only if, for eachiN,

G _{1}:ican perceive anything that the counterpartican perceive.G _{2}:G _{2}- G_{6}obtain foriwith respect toAandN, same as for the counterpartiwith respect toAandN.G _{3}:iperceives that all the agents ofNare smooth-reasoners.

From this definition we get the following immediate consequence:

Proposition 2.17

If a set of smooth-reasoner counterparts to a setNof agents are in a situation_{N}(A) parallel to a common knowledge situation_{N}(A) ofN, thenfor all

Consequently,mand for anyi_{1}, … ,i_{ m},K_{i1}K_{i2}…K_{im}(A).K^{m}_{N}(A) for anym.

Gilbert argues that, given
_{N}(*A*),
the smooth-reasoner counterparts of the agents of *N*
actually satisfy a much stronger condition, namely mutual knowledge
**K**^{}_{N}(*A*)
to the level of any ordinal number
,
finite or infinite. When this stronger condition is satisfied, the
proposition *A* is said to be *open* to the agents of*
*N*. With the concept of open*-ness, Gilbert gives her
definition of common knowledge.

Definition 2.18

A propositionEisGilbert-common knowledgeamong the agents of a setN= {1, … ,n}, if and only if,

G _{1}*:Eis open* to the agents ofN.G _{2}*:For every iN,K_{i}(G_{1}*).G_{N}*(E) denotes the proposition defined by G_{1}* and G_{2}* for a setNofA*-symmetric reasoners, so we can say thatEis Lewis-common knowledge for the agents ofNiffG_{N}*(E).

One might think that an immediate corollary to Gilbert's
definition is that Gilbert-common knowledge implies the hierarchical
common knowledge of Proposition 2.5. However, this claim follows
only on the assumption that an agent knows all of the propositions
that her smooth-reasoner counterpart reasons through. Gilbert does
not explicitly endorse this position, although she correctly observes
that Lewis and Aumann are committed to something like
it.^{[15]}
Gilbert maintains that her account of common knowledge expresses our
intuitions with respect to common knowledge better than Lewis'
and Aumann's accounts, since the notion of open*-ness presumably
makes explicit that when a proposition is common knowledge, it is
"out in the open", so to speak.

- 3.1 The "No Disagreement" Theorem
- 3.2 Convention
- 3.3 Strategic Form Games
- 3.4 Games of Perfect Information

Aumann (1976) originally used his definition of common knowledge to prove a celebrated result that says that in a certain sense, agents cannot "agree to disagree" about their beliefs, formalized as probability distributions, if they start with common prior beliefs. Since agents in a community often hold different opinions and know they do so, one might attribute such differences to the agents' having different private information. Aumann's surprising result is that even if agents condition their beliefs on private information, mere common knowledge of their conditioned beliefs and a common prior probability distribution implies that their beliefs cannot be different, after all!

Proposition 3.1

Let be a finite set of states of the world. Suppose thatThen

- Agents
iandjhave a common prior probability distribution () over the events of such that () > 0, for each , and- It is common knowledge at that
i's posterior probability of eventEisq_{i}(E) and thatj's posterior probability ofEisq_{j}(E).q_{i}(E) =q_{j}(E).Proof.

[Note that in the proof of this proposition, and in the sequel, (|B) denotes conditional probability; that is, given (B)>0, (A|B) = (AB)/(B).]

In a later article, Aumann (1987) argues that the assumptions that
is finite and that
() > 0
for each
reflect the idea that agents only regard as "really" possible a
finite collection of salient worlds to which they assign positive
probability, so that one can drop the states with probability 0 from
the description of the state space. Aumann also notes that this
result implicitly assumes that the agents have common knowledge of
their partitions, since a description of each possible world includes
a description of the agents' possibility sets. And of course,
this result depends crucially upon (i), which is known as
the *common prior assumption* (CPA).

Aumann's "no disagreement" theorem has been generalized in a
number of ways in the literature (McKelvey and Page 1986, Monderer
and Samet 1989, Geanakoplos 1994). However, all of these "no
disagreement" results raise the same philosophical puzzle raised by
Aumann's original result: How are we to explain differences in
belief? Aumann's result leaves us with two options: (1) admit
that at some level, common knowledge of the agents' beliefs or
how they form their beliefs fails, or (2) deny the CPA. For instance,
agents in the real world often do not express their opinions
probabilistically. If one agent announces‘I believe that
*E* is the case’ while another announces‘I doubt
that *E* is the case’, then they might attribute their
divergent opinions to a lack of common knowledge of each other's
true posteriors for *E*. Even if agents do assign precise
posterior probabilities to an event, Aumann shows that if they have
merely first-order mutual knowledge of the posteriors, they can
"agree to disagree". Suppose the following all hold:

= {Then if_{1},_{2},_{3},_{4}},

_{1}= {{_{1},_{2}}, {_{3},_{4}}}

_{2}= {{_{1},_{2},_{3}}, {_{4}}}

(_{i}) = 1/4

q_{1}(E) = (E| {_{1},_{2}}) = 1/2, and

q_{2}(E) = (E| {_{1},_{2},_{3}}) = 1/3

Moreover, at
=
_{1},
Agent 1 knows that
_{2}() =
{_{1},_{2},_{3}},
so she knows that *q*_{2}(*E*) = 1/3.
Agent 2 knows at
_{1}
that either
_{1}() =
{_{1},_{2}}
or
_{1}() =
{_{3},_{4}},
so either way he knows that *q*_{1}(*E*) = 1/2.
Hence the agents' posteriors are mutually known, and yet they
are unequal. The reason for this is that the posteriors are not
common knowledge. For Agent 2 does not know what Agent 1
thinks *q*_{2}(*E*) is, since if
=
_{3},
which is consistent with what Agent 2 knows, then Agent 1
will believe that *q*_{2}(*E*) = 1/3
with probability 1/2 (if
=
_{3})
and *q*_{2}(*E*) = 1
with probability 1/2 (if
=
_{4}).

Aumann's result could fail if the agents' partitions are
not common knowledge. For suppose in the example just given, the
agents do not know each other's partitions. Then at
=
_{1},
if their posteriors are common knowledge, then Agent 1, who
knows that
{_{1},_{2}},
can explain Agent 2's posterior as the result of Agent 2
having observed either
{_{1},_{2},_{3}},
{_{1},_{2},_{4}},
{_{1},_{3},_{4}}
or
{_{2},_{3},_{4}}.
Still another way Aumann's result might fail is if agents do
not have common knowledge that they update their beliefs by Bayesian
conditionalization. Then clearly, agents can explain divergent
opinions as the result of others having modified their beliefs in the
"wrong" way. However, there are cases in which none of these
explanations will seem convincing. For instance, odds makers
sometimes publicly announce different probabilities for an event,
such as a particular winner of a prize at a forthcoming Academy
Awards presentation, and they will know that none of them have
*any* private information regarding the event. In cases such as
this, the agents have common knowledge that they all have the same
information structure and common knowledge of their posteriors. And
knowing that they are all competent odds makers, they have common
knowledge that they update by Bayesian conditionalization. Still,
the odds makers' beliefs violate the conclusion of Aumann's
result. More generally, denying the requisite common knowledge seems
a rather *ad hoc* move. For instance, to deny that agents have
common knowledge of information structures is simply to deny that
agents can all infer the same conclusions regarding possible worlds
as Aumann defines them. To deny that agents have common knowledge
that they update their beliefs by Bayesian conditionalization is to
assert that some believe that some might be updating their beliefs
*incoherently,* in the sense that their belief updating leaves
them open to a *Dutch book* (Skyrms 1984). As just noted, these
failures of agents' beliefs in each others' competence do
not fail in all cases. Why should one think that such failures of
common knowledge provide a general explanation for divergent beliefs?

What of the second option, that is, denying the
CPA?^{[16]}
The main argument put forward in favor of the CPA is that any
differences in agents' probabilities should be the result of
their having different information only, that is, there is no reason
to think that the different beliefs that agents have regarding the
same event are the result of anything other than their having
different information. However, one can reply that this argument
amounts simply to a restatement of the Harsanyi
Doctrine.^{[17]}
And while defenders of the Harsanyi Doctrine may be right in
thinking that there is apparently no compelling reason to think that
agents' priors can be different, neither is there compelling
reason to think they must be the same! In any event, while the
controversy over the Harsanyi Doctrine remains unresolved, we can
conclude that the "no disagreement" results have interesting
implications for the viability of common knowledge and the very
nature of probability. Defenders of the CPA take an
*objectivist* view of probability, and by virtue of the "no
disagreement" results are evidently committed to the view that common
knowledge of agents beliefs and how they are formed is a rare
phenomenon in the world. Those who are prepared to deny the CPA
allow for a genuinely *subjectivist* conception of probability.
They take the view that common knowledge of agents' beliefs and
how they come by them can be a commonplace phenomenon, and that
differences in opinion can stem from differences in (subjective)
prior probabilities.

Schelling's Department Store problem of Example 1.5 is a very
simple example in which the agents "solve" their coordination problem
appropriately by establishing a *convention.* Using the
vocabulary of game theory, Lewis (1969) defines a convention as a
*strict coordination equilibrium* of a game which agents follow
on account of their common knowledge that they all prefer to follow
this coordination equilibrium. A coordination equilibrium of a game
is a strategy combination such that no agent is better off if any
agent unilaterally deviates from this combination. As with
equilibria in general, a coordination equilibrium is *strict* if
any agent who deviates unilaterally from the equilibrium is strictly
worse off. The strategic form game of Figure 1.3 summarizes
Liz's and Robert's situation. The Department Store game
has four Nash equilibrium outcomes in pure strategies:
(*s*_{1}, *s*_{1}),
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}),
(*s*_{3}, *s*_{3}),
and (*s*_{4},
*s*_{4}).^{[18]}
These four equilibria are all strict coordination equilibria. If
the agents follow either of these equilibria, then they coordinate
successfully. For agents to be following a Lewis-convention in this
situation, they must follow one of the game's coordination
equilibria. However, for Lewis to follow a coordination equilibrium
is not a sufficient condition for agents to be following a
convention. For suppose that Liz and Robert fail to analyze their
predicament properly at all, but Liz chooses *s*_{2}
and Robert chooses *s*_{2}, so that they coordinate at
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) by sheer luck.
Lewis does not count accidental coordination of this sort as a
convention.

Suppose next that both agents are Bayesian rational, and that part
of what each agent knows is the payoff structure of the Intersection
game. If the agents expect each other to follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) and they
consequently coordinate successfully, are they then following a
convention? Not necessarily, contends Lewis, in a subtle argument on
p. 59 of *Convention.* For while each knows the game and that
she is rational, she might not attribute like knowledge to the other
agent. If each agent believes that the other agent will follow her
end of the (*s*_{2}, *s*_{2})
equilibrium mindlessly, then her best response is to follow her end
of (*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}). But in this
case the agents coordinated as the result of their each falsely
believing that the other acts like an automaton, and Lewis thinks
that any proper account of convention must require that agents have
*correct* beliefs about one another. In particular, Lewis
requires that each agent involved in a convention must have mutual
expectations that each is acting with the aim of coordinating with
the other, that is, that each knows that:

A_{1}: Both are rational,

A_{2}: Both know the payoff structure of the game, and

A_{3}: Both intend to follow (s_{2},s_{2}), and not some other strategy combination.

Suppose that the agents' beliefs are appropriately augmented so
that each agent knows that *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{3} are the case.
Again they coordinate on (*s*_{2},
*s*_{2}). Are they following a convention this time?
Still not necessarily, says Lewis. For what if it turns out that Liz
thinks that Robert does not know that they are both rational? Then
Liz has a false belief about Robert. Beyond this, there are two
other points which Lewis does not himself raise in this argument, but
which clearly support his view. First, it would be counterintuitive,
at the very least, to suppose that any agent following a convention
believes that he has reasoning abilities that the other agents lack.
If Liz has determined that *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{ 3} are the case,
then if they are following a convention she should expect that Robert
has arrived at the same conclusion. Second, what could explain
Liz's knowledge of *A*_{3}? The most natural
explanation for Liz's expectation that Robert will follow his
end of (*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) is that Liz
knows that Robert knows that *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{3} are the case. So
convention evidently involves agents having at least
*second-order* mutual knowledge of *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{3}, that is, Robert
(Liz) must know that Liz (Robert) knows that *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{3} are the case. But
this raises the question: Can *third-order* mutual knowledge
that *A*_{1}, *A*_{ 2}, and
*A*_{3} obtain fail? No, argues Lewis. For if Robert
thought that Liz did not know that Robert knew that
*A*_{1}, *A*_{2}, and
*A*_{3} were the case, then Robert would have a false
belief about Liz. The additional supporting points also kick in
again: If Robert has second-order mutual knowledge that
*A*_{1}, *A*_{2}, and
*A*_{3} obtain, then he should conclude that Liz also
has this second-order mutual knowledge. To conclude otherwise would
require Robert to assume, counterintuitively, that he has analyzed
their deliberations in this situation in a way that Liz cannot. And
how did Robert get his second-order mutual knowledge of
*A*_{3}? The most obvious way to account for
Robert's second-order mutual knowledge would be to attribute to
Robert the knowledge that Liz has second-order mutual knowledge that
*A*_{1}, *A*_{2}, and
*A*_{3} are the case. So convention requires
third-order mutual knowledge that *A*_{1},
*A*_{2}, and *A*_{ 3} are the case.
And the argument can be continued for any higher level of mutual
knowledge.

Lewis concludes that a necessary condition for agents to be following a convention is that their preferences to follow the corresponding coordination equilibrium be common knowledge. So on Lewis' account, a convention for a set of agents is a coordination equilibrium which the agents follow on account of their common knowledge of their rationality, the payoff structure of the relevant game and that each agent follows her part of the equilibrium.

A regularityRin the behavior of members of a populationPwhen they are agents in a recurrent situationSis aconventionif and only if it is true that, and it is common knowledge inPthat, in any instance ofSamong the members ofP,where

- everyone conforms to
R;- everyone expects everyone else to conform to
R;- everyone has approximately the same preferences regarding all possible combinations of actions;
- everyone prefers that everyone conform to
R, on condition that at least all but one conform to R;- everyone would prefer that everyone conform to
R, on condition that at least all but one conform toR,Ris some possible regularity in the behavior of members ofPinS, such that no one in any instance ofSamong members ofPcould conform both toRand toR.

(Lewis 1969, p. 76)^{[19]}

Lewis includes the requirement that there be an alternate
coordination equilibrium
*R*
besides the equilibrium *R* that all follow in order to
capture the fundamental intuition that how the agents who follow a
convention behave depends crucially upon how they expect the others
to behave. In the Department Store game, the
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}) equilibrium is a
Lewis-convention when Liz and Robert have common knowledge of
*A*_{1}, *A*_{2}, and
*A*_{3}. Had their expectations been different, so
either had believed that the other would not follow
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{2}), then the outcome
might have been very different.

Sugden (1986) and Vanderschraaf (1997) argue that it is not crucial
to the notion of convention that the corresponding equilibrium be a
coordination equilibrium. Lewis' key insight is that a
convention is a pattern of mutually beneficial behavior which depends
on the agents' common knowledge that all follow *this*
pattern, and no other. Vanderschraaf gives a more general definition
of convention as a *strict* equilibrium together with common
knowledge that all follow this equilibrium and that all would have
followed a different equilibrium had their beliefs about each other
been different. An example of this more general kind of convention
is given below in the discussion of the Figure 3.1 example.

Lewis formulated the notion of common knowledge as part of his
general account of conventions. In the years following the
publication of *Convention,* game theorists have recognized that
any explanation of a particular pattern of play in a game depends
crucially on mutual and common knowledge assumptions. More
specifically, *solution concepts* in game theory are both
motivated and justified in large part by the mutual or common
knowledge the agents in the game have regarding their situation.

To establish the notation that will be used in the discussion that follows, the usual definitions of a game in strategic form, expected utility and agents' distributions over their opponents' strategies, are given here:

Definition 3.2

Agameis an ordered triple (N,S,) consisting of the following elements:u

- A finite set
N= {1,2, … ,n}, called theset of agentsorplayers.- For each agent
kN, there is a finite setS_{k}= {s_{k1},s_{k2}, … ,s_{knk}}, called thealternative pure strategiesfor agentk. The Cartesian productS=S_{1}× … ×S_{n}is called thepure strategy setfor the game .- A map
:uS^{n}, called theutilityorpayoff functionon the pure strategy set. At each strategy combination= (ss_{1 j1}, … ,s_{n jn})S, agentk's particular payoff or utility is given by thek^{th}component of the value of, that is, agentuk's utilityu_{k}atis determined byswhereu_{k}() =sI_{k}((us_{1 j1}, … ,s_{n jn}))I_{k}() projectsxx^{n}onto itsk^{th}component.

The subscript ‘-*k*’ indicates the result of
removing the *k*^{th} component of an *n*-tuple
or an *n*-fold Cartesian product. For instance,

S_{-k}=S_{1}× … ×S_{k1}×S_{k+1}× … ×S_{n}

denotes the pure strategy combinations that agent *k*'s
opponents may play.

Now let us formally introduce a system of the agents' beliefs
into this framework.
_{k}(*S*_{-k})
denotes the set of probability distributions over the measurable
space (*S*_{-k},
_{k}),
where
_{k}
denotes the Boolean algebra generated by the strategy combinations
*S*_{-k}. Each agent *k* has a
probability distribution
_{k}
_{k}(*S*_{-k}),
and this distribution determines the *(Savage) expected
utilities* for each of *k*'s possible acts:

E(u_{k}(s_{k j})) =

^{A-k S-k}u_{k}(s_{k j},s_{-k})_{k}(s_{-k}),j= 1, 2, … ,n_{k}

If *i* is an opponent of *k*, then *i*'s
individual strategy *s*_{i j} may be
characterized as a union of strategy combinations
{
*s*_{-k} |
*s*_{i j}
*s*_{-k} }
_{k},
and so *k*'s marginal probability for *i*'s
strategy *s*_{i j} may be calculated as
follows:

_{k}(s_{i j}) =

^{{ s-k | si j s-k }}_{k}(s_{-k})

Suppose first that the agents have common knowledge of the full
payoff structure of the game they are engaged in and that they are
all rational, and that no other information is common knowledge. In
other words, each agent knows that her opponents are expected utility
maximizers, but does not in general know exactly which strategies
they will choose or what their probabilities for her acts are. These
common knowledge assumptions are the motivational basis for the
solution concept for noncooperative games known as
*rationalizability*, introduced independently by Bernheim (1984)
and Pearce (1984). Roughly speaking, a *rationalizable
strategy* is any strategy an agent may choose without violating
common knowledge of Bayesian rationality. Bernheim and Pearce argue
that when only the structure of the game and the agents'
Bayesian rationality are common knowledge, the game should be
considered "solved" if every agent plays a rationalizable strategy.
For instance, in the "Chicken" game with payoff structure defined by
Figure 3.1,

if Joanna and Lizzi have common knowledge of all of the payoffs at every strategy combination, and they have common knowledge that both are Bayesian rational, then any of the four pure strategy profiles is rationalizable. For if their beliefs about each other are defined by the probabilities

Figure 3.1

then_{1}=_{1}(Joanna playss_{1}), and

_{2}=_{2}(Lizzi playss_{1})

andE(u_{i}(s_{1})) = 3_{i}+ 2(1_{i}) =_{i}+ 2

E(u_{i}(s_{2})) = 4_{i}+ 0(1_{i}) = 4_{i},i= 1, 2

so each agent maximizes her expected utility by
playing *s*_{1} if
_{i} + 2
4_{i}
or
_{i} 2/3
and maximizes her expected utility by playing
*s*_{2} if
_{i} 2/3.
If it so happens that
_{i} > 2/3
for both agents, then both conform with Bayesian rationality by
playing their respective ends of the strategy combination
(*s*_{2},*s*_{2}) *given their
beliefs*, even though each would want to defect from this strategy
combination were she to discover that the other is in fact going to
play *s*_{2}. Note that the game's pure strategy
Nash equilibria, (*s*_{1}, *s*_{2}) and
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{1}), are rationalizable,
since it is rational for Lizzi and Joanna to conform with either
equilibrium given appropriate distributions. In general, the set of
a game's rationalizable strategy combinations contains the set
of the game's pure strategy Nash equilibria, and this example
shows that the containment can be proper.

To show that rationalizability is a nontrivial notion, consider the 2-agent game with payoff structure defined by Figure 3.2a:

Figure 3.2a

In this game, *s*_{1} and *s*_{3}
strictly dominate *s*_{2} for Lizzi, so Lizzi cannot
play *s*_{2} on pain of violating Bayesian
rationality. Joanna knows this, so Joanna knows that the only pure
strategy profiles which are possible outcomes of the game will be
among the six profiles in which Lizzi does not choose
*s*_{2}. In effect, the 3 × 3 game is
reduced to the 2 × 3 game defined by
Figure 3.2b:

Figure 3.2b

In this reduced game, *s*_{2} is strictly dominated
for Joanna by *s*_{1}, and so Joanna will rule out
playing *s*_{2}. Lizzi knows this, and so she rules
out strategy combinations in which Joanna plays
*s*_{2}. The rationalizable strategy profiles are the
four profiles that remain after deleting all of the strategy
combinations in which either Lizzi or Joanna play
*s*_{2}. In effect, common knowledge of Bayesian
rationality reduces the 3 × 3 game of Figure 3.2a to the 2
× 2 game defined by Figure 3.2c:

since Lizzi and Joanna both know that the only possible outcomes of the game are (

Figure 3.2c

Rationalizability can be defined formally in several ways. A variation of Bernheim's original (1984) definition is given here.

Definition 3.3

Given that each agentkNhas a probability distribution_{k}_{k}(s_{-k}), the system of beliefsis_{}= (_{1}, … ,_{n})_{1}(S_{-1}) × … ×_{n}(S_{-n})Bayes concordantif and only if,and (3.i) is common knowledge. A pure strategy combination

(3.i) For ik,_{i}(s_{k j}) > 0s_{k j}maximizesk's expected utility for some_{k}_{k}(s_{-k}),= (ss_{1 j1}, … ,s_{n jn})Sisrationalizableif and only if the agents have a Bayes concordant system_{}of beliefs and, for each agentkN,

(3.ii) E(u_{k}(s_{k jk}))E(u_{k}(s_{k ik})), fori_{k}j_{k}.^{[20]}

The following result shows that the common knowledge restriction on the distributions in Definition 3.1 formalizes the assumption that the agents have common knowledge of Bayesian rationality.

Proposition 3.4

In a game , common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if, (3.i) is common knowledge.

When agents have common knowledge of the game and their Bayesian
rationality only, one can predict that they will follow a
rationalizable strategy profile. However, rationalizability becomes
an unstable solution concept if the agents come to know more about
one another. For instance, in the Chicken example above with
_{i} > 2/3,
*i* = 1, 2, if either agent were to discover the other
agent's beliefs about her, she would have good reason not to
follow the (*s*_{2},*s*_{2}) profile
and to revise her own beliefs regarding the other agent. If, in the
other hand, it so happens that
_{1} = 1 and
_{2} = 0, so that the
agents maximize expected payoff by following the
(*s*_{2}, *s*_{1}) profile, then should
the agents discover their beliefs about each other, they will still
follow (*s*_{2}, *s*_{1}). Indeed, if
their beliefs are common knowledge, then one can predict with
certainty that they will follow
(*s*_{2},*s*_{1}). The Nash
equilibrium (*s*_{2},*s*_{1}) is
characterized by the belief distributions defined by
_{1} = 1 and
_{2} = 0.

The Nash equilibrium is a special case of *correlated equilibrium
concepts*, which are defined in terms of the belief distributions
of the agents in a game. In general, a correlated
equilibrium-in-beliefs is a system of agents' probability
distributions which remains stable given common knowledge of the
game, rationality and the *beliefs themselves*. We will review
two alternative correlated equilibrium concepts (Aumann 1974, 1987;
Vanderschraaf 1995), and show how each generalizes the Nash
equilibrium concept.

Definition 3.5

Given that each agentkNhas a probability distribution_{k}_{k}(s_{-k}), the system of beliefs

_{}* = (_{1}*, . . . ,_{n}* )_{1}(s_{-1}) × . . . ×_{n}(s_{-n})is an

endogenous correlated equilibriumif, and only if,(3.iii) Forik,_{i}*(s_{k j}) > 0s_{k j}maximizesk's expected utility given_{k}*.If

_{}* is an endogenous correlated equilibrium a pure strategy combination* = (ss_{1}*, . . . ,s_{n}* ) S is anendogenous correlated equilibrium strategy combination given_{}* if, and only if, for each agentkN,(3.iv)E(u_{k}(s_{k}*))E(u_{k}(s_{k i})) fors_{k i}s_{k}*.

Hence, the endogenous correlated equilibrium
_{}*
restricts the set of strategies that the agents might follow, as do
the Bayes concordant beliefs of rationalizability. However, the
endogenous correlated equilibrium concept is a proper refinement of
rationalizability, because the latter does not presuppose that
condition (3.iii) holds with respect to the beliefs one's
opponents actually have. If exactly one pure strategy combination
** s*** satisfies (3.iv) given

Definition 3.6

A system of agents' beliefs_{}* is aNash equilibriumif, and only if,

- condition (3.iii) is satisfied,
- For each
kN,_{k}* satisfies probabilistic independance, and- For each
s_{k j}s_{k}, ifi,lkthen_{i}*(s_{k j}) =_{l}*(s_{k j}).

In other words, an endogenous correlated equilibrium is a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs when each agent regards the moves of his opponents as probabilistically independent and the agents' probabilities are consistent. Note that in the 2-agent case, conditions (b) and (c) of the Definition 3.6 are always satisfied, so for 2-agent games the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept reduces to the Nash equilibrium concept. Conditions (b) and (c) are traditionally assumed in game theory, but Skyrms (1991) and Vanderschraaf (1995) argue that there may be good reasons to relax these assumptions in games with 3 or more agents.

Brandenburger and Dekel (1988) show that in 2-agent games, if the
beliefs of the agents are common knowledge, condition (3.iii)
characterizes a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs. As they note, condition
(3.iii) characterizes a Nash equilibrium in beliefs for the
*n*-agent case if the probability distributions are consistent
and satisfy probabilistic independence. Proposition 3.7 extends
Brandenburger and Dekel's result to the endogenous correlated
equilibrium concept by relaxing the consistency and probabilistic
independence assumptions.

In addition, we have:Proposition 3.7

Assume that the probabilitiesare common knowledge. Then common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if,_{}= (_{1},…,_{n})_{1}(s_{-1}) × . . . ×_{n}(s_{-n})_{}is an endogenous correlated equilibrium.

Corollary 3.8(Brandenburger and Dekel, 1988)

Assume in a 2-agent game that the probabilities_{}= (_{1},_{2})_{1}(s_{-1}) ×_{2}(s_{-2})are common knowledge. Then common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if,

_{}is a Nash equilibrium.

Proof.

The endogenous correlated equilibrium concept reduces to the Nash equilibrium concept in the 2-agent case, so the corollary follows by Proposition 3.7.

If _{}*
is a strict equilibrium, then one can predict which pure strategy
profile the agents in a game will follow given common knowledge of
the game, rationality and
_{}*.
But if
_{}*
is such that several distinct pure strategy profiles satisfy (3.iv)
with respect to
_{}*,
then one can no longer predict with certainty what the agents will
do. For instance, in the Chicken game of Figure 3.1, the belief
distributions defined by
_{1} =
_{2} = 2/3
together are a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs. Given common knowledge
of this equilibrium, either pure strategy is a best reply for each
agent, in the sense that either pure strategy maximizes expected
utility. Indeed, if agents can also adopt randomized or *mixed*
strategies at which they follow one of several pure strategies
according to the outcome of a chance experiment, then any of the
infinitely mixed strategies an agent might adopt in Chicken is a best
reply given
_{}*.^{[21]}
So the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept does not determine
the exact outcome of a game in all cases, even if one assumes
probabilistic consistency and independence so that the equilibrium is
a Nash equilibrium.

Another correlated equilibrium concept formalized by Aumann (1974,
1987) does give a determinate prediction of what agents will do in a
game given appropriate common knowledge. To illustrate Aumann's
correlated equilibrium concept, let us consider the Figure 3.1 game
once more. If Joanna and Lizzi can tie their strategies to their
knowledge of the possible worlds in a certain way, they can follow a
system of correlated strategies which will yield a payoff vector they
both prefer to that of the mixed Nash equilibrium and which is itself
an equilibrium. One way they can achieve this is to have their
friend Ron play a variation of the familiar shell game by hiding a
pea under one of three walnut shells, numbered 1, 2 and 3. Joanna
and Lizzi both think that each of the three relevant possible worlds
corresponding to
_{k} =
{the pea lies under shell *k*}
is equally likely. Ron then gives Lizzi and Joanna each a private
recommendation, based upon the outcome of the game, which defines a
system of strategy combinations f as follows

() f() =^{}

( s_{1},s_{1}) if_{k}=_{1}( s_{1},s_{2}) if_{k}=_{2}( s_{2},s_{1}) if_{k}=_{3}

*f* is a *correlated* strategy system because the agents
tie their strategies, by following their recommendations, to the same
set of states of the world
. *f* is also a strict
*Aumann correlated equilibrium*, for if each agent knows how Ron
makes his recommendations, but knows only the recommendation he gives
her, either would do strictly worse were she to deviate from her
recommendation.^{[22]}
Since there are several strict equilibria of Chicken, *f*
corresponds to a convention as defined in Vanderschraaf (1997). The
overall expected payoff vector of *f* is (3,3), which lies
outside the convex hull of the payoffs for the game's Nash
equilibria and which Pareto-dominates the expected payoff vector
(4/3, 4/3), of the mixed Nash equilibrium defined by
_{1} = 2/3,
*i* = 1,
2.^{[23]}
The correlated equilibrium f is characterized by the probability
distribution of the agents' play over the strategy profiles,
given in Figure 3.3:

Figure 3.3

Aumann (1987) proves a result relating his correlated equilibrium concept to common knowledge. To review this result, we must give the formal definition of Aumann correlated equilibrium.

Definition 3.9

Given a game = (N,S,) together with a finite set of possible worlds , the vector valued functionuf:Sis acorrelated n-tuple.Iff() = (f_{1}(), . . . ,f_{n}()) denotes the components offfor the agents ofN, then agentk'srecommended strategyat isf_{k}().fis anAumann correlated equilibriumifffor eachE(u_{k}f)E(u_{k}(f_{-k},g_{k})),kNand for any functiong_{k}that is a function off_{i}.

The agents are at Aumann correlated equilibrium if at each possible world
,
no agent will want to deviate from his recommended strategy, given
that the others follow their recommended strategies. Hence, Aumann
correlated equilibrium uniquely specifies the strategy of each agent,
by explicitly introducing a space of possible worlds to which agents
can correlate their acts. The deviations
*g*_{i} are required to be functions of
*f*_{i}, that is, compositions of some other function
with *f*_{i}, because *i* is informed of
*f*_{i}()
only, and so can only distinguish between the possible worlds of
that are distinguished by *f*_{i}. As noted
already, the primary difference between Aumann's notion of
correlated equilibrium and the endogenous correlated equilibrium is
that in Aumann's correlated equilibrium, the agents correlate
their strategies to some event
that is external to the game. One
way to view this difference is that agents who correlate their
strategies exogenously can calculate their expected utilities
conditional on their own strategies.

In Aumann's model, a description of each possible world
includes descriptions of the following: the game
,
the agent's private information partitions, and the actions
chosen by each agent at
,
and each agent's prior probability distribution
_{k}()
over
.
The basic idea is that conditional on
,
everyone knows everything that can be the object of uncertainty on
the part of any agent, but in general, no agent necessarily knows
which world
is the actual world. The agents can use their priors to calculate
the probabilities that the various act combinations *s**S* are played.
If the agents' priors are such that for all *i*, *j*
*N*,
_{i}()
= 0 iff
_{j}()
= 0, then the agents' priors are *mutually absolutely
continuous*. If the agents' priors all agree, that is,
_{1}()
= . . . =
_{n}() =
()
for each
,
then it is said that the *common prior assumption,* or CPA, is
satisfied. If agents are following an Aumann correlated equilibrium
*f* and the CPA is satisfied, then *f* is an
*objective* Aumann correlated equilibrium. An Aumann correlated
equilibrium is a Nash equilibrium if the CPA is satisfied and the
agents' distributions satisfy probabilistic
independence.^{[24]}

Let *s*_{i}()
denote the strategy chosen by agent *i* at possible world
. Then
*s*:
*S* defined by
*s*() =
(*s*_{1}(),…,*s*_{n}())
is a correlated *n*-tuple. Given that
_{i}
is a partition of
,^{[25]}
the function
*s*_{i}:
*s*_{i}
defined by *s* is
_{i}-*measurable* if for each
_{i j}
_{i},
*s*_{i}()
is constant for each
_{i j}.
_{i}-measurability
is a formal way of saying that *i* knows what she will do at
each possible world, given her information.

Definition 3.10

AgentiisBayes rationalwith respect to (alternatively,-Bayes rational) iffs_{i}is_{i}-measurable andfor anyE(u_{i}s|_{i})()E(u_{i}(v_{i},s_{-i}) |_{i})()_{i}-measurable functionv_{i}:s_{i}.

Note that Aumann's definition of
-Bayesian rationality implies that
_{i}(_{i}())
> 0,
so that the conditional expectations are defined. Aumann's main
result, given next, implicitly assumes that
_{i}(_{i}())
> 0
for every agent *i*
*N* and every possible world
.
This poses no technical difficulties if the CPA is satisfied, or
even if the priors are only mutually absolutely continuous, since if
this is the case then one can simply drop any
with zero prior from consideration.

Proposition 3.11(Aumann 1987)

If each agentiNis -Bayes rational at each possible world , then the agents are following an Aumann correlated equilibrium. If the CPA is satisfied, then the correlated equilibrium is objective.

Part of the uncertainty the agents might have about their situation
is whether or not all agents are rational. But if it is assumed that
all agents are
-Bayesian rational at each
,
then a description of this fact forms part of the description of
each possible
and thus lies in the meet of the agents' partitions. As noted
already, descriptions of the agents' priors, their partitions
and the game also form part of the description of each possible
world, so propositions corresponding to these facts also lie in the
meet of the agents' partitions. So another way of stating
Aumann's main result is as follows: *Common knowledge of*
*-Bayesian
rationality at each possible world implies that the agents follow an
Aumann correlated equilibrium.*

Propositions 3.7 and 3.11 are powerful results. They say that
common knowledge of rationality and of agents beliefs about each
other, quantified as their probability distributions over the
strategy profiles they might follow, implies that the agents'
beliefs characterize an equilibrium of the game. Then if the
agents' beliefs are unconditional, Proposition 3.7 says that the
agents are rational to follow a strategy profile consistent with the
corresponding endogenous correlated equilibrium. If their beliefs
are conditional on their private information partitions, then
Proposition 3.11 says they are rational to follow the strategies the
corresponding Aumann correlated equilibrium recommends. However, we
must not overestimate the importance of these results, for they say
nothing about the *origins* of the common knowledge of
rationality and beliefs. For instance, in the Chicken game of Figure
3.1, we considered an example of a correlated equilibrium in which it
was *assumed* that Lizzi and Joanna had common knowledge of the
system of recommended strategies defined by (). Given this common knowledge, Joanna and Lizzi indeed
have decisive reason to follow the Aumann correlated equilibrium f.
But where did this common knowledge come from? How, in general, do
agents come to have the common knowledge which justifies their
conforming to an equilibrium? Philosophers and social scientists
have made only limited progress in addressing this question.

In extensive form games, the agents move in sequence. At each
stage, the agent who is to move must base her decisions upon what she
knows about the preceding moves. This part of the agent's
knowledge is characterized by an *information set,* which is the
set of alternative moves that an agent knows her predecessor might
have chosen. For instance, consider the extensive form game of
Figure 3.4:

When Joanna moves she is at her information set

Figure 3.4

In a game of perfect information, each information set consists of a
single node in the game tree, since by definition at each state the
agent who is to move knows exactly how her predecessors have moved.
In Example 1.4 it was noted that the method of backwards induction
can be applied to any game of perfect
information.^{[26]}
The backwards induction solution is the unique Nash equilibrium of a
game of perfect information. The following result gives sufficient
conditions to justify backwards induction play in a game of perfect
information:

Proposition 3.12(Bicchieri 1993)

In an extensive form game of perfect information, the agents follow the backwards induction solution if the following conditions are satisfied for each agentiat each information setI^{ik}:Proof.

iis rational,iknows this andiknows the game, and- At any information set
I^{jk + 1}that immediately followsI^{i k},iknows atI^{i k}whatjknows atI^{jk + 1}.

Proposition 3.12 says that far less than common knowledge of the
game and of rationality suffices for the backwards induction solution
to obtain in a game of perfect information. All that is needed is
for each agent at each of her information sets to be rational, to
know the game and to know what the next agent to move knows! For
instance, in the Figure 1.2 game, if *R*_{1}
(*R*_{2}) stands for "Alan (Fiona) is rational" and
**K**_{i}( )
stands for "*i* knows the game
",
then the backwards induction solution is implied by the following:

- At
*I*^{24},*R*_{2}and**K**_{2}(). - At
*I*^{13},*R*_{1},**K**_{1}(),**K**_{1}(*R*_{2}), and**K**_{1}**K**_{2}(). - At
*I*^{22},**K**_{2}(*R*_{1}),**K**_{2}**K**_{1}(*R*_{2}), and**K**_{2}**K**_{1}**K**_{2}(). - At
*I*^{ 11},**K**_{1}**K**_{2}(*R*_{1}),**K**_{1}**K**_{2}**K**_{1}(*R*_{2}), and**K**_{1}**K**_{2}**K**_{1}**K**_{2}().^{[27]}

The classical argument for backwards induction implicitly assumes
that at each stage of the game, the agents discount the preceding
moves as strategically irrelevant. Defenders of the classical
argument can argue that this assumption makes sense, since by
definition at any agents' decision node, the previous moves that
led to this node are now fixed. Critics of the classical argument
question this assumption, contending that when reasoning about how to
move at any of his information sets, *including those not on the
backwards induction equilibrium path*, part of what an agent must
consider is what conditions might have led to his being at that
information set. In other words, agents should incorporate reasoning
about the reasoning of the previous movers, or *forward
induction* reasoning, into their deliberations over how to move at
a given information set. Binmore (1987) and Bicchieri (1993) contend
that a backwards induction solution to a game should be consistent
with the solution a corresponding forward induction argument
recommends. As we have seen, given common knowledge of the game and
of rationality, forward induction reasoning can lead the agents to an
apparent contradiction: The classical argument for backwards
induction is predicated on what agents predict they would do at nodes
in the tree that are never reached. They make these predictions
based upon their common knowledge of the game and of rationality.
But forward induction reasoning seems to imply that if any
off-equilibrium node had been reached, common knowledge of
rationality and the game must have failed, so how could the agents
have predicted what would happen at these nodes?

This section has barely scratched the surface of this controversy over common knowledge and backwards induction. The key unresolved issue is of course explaining what happens at the off-equilibrium information sets. To date, there is not a generally accepted theory of what agents having certain mutual or common knowledge will do at off-equilibrium nodes. However, we can at least repeat one generally accepted conclusion: In a game of perfect information, mutual knowledge of rationality and the game which falls far short of common knowledge can suffice to explain why agents follow the game's Nash equilibrium, the backwards induction solution. On the other hand, unlike other examples we have considered in which agents have mutual and even common knowledge without having to reason through levels of knowledge, backwards induction arguments in games of perfect information require that at each information set, the agent who would move were the information set to be reached must reason her way through at least as many levels of knowledge as there are remaining potential moves in the game.

Lewis formulated an account of common knowledge which generates the
hierarchy of‘*i* knows that *j* knows that …
*k* knows that *A*’ propositions in order to
ensure that in his account of convention, agents have correct beliefs
about each other. But since human agents obviously cannot reason
their way through such an infinite hierarchy, it is natural to wonder
whether any group of people can have full common knowledge of any
proposition. More broadly, the analyses of common knowledge reviewed
in §3 would be of little worth to social scientists and
philosophers if this common knowledge lies beyond the reach of human
agents.

Fortunately for Lewis' program, there are strong arguments that
common knowledge is indeed attainable. Lewis (1969) and Schiffer
(1972) argue that the common knowledge hierarchy should be viewed as
a chain of implications, and not as steps in anyone's actual
reasoning. They give informal arguments that the common knowledge
hierarchy is generated from a finite set of axioms. We saw in
§2 that it is possible to formulate Lewis' axioms precisely
and to derive the common knowledge hierarchy from these axioms.
Again, the basic idea behind Lewis' argument is that for a set
of agents, if a proposition A is publicly known among them and each
agent knows that everyone can draw the same conclusions from A that
she can, then A is common knowledge. These conditions are obviously
context dependent, just as an individual's knowing or not
knowing a proposition is context dependent. Yet there are many cases
where it is natural to assume that Lewis' conditions are
satisfied. If, for instance, a group of English speaking persons in
an automobile are listening to the radio, and the following special
news announcement, "The Pope has abdicated", is audibly broadcast,
then one may safely conclude that it is common knowledge for this
group that the Pope has abdicated. If one has skeptical doubts about
the agents' common knowledge in this situation, then one would
have to explain the failure of common knowledge as the result of some
circumstance that would be quite surprising in this context. Common
knowledge could fail if some of the people failed to hear the
announcement, or if some of them believed that some of the others
could not understand the announcement, but circumstances such as
these would be quite peculiar given the stated assumptions in this
story. In this context, skeptical doubt about common knowledge is
certainly possible, but such doubt relies upon *ad hoc*
assumptions similar to those that are needed to explain failure of
*individual* knowledge, not with the attainability of common
knowledge in principle.

Aumann (1976) gives an alternate finitary procedure for generating
the common knowledge hierarchy in the special case in which the
relevant number of possible worlds in
is finite and each agent's information system partitions
.
To be sure, knowledge does not always come so neatly packaged, but
in many applications a finite state space together with partitions is
a good model of the actual situation agents face. Aumann shows that
a proposition *A* is common knowledge for a set *N* of
agents at
, if and only if,
()
*A*
where
()
is the element in the meet of the agents' private information
partitions containing
.
In words, anything implied by the agents' common information
partition is common knowledge. If the set
is finite, then the meet
of the agents' partitions
_{i},
*i*
*N*, can be computed in
finitely many steps. In a certain sense, the issue of skepticism
regarding common knowledge never arises in Aumann's model.
Common knowledge is built into Aumann's model, as a result of
the agents' having private knowledge which is defined by
*partitions* over the possible worlds. Put another way, common
knowledge could fail in Aumann's model only if at some
,
some individual i's knowledge of
_{i}()
in i's private information partition could fail, which
reinforces the point made in the previous paragraph. To reiterate,
if one accepts Lewis' and Aumann's analysis of common
knowledge, then common knowledge is in principle no more problematic
than individual knowledge.

Nevertheless, care must be taken in ascribing common knowledge to a
group of human agents. Common knowledge is a phenomenon highly
sensitive to the agents' circumstances. The following section
gives an example that shows that in order for *A* to be a common
truism for a set of agents, they ordinarily must perceive an event
which implies *A* *simultaneously* and *publicly.*

In certain contexts, agents might not be able to achieve common
knowledge. Might they achieve something "close"? One weakening of
common knowledge is of course *m*^{th} level mutual
knowledge. For a high value of *m*,
**K**^{m}_{N}(*A*) might
seem a good approximation of
**K**^{*}_{N}(*A*). However,
the following example, due to Rubinstein (1989, 1992), shows that
simply truncating the common knowledge hierarchy at any finite level
can lead agents to behave as if they had no mutual knowledge
at
all.^{[28]}

In Figure 5.1, the payoffs are dependent upon a pair of possible worlds. World

Figure 5.1

Suppose that Lizzi can observe the state of the world, but Joanna
cannot. We can interpret this game as follows: Joanna and Lizzi
would like to have a dinner together prepared by Aldo, their favorite
chef. Aldo alternates between *A* and *B*, the two
branches of Sorriso, their favorite restaurant. State
_{i}
is Aldo's location that day. At state
_{1}
(_{2}),
Aldo is at *A* (*B*). Lizzi, who is on Sorriso's
special mailing list, receives notice of
_{i}.
Lizzi's and Joanna's best outcome occurs when they meet where Aldo
is working, so they can have their planned dinner. If they meet but
miss Aldo, they are disappointed and do not have dinner after all.
If either goes to *A* and finds herself alone, then she is
again disappointed and does not have dinner. But what each really
wants to avoid is going to *B* if the other goes to
*A*. If either of them arrives at *B* alone, she not
only misses dinner but must pay the exorbitant parking fee of the
hotel which houses *B*, since the headwaiter of *B*
refuses to validate the parking ticket of anyone who asks for a table
for two and then sits alone. This is what Harsanyi (1967) terms a
game of *incomplete information,* since the game's payoffs
depend upon states which not all the agents know.

*A* is a "play-it-safe" strategy for both Joanna and
Lizzi.^{[29]}
By choosing *A* whatever
the state of the world happens to be, the agents run the risk that
they will fail to get the positive payoff of meeting where Aldo is,
but each is also sure to avoid the really bad consequence of choosing
*B* if the other chooses *A*. And since only Lizzi
knows the state of the world, neither can use information regarding
the state of the world to improve their prospects for coordination.
For Joanna has no such information, and since Lizzi knows this, she
knows that Joanna has to choose accordingly, so Lizzi must choose her
best response to the move she anticipates Joanna to make regardless
of the state of the world Lizzi observes. Apparently Lizzi and
Joanna cannot achieve expected payoffs greater than 1.02 for each,
their expected payoffs if they choose (*A*, *A*) at
either state of the world.

If the state
were common knowledge, then the conditional strategy profile
(*A*, *A*) if
=
_{1} and
(*B*, *B*), if
=
_{2}
would be a strict Nash equilibrium at which each would achieve a
payoff of 2. So the obvious remedy to their predicament would be for
Lizzi to tell Joanna Aldo's location in a face-to-face or telephone
conversation and for them to agree to go where Aldo is, which would
make the state
and their intentions to coordinate on the best outcome given
common knowledge between them. Suppose for some reason they cannot
talk to each other, but they prearrange that Lizzi will send Joanna
an e-mail message if, and only if,
_{2}
occurs. Suppose further that Joanna's and Lizzi's e-mail systems
are set up to send a reply message automatically to the sender of any
message received and viewed, and that due to technical problems there
is a small probability,
> 0,
that any message can fail to arrive at its destination. Then if
Lizzi sends Joanna a message, and receives an automatic confirmation,
then Lizzi knows that Joanna knows that
_{2}
has occurred. If Joanna receives an automatic confirmation of
Lizzi's automatic confirmation, then Joanna knows that Lizzi knows
that Joanna knows that
_{2}
occurred, and so on. That
_{2}
has occurred would become common knowledge if each agent received
infinitely many automatic confirmations, assuming that all the
confirmations could be sent and received in a finite amount of
time.^{[30]}
However, because of the probability
of transmission failure at every stage of communication, the
sequence of confirmations stops after finitely many stages with
probability one. With probability one, therefore, the agents fail to
achieve full common knowledge. But they do at least achieve
something "close" to common knowledge. Does this imply that they
have good prospects of settling upon (*B*, *B*)?

Rubinstein shows by induction that if the number of automatically exchanged
confirmation messages is finite, then *A* is the only choice
that maximizes expected utility for each agent, given what she knows
about what they both know.

Rubinstein's Proof

So even if agents have "almost" common knowledge, in the sense that
the number of levels of knowledge in "Joanna knows that Lizzi knows
that . . . that Joanna knows that
_{2}
occurred" is very large, their behavior is quite different from
their behavior given common knowledge that
_{2}
has occurred. Indeed, as Rubinstein points out, given merely
"almost" common knowledge, the agents choose as if no communication
had occurred at all! Rubinstein also notes that this result violates
our intuitions about what we would expect the agents to do in this
case. (See Rubinstein 1992, p. 324.) If
*T*_{i} = 17, wouldn't we expect agent
*i* to choose *B*? Indeed, in many actual situations
we might think it plausible that the agents would each expect the
other to choose *B* even if *T*_{1} =
*T*_{2} = 2, which is all that is needed for Lizzi to
know that Joanna has received her original message and for Joanna to
know that Lizzi knows this!

Definition 5.1

If_{i}() is agenti's probability distribution over , thenB^{p}_{i}(A) = { |_{i}(A|_{i}())p}

**B**^{p}_{i}(*A*) is to
be read ‘*i* believes *A* (given *i*'s
private information) with probability at least *p* at
’, or ‘*i*
*p*-believes *A*’. The belief operator
**B**^{p}_{i} satisfies axioms
K2, K3, and K4 of the knowledge operator.
**B**^{p}_{i} does not satisfy
K1, but does satisfy the weaker property

_{i}(A|B^{p}_{i}(A))p

that is, if one believes *A* with probability at least
*p*, then the probability of *A* is indeed at least
*p*.

One can define *mutual* and *common p-beliefs* recursively
in a manner similar to the definition of mutual and common knowledge:

Definition 5.2

Let a set of possible worlds together with a set of agentsNbe given.(1) The proposition that

Ais(first level or first order) mutualp-belief for the agents ofN,B^{p}_{N}^{1}(A), is the set defined by(2) The proposition thatB^{p}_{N}^{1}(A)_{iN}B^{p}_{i}(A).Aism^{th}level(orm^{th}order)mutualp-belief among the agents ofN,B^{p}_{N}^{m}(A), is defined recursively as the set(3) The proposition thatB^{p}_{N}^{m}(A)_{iN}B^{p}_{i}(B^{p}_{N}^{m1}(A))Aiscommon p-beliefamong the agents ofN,B^{p}_{N}*(A), is defined as the set

B^{p}_{N}*(A)

^{m=1}B^{p}_{N}^{m}(A).

If *A* is common (or *m*^{th} level mutual)
knowledge at world
, then *A* is common
(*m*^{th} level) *p*-belief at
for every value of *p*. So
mutual and common *p*-beliefs formally generalize the mutual
and common knowledge concepts. However, note that
**B**^{1}_{N}*(*A*) is not
necessarily the same proposition as
**K**^{*}_{N} (*A*), that is, even
if *A* is common 1-belief, *A* can fail to be common
knowledge.

Common *p*-belief forms a hierarchy similar to a common
knowledge hierarchy:

Proposition 5.3

B^{p}_{N}^{m}(A) iff(1) For all agentsHence,i_{1},i_{2}, … ,i_{m}N,B^{p}_{i1}B^{p}_{i2}…B^{p}_{im}(A)B^{p}_{N}*(A) iff (1) is the case for eachm1.

Proof. Similar to the Proof of Proposition 2.5.

One can draw several morals from the e-mail game of Example 5.1.
Rubinstein (1987) argues that his conclusion seems paradoxical for
the same reason the backwards induction solution of Alan's and
Fiona's perfect information game might seem paradoxical:
Mathematical induction does not appear to be part of our "everyday"
reasoning. This game also shows that in order for A to be a common
truism for a set of agents, they ordinarily must perceive an event
which implies A *simultaneously* in each others' presence.
A third moral is that in some cases, it may make sense for the agents
to employ some solution concept weaker than Nash or correlated
equilibrium. In their analysis of the e-mail game, Monderer and
Samet (1989) introduce the notions of *ex ante* and *ex post
-equilibrium.*
An *ex ante* equilibrium *h* is a system of strategy profiles
such that no agent *i* expects to gain more than
-utiles if *i* deviates
from *h*. An *ex post* equilibrium
*h* is a system of strategy
profiles such that no agent *i* expects to gain more than
-utiles
by deviating from
*h* given *i*'s
private information. When
= 0, these concepts coincide, and *h* is a Nash equilibrium.
Monderer and Samet show that, while the agents in the e-mail game can
never achieve common knowledge of the world
, if they have common
*p*-belief of
for sufficiently high *p*,
then there is an *ex ante* equilibrium at which they follow
(*A*,*A*) if
=
_{1} and
(*B*,*B*), if
=
_{2}.
This equilibrium turns out not to be *ex post.* However, if
the situation is changed so that there are no replies, then Lizzi and
Joanna could have at most first order mutual knowledge that
=
_{2}.
Monderer and Samet show that in this situation, given sufficiently
high common *p*-belief that
=
_{2},
there is an *ex post* equilibrium at which Joanna and Lizzi
choose (*B*,*B*) if
=
_{2}!
So another way one might view this third moral of the e-mail game
is that agents' prospects for coordination can sometimes improve
dramatically if they rely on their common beliefs as well as their
mutual knowledge.

Aumann (1976) gives the first mathematically rigorous formulation of
common knowledge using set theory. Schiffer (1972) uses the formal
vocabulary of *epistemic logic* (Hintikka 1962) to state his
definition of common knowledge. Schiffer's general approach is to
augment a system of sentential logic with a set of knowledge
operators corresponding to a set of agents, and then to define common
knowledge as a hierarchy of propositions in the augmented system.
Bacharach (1992), Bicchieri (1993) and Fagin, et. al. (1995) adopt
this approach, and develop logical theories of common knowledge which
include soundness and completeness theorems. Fagin, et. al. show
that the syntactic and set-theoretic approaches to developing common
knowledge are logically equivalent.

Aumann (1995) gives a recent defense of the classical view of backwards induction in games of imperfect information. For criticisms of the classical view, see Binmore (1987), Reny (1992), Bicchieri (1989) and especially Bicchieri (1993). Brandenburger (1992) surveys the known results connecting mutual and common knowledge to solution concepts in game theory. For more in-depth survey articles on common knowledge and its applications to game theory, see Binmore and Brandenburger (1989), Geanakoplos (1994) and Dekel and Gul (1996). For her alternate account of common knowledge along with an account of conventions which opposes Lewis' account, see Gilbert (1989).

Monderer and Samet (1989) remains one of the best resources for the study of common p-belief.

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- Applications of Circumscription to Formalizing Common Sense Knowledge
- Reasoning About Common Knowledge with Infinitely Many Agents

*First published: August 27, 2001*

*Content last modified: June 12, 2002*